Born on the island of Martinique under French colonial rule, Frantz Omar Fanon (1925–1961) was one of the most important writers in black Atlantic theory in an age of anti-colonial liberation struggle. His work drew on a wide array of poetry, psychology, philosophy, and political theory, and its influence across the global South has been wide, deep, and enduring. In his lifetime, he published two key original works: Black Skin, White Masks (Peau noire, masques blancs) in 1952 and The Wretched of the Earth (Les damnés de la terre) in 1961. Collections of essays, A Dying Colonialism (L’an V de la révolution Algérienne 1959) and Toward the African Revolution (Pour la revolution Africaine), posthumously published in 1964, round out a portrait of a radical thinker in motion, moving from the Caribbean to Europe to North Africa to sub-Saharan Africa and transforming his thinking at each stop. The 2015 collection of his unpublished writings, Écrits sur l’aliénation et la liberté, will surely expand our understanding of the origins and intellectual context of Fanon’s thinking.
Fanon engaged the fundamental issues of his day: language, affect, sexuality, gender, race and racism, religion, social formation, time, and many others. His impact was immediate upon arrival in Algeria, where in 1953 he was appointed to a position in psychiatry at Bilda-Joinville Hospital. His participation in the Algerian revolutionary struggle shifted his thinking from theorizations of blackness to a wider, more ambitious theory of colonialism, anti-colonial struggle, and visions for a postcolonial culture and society. Fanon published in academic journals and revolutionary newspapers, translating his radical vision of anti-colonial struggle and decolonization for a variety of audiences and geographies, whether as a young academic in Paris, a member of the Algeria National Liberation Front (FLN), Ambassador to Ghana for the Algerian provisional government, or revolutionary participant at conferences across Africa. Following a diagnosis and short battle with leukemia, Fanon was transported to Bethesda, Maryland (arranged by the U.S. Central Intelligence Agency) for treatment and died at the National Institute for Health facility on December 6, 1961.
- 1. The Problem of Blackness
- 2. Algeria
- 3. Black Africa
- 4. The Wretched of the Earth
- 5. The Case Studies
- 6. Legacy and Influence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Problem of Blackness
In 1952, Fanon published his first major work Black Skin, White Masks. Though just 27 at the time of its publication, the work displays incredible literacy in major intellectual trends of the time: psychoanalysis, existentialism, phenomenology, and dialectics, as well as, most prominently, the early Négritude movement and U.S. based critical race work in figures like Richard Wright. Modest in length, the book is notable for its enormous ambition, seeking to understand the foundations of anti-Black racism in the deepest recesses of consciousness and the social world. The book is Fanon’s major work on blackness. In fact, his focus shifts in the years following the publication of Black Skin, White Masks, moving away from blackness as a problem—perhaps the problem—of the modern world and toward a wider theory of the oppressed, colonialism, and revolutionary resistance to the reach of coloniality as a system. But that shift is unthinkable without Fanon’s early meditations on anti-Black racism. Fanon’s reflections on anti-Black racism and how it forms, then deforms, the subjectivity of white and Black people both, is crucial for understanding the multiple levels of colonial subjugation and the terms of its overcoming. There is something about anti-blackness as treated in Black Skin, White Masks that is a concrete, uncomplicated distillation of coloniality as such. Fanon’s first book, then, can be said to set out the basic structure of his anti- and de-colonial work, initially and emphatically in the terms of describing the effects and affects of anti-black racism.
Fanon’s method in Black Skin, White Masks is a complicated question and one of the more interesting bits of scholarly discussion. The primary approach in the text is existential-phenomenological, something borne out in the rich, textured personal narratives that seize upon the essential structures of the narrativized event of anti-blackness, and also indicated in the title of the fifth chapter—L’experience vécu (experience vécu translates the key phenomenological notion of Erlebnis, properly rendered in the Richard Philcox translation as “lived-experience”). Lewis Gordon’s work on Fanon has argued for the centrality of existentialism and existential framing of key questions across his oeuvre, especially in Gordon’s early work Fanon and the Crisis of European Humanity (1995) and recently in What Fanon Said (2015). The influence of Jean-Paul Sartre and Maurice Merleau-Ponty also lends credence to the phenomenological characterization, but Fanon’s sustained engagement with the Négritude movement, psychoanalysis, Hegelian thought, and Marxism (something evidenced most clearly in later works and documented in Reiland Rabaka’s multi-volume interpretation of Fanon, Négritude, and revolutionary Africana theory) opens up the question of methodology to any number of interpretations and remains one of the more engaging areas of Fanon-interpretation. Homi Bhabha’s innovation as a reader of Fanon has been to draw out the post-structuralist dimensions of his thought, thereby weaving Fanonian themes into contemporary postcolonial theorizations of hybridity, language, subjectivity, and time. We see much the same in Anthony Alessandrini’s provocative book on Fanon and cultural studies, Fanon and the Future of Cultural Politics (2014), which puts Fanonian thinking in dialogue with Michel Foucault, Edward Said, Jamaica Kincaid, and Paul Gilroy, among others. In the end, Fanon is a unique thinker who blends personal narrative and political strategizing with heady social theory and numerous philosophical twists and turns.
The introduction to Black Skin, White Masks contains key conclusions and foundational pieces of analysis summed up Fanon’s simple declaration: that Black people are locked in blackness and white people are locked in whiteness. As well, Fanon offers a sketch of the relationship between ontology and sociological structures, asserting that the latter generate the former, which, in turn, lock subjectivities into their racial categories. The chapters that follow are in many ways a long, sustained argument for these assertions, venturing into questions of language, sexuality, embodiment, and dialectics. Perhaps most importantly, Fanon’s opening gambit introduces the central concept of the zone of non-being. The zone of non-being is the “hell”, as Fanon puts it, of blackness honestly confronted with its condition in an anti-Black world. The anti-Black world, the only world we know, hides this non-being to the extent that it ascribes a place and role to abject blackness. But the truth is the zone of non-being. In an interesting and crucial twist, Fanon, in the Introduction, does not describe descent into this zone as nihilism or despair. Rather, he counters with a vision of subjectivity as “a yes that vibrates to cosmic harmonies” (1952 [2008: 2]). Descent into the zone of non-being produces this yes and its revolutionary power, revolutionary precisely because the anti-Black world cannot contain or sustain the affirmation of Black life as life, as being, as having a claim on the world. This claim and this yes is the positivity of what becomes political violence in Fanon’s later work.
Across the core chapters of Black Skin, White Masks, Fanon draws together the existential experience of racialized subjectivity and the calculative logic of colonial rule. For Fanon, and this is critically important, colonialism is a total project. It is a project that does not leave any part of the human person and its reality untouched. This is no more evident than in the opening chapter to Black Skin, White Masks on language. Fanon’s reflections on language, racism, and colonialism begin with a wide claim: to speak a language is to participate in a world, to adopt a civilization. The claim reflects in many ways the philosophical milieu of mid-century French and German philosophy, which in phenomenology, existentialism, and hermeneutics explore the very same claim—that language, subjectivity, and reality are entangled as a matter of essence, not confusion or indistinction. But the colonial situation makes this all the more complicated. If speaking a language means participating in a world and adopting a civilization, then the language of the colonized, a language imposed by centuries of colonial domination and dedicated to the elimination or abjection of other expressive forms, speaks the world of the colonizer. To speak as the colonized is therefore to participate in one’s own oppression and to reflect the very structures of your alienation in everything from vocabulary to syntax to intonation. It is true that many Afro-Caribbeans speak pidgin and creole as part of everyday life. But Fanon, in a claim that does not age well in Caribbean theory, measures pidgin and creole expression against French, arguing that Afro-Caribbean speaking, in those registers, is a fallen, impoverished version of the metropolitan language and thus participates in inferiority. In this way, vernacular speech speaks the colonizer’s world into existence in naming the colonized as derivative, less than, and fundamentally abject. Caribbean theory from the 1970s to the present has largely been dedicated to defending the legitimacy of creolized language and cultural forms, against Fanon and against colonial languages as the measure of being and knowing.
But there is no alternative for Fanon. In one of the most important moments of the book, Fanon discusses the problem of diction and racial embodiment. The black person can perfect speech, learn to speak perfect French and sound like a sophisticated Parisian. That might promise a certain kind of liberation from the alienation in and through mastery of proper French. That is, if the black colonial learns to speak as well as the white Parisian, then perhaps there can be equal participation in language and its world. Yet, this is impossible because of what Fanon terms the epidermal character of race. To be black and speak with perfect diction is still to be black, and therefore marked as special, unique, and surprising. Fanon’s anecdotes in the opening chapter describe this as the surprise of white French people at the articulateness of a black French speaker. Surprise is a reminder of inferiority, not in the content of one’s presence, but rather on the bearing black skin has on the white mask of perfect diction. There is no escape from the epidermal skin. Embodiment frames linguistic performance and limits its significance. Fanon also remarks on how this fated-to-failure emphasis on diction in turn alienates the black person from his or her fellow black people—the desire to be white, Fanon’s characterization of the drive to perfect diction, means alienation from blackness and this lands the black subject, again, in the zone of non-being.
The second and third chapters of Black Skin, White Masks theorize interracial sexuality, sexual desire, and the effects on racial identity. Fanon’s theorizations return to one and the same theme: interracial desire as a form of self-destruction in the desire to be white or to elevate one’s social, political, and cultural status in proximity to whiteness. In that sense, all depictions of interracial sexuality (exclusively heterosexual) are for Fanon fundamentally pathological. The black woman who desires a white man suffers under the delusion that his body is a bridge to wealth and access. Mayotte Capécia’s novel I Am a Martinican Woman (1948) guides Fanon’s analysis and he takes her book to be exemplary of the black woman’s psyche and of the limits of interracial desire. The black man who desires a white woman suffers under the delusions of what her body offers: innocence and purity. Fanon draws this from Germaine Guex’s book La Névrose d’abandon (1950) and expresses it directly when writing, in the voice of Guex’s Black man, “When my restless hands caress those white breasts, they grasp white civilization and dignity and make them mine” (1952 [2008: 45]). The white body and Black desire for that body function much as language does in the opening chapter to Black Skin, White Masks: the passage to standing in the world, made impossible by the epidermal racial scheme, and therefore fated to alienation at every turn. Fanon’s analyses are provocative, associative, and infused with the language of psychoanalysis and existential-phenomenology. And, thus, in each turn of the story, interracial desire is pathological, not because of the content of the characters and their desire, but because anti-Black colonialism is a total project that has infiltrated, modified, and calcified all aspects of the lifeworld.
The incredibly important fifth chapter to Black Skin, White Masks, titled “The Lived-Experience of the Black Man” (“L’expérience vécue du noir”), is bookended by two chapters examining psychological accounts of the colonized. In the fourth chapter, Fanon undertakes a systematic critique of Octave Mannoni’s psychoanalytic account of colonial oppression and in the sixth chapter he works through a psychoanalytic account of racialized libidinal economy. Both chapters are crucial for understanding the role of psychoanalysis in Fanon’s thought, as well as an opportunity to see his creativity as a reader who repurposes colonial or colonial-tinged methods and analyses for the sake of clarification of the effects of anti-Black racism under colonial domination. Fanon’s conclusions are not surprising, of course. Psychoanalysis, like his original readings of interracial relationships, provides Fanon a language for describing all the effects and affects on desire under anti-Black racism, and how gendered notions of power, embodiment, and selfhood are structured from the inside by the colonial practice of racism. What he uncovers in his critique and repurposing of psychoanalysis are new layers of pathology on the part of the colonizer, of course, but also of the colonized who cannot function as intact psyches. As well, Fanon argues in some detail against the capacity of European psychoanalysis to understand the colonial situation. Blackness requires modifications in method, especially if that method is to open space for resistance, rebellion, and liberation.
But “The Lived-Experience of the Black Man” is really the key chapter in the book. In that chapter, Fanon deploys the conceptual tools developed in previous chapters in order to debunk the remaining legacies of racial essentialism. A good bit of this was undertaken in the first chapter, where Fanon critically reads Aimé Césaire and his articulation of Négritude around the question of language. The existential-phenomenological character of the fifth chapter, however, adds real depth and texture to Fanon’s position. It begins and returns repeatedly to an anecdote in which a white child points to Fanon and declares “Look, a Negro!” Fanon explores how this phrase is akin to a racial slur, how racism is integral to the declaration itself rather than being an addition to it: to say “Negro” is to say an anti-Black slur. In developing this account, Fanon revisits Jean-Paul Sartre’s account of the gaze and how it fixes the identity of the other, here infusing that account with a rich treatment of the structures of an anti-Black racist lifeworld. The white gaze fixes blackness, making it with a slur and epidermal character, thus sealing blackness into itself. As well, Fanon discusses Sartre’s account of anti-Semitism in Anti-Semite and Jew: An Exploration of the Etiology of Racism (1948), noting how it is inadequate to the phenomenon of anti-Blackness as a form of racism. Whereas the anti-Semite fears the Jew because of his alleged power and super-capacity, the anti-Black racist detests the Black person because of his alleged weakness and incapacity. That is, anti-Semitism reflects a panic about Jewish superiority, anti-Black racism reflects contempt for Black inferiority. With this complex in place, Fanon returns with some important sympathy to Césaire’s version of Négritude, exploring the limits and possibilities of poetry for an alternative vision of Black life. Négritude may be naïve and fundamentally wrong at the level of ontology, but it does alter the affective relation of Black people to themselves. That is no small accomplishment. Across these discussions, Fanon develops his notion of the inferiority complex, which is his subtle and important account of how anti-Black racism is internalized by Black people and how that internalization adds complexity to the pathologies of living under colonial rule. Négritude, whatever its limits, is an antidote and Fanon’s appreciation for it is one of the more compelling parts of the chapter.
The seventh and final full chapter offers a critical reading of dialectics, filtered through both Alfred Adler’s psychology and G.W.F. Hegel’s philosophy. At stake in the chapter is recognition—recognition of blackness, of subjectivity, and therefore of humanity. This is one of the most enigmatic ideas in Black Skin, White Masks. Fanon is deeply critical of dialectical thinking, while at the same time drawing deep, important lessons from it. In particular, Fanon is concerned with how a dialectics of recognition might simply mean elevation of the Black person to a sense of humanity created by and modeled on white people. The entirety of the text, of course, has been dedicated to disputing that move and offering alternative ways of thinking about the future. So Fanon rejects the nascent, or sometimes explicit, conception of recognition that appeals to a pre-constructed idea of the human—suspicious, rightly, that such an idea is always racialized. And so too he is suspicious of any dialectical method that leaves a sense of measure intact—namely, a dialectical method that proceeds from a logic of recognition. Fanon resists at every turn the desire for recognition if that recognition proceeds from an inevitably colonial sense of standard or measure. Rather, in terms of Hegelian methodology, Fanon is interested in the risk of life at the center of Hegel’s dialectic, and how that dialectic both exposes the conceptual dependency of the colonizer on the colonized and how confrontation, the work of negation in dialectical thinking and struggle, aims to destroy pre-existing forms of relation. If those pre-existing forms of relation are destroyed, then a certain kind of revolution is possible, one in which the humanity of the colonized black person might emerge, on its own terms, for the first time. Fanon’s imagination turns to the future as unprecedented. What could blackness be after colonialism?
The conclusion to Black Skin, White Masks follows through on this notion of futurity and a dialectics dedicated to the destruction of pre-existing forms of relation. Fanon’s conclusion is written in very short paragraphs or provocative, declarative sentences. Across the final pages, Fanon outlines a theory of history and memory that underpins his vision of Black liberation, including most prominently the notion that we are not bound to history, we are not slaves to the past, and therefore any kind of future is possible. Fanon rejects the idea of reparations, for example, precisely because that idea would link Black people to the past in a crucial way and make that link inextricable from imagining justice. In place of the past, Fanon appeals to the openness and undetermined character of the future. What does Fanon want for black people? In perhaps the most famous line of the book, Fanon concludes with the plea: “Ô mon corps, fais de moi toujours un homme qui interroge!” (“O my body, always make me a man who questions!”) (1952 [2008: 206]). Subjectivity in the interrogative is therefore Fanon’s solution to the problem of racial entrapment, the opening motif of how white people are trapped in whiteness, black people trapped in blackness. The man who questions has broken out of that trap.
The effusive optimism and hope of the Conclusion aside, Black Skin, White Masks is an essentially pessimistic book. That is, the book describes a psychological, linguistic, ontological, and libidinal landscape that is structured through and through by anti-Black racism. No desire or mode of being is left untouched. Fanon’s evocation of a total break with the past in the Conclusion confirms this pessimism and shows that his sense of liberation is tied to an apocalyptic revolutionary praxis—something we see developed over the following decade.
In the immediate half-decade that follows the publication of Black Skin, White Masks, Fanon revisits key claims about anti-blackness and the possibilities of Black life that enrich, deepen, and widen his formulations in 1952. One of the questions that arises quite naturally from Black Skin, White Masks is how well, if at all, the concept of blackness developed therein travels across the Caribbean to the United States, or from the Caribbean to Africa. Fanon does not spend much time discussing the United States; while some of his unpublished work, recently collected in the volume Écrits sur l’aliénation et la liberté, shows a keen interest in the work of Richard Wright, and the early rustlings of the early civil rights movement (along with Wright) are mentioned in Black Skin, Whites Masks, Fanon’s move to refine and nuance his account of blackness turns to Africa. In the 1955 essay “West Indians and Africans” (“Antillais et Africains”), Fanon renews his critique of the Négritude movement and its nostalgic orientation toward the continent. In a provocative association, Fanon concludes the essay by linking “the great white error” of colonialism with his characterization of Négritude thinking as “living in the great black mirage”. (1964 [1994: 27]) Alongside that criticism of Négritude, Fanon blends personal history, reportage, and a bit of existential-historical sensibility in discussing the differences between Afro-Caribbeans (West Indians) and black Africans. Fanon’s occasion is the Second World War and the experience of West Indian and black African soldiers fighting side by side, which allowed intimate exchange about racial identity. These exchanges, on Fanon’s account, return again and again to the notion that West Indians are not Black enough, perhaps not Black at all, which he implies adds to the psychological and moral appeal of Négritude. A key lesson to draw from this essay, especially in light of the work that follows it, is that Fanon’s skepticism about blackness as an identity—inextricably bound to anti-blackness—moves him further and further away from concerns about the Black experience. This move is deeply connected to his time in Algeria, as we see below.
As well, Fanon’s well-known essay from 1956 “Racism and Culture” (“Racisme et culture”) re-engages the question of blackness and argues for a deep, abiding connection between anti-blackness and cultural formation more broadly. The essay, delivered at one of the most important gatherings in the history of black Atlantic thought, the 1956 Congress of Negro Writers and Artists, de-links racism from the psyche and the interpersonal, lodging racism instead inside the very workings of culture. Fanon’s contribution to the 1956 Congress broke from the emphasis on Négritude and Négritude thinking at that meeting, and his reflections are noteworthy for that reason alone. Against the emphasis on racial quasi-essentialism, “Racism and Culture” examines how anti-Black racism is part of the structure and function of culture, rather than identifying blackness as an inherent site of resistance. Fanon writes that racism
is never a super-added element discovered by chance in the course of the investigation of the cultural data of a group. The social constellation, the cultural whole, is deeply modified by the existence of racism. (1964 [1994: 36])
This move positions Fanon against Négritude in familiar and new ways. It is familiar in that he rejects racialized thinking as central to Black liberation struggle, entwining race and culture at their core; nothing from a racist culture can inform liberatory racial thinking precisely because the existence of racism “deeply modifies” what appears in culture as race. Fanon underscores this when he deems blues, an African-American vernacular art form, a “slave lament” that is “offered up for the admiration of the oppressors” (1964 [1994: 37]). It is in some ways new, insofar as he gathers together the multi-faceted analysis and pessimism of Black Skin, White Masks and distills it all into a vision of race and culture. And like the conclusion to Black Skin, White Masks, and indeed most of his work, the vision is essentially apocalyptic. “The end of race prejudice”, Fanon writes, “begins with a sudden incomprehension” (1964 [1994: 44]). Which is to say, for Fanon the de-linking of racism and culture only comes at the moment that culture itself, as we have known it, becomes incomprehensible and we begin the work of assembling new cultural forms. This insight is fully developed five years later in the central chapters of The Wretched of the Earth.
Fanon’s move to Algeria in 1953 marks an important turning point in his thought. He continues to write on anti-blackness in select essays and occasions, but Fanon’s shift is deep and meaningful. Whereas Black Skin, White Masks was concerned exclusively with the structure of an anti-black world and how that world bears on the body and psyche of the colonized, Fanon’s time in Algeria and later travels to sub-Saharan Africa broaden his analysis. Instead of a question of blackness, colonialism becomes for Fanon a larger, more general question of the oppressed in the global south. The Wretched of the Earth is the boldest and most important expression of this shift, but the time he spends analyzing Algeria on its own terms reveals Fanon’s increasing sensitivity to difference inside the colonial experience. Also, many of his most important writings in this period were published in French language newspapers across the continent of Africa, in particular the Algerian National Liberation Front (FLN) newspaper El Moudjahid (for which he served on the editorial board), which hosts some of his most interesting reflections. This shift in his thinking, as well as some of the later points of emphasis and theoretical transitions, bolster Ato Sekyi-Otu’s argument in Fanon’s Dialectic of Experience (1997) that Fanon’s work ought to be read as a series of political experiences or stages in and at the basis of an unfolding of a long, complex system of thought.
Three essays are of particular significance in this period: “Algeria’s European Minority” (“La minorité européenne d’Algérie”), “Algeria Unveiled” (“L’algérie se dévoile”), and “The Algerian Family” (“La famille algérienne”).
Fanon’s reflections in “Algeria’s European Minority” offer an important and insightful example of applying the anti-colonial dimensions of Black Skin, White Masks. The key anti-colonial insight in that text was how measure—the imperial function of whiteness in the Black psyche—structures the world. Liberation, in Black Skin, White Masks, looks a lot like displacing measure in the name of the questioning subject. Measure, here, means simply the ideal or standard according to which “the human” is evaluated. Fanon’s argument in Black Skin, White Masks is that “the human”, an idea that comes from the European tradition, is a fundamentally racial idea deployed as a tool of alienation for the colonized. Liberation from measure means displacing the racialized idea of the human and initiating a movement toward, then into, a new humanism. When this notion travels to Algeria in “Algeria’s European Minority”, a critical essay addressing the possibility of revolutionary Europeans in North Africa, we see how it also applies to the white minority under colonialism. The revolution in Algeria is a moment of decision for all Algerians, and pointedly so in the case of the European minority who had lived there for generations and at an elevated social and political status. The default mode, of course, would be to associate the European minority with the colonizing power: France. But Fanon argues that this is not necessarily the case and that, in fact, revolutionary solidarity across racial-national lines is possible, even necessary (and, through examples in the text, actually practiced). Algeria, then, is revealed to be as much an ideological category for identification with as it is a national, religious, or racial category. The Wretched of the Earth will explore these possibilities even further as a blueprint for the colonized global South. But Fanon is particularly meticulous in “Algeria’s European Minority”, examining in detail how each twist and turn of the psyche reflects possibilities and limits, and in that meticulousness shows the enduring insight from the opening of Black Skin, White Masks – namely, that white people are locked into whiteness, Black people into blackness. “Algeria’s European Minority” unpacks the process by which white people can unlock themselves in or be unlocked by anti-colonial struggle and revolutionary action. In that sense, the text is an important study of how what comes to be called “race traitor” politics can and should work in a revolutionary context.
In “Algeria Unveiled”, Fanon explores the relationship between Islam, tradition, colonial rule, and revolutionary consciousness. The veil puzzles Fanon and challenges his deepest political commitment: postcoloniality means an embrace of the new. Revolution is absolute and radical, marking a break with the past rather than a return to a different version of the past. The future is the future, and so full of the unprecedented. What does that mean for traditions that have been suppressed by colonial rule, for example the veil in Islamic cultural practice? In his work on blackness, Fanon was quite clear that a return to African civilization—the imperative of the Négritude movement—represents a mirage and only doubles the loss of the past by losing black people in an illusion. But that is not the case with his treatment of Islamic traditions in Algeria and other parts of the Maghreb. The suppression of those traditions, on Fanon’s account, marginalize or push tradition into secret—or, perhaps, keep the tradition in the open, but always as backward, abject, and contrary to modernity. This means tradition is still alive, not a mirage, and as alive also valued deeply by communities resisting colonial rule. Such traditions can be instrumentalized for the sake of revolutionary action, only to be evaluated after colonialism for their suitability in a postcolonial nation and culture. The same logic is elaborated in “The Algerian Family”, where Fanon explores the traditional structure of families in Algeria, in particular how those families set gender identity, power, marriage, and reproduction in fixed roles. Revolutionary families, he argues, identify these fixed roles and break with them while also maintaining a conviction that their practices are Algerian—that is, Algerian in the new sense.
These reflections on racial-national identification, religion, gender, and family all return to the same basic argument: revolution is about the new. But that does not mean merely rejecting the past and suspending all tradition. Rather, it means, for Fanon, identifying sites for transformation inside tradition, with emphasis on those sites which offer revolutionary or tactical possibilities. These essays and the many shorter companion pieces from the time show Fanon puzzling over his dual commitments—to a revolution that is always for the future and to “the people” who are often deeply committed to traditions. Thinking through that crossing of commitments is the task of any revolutionary thought and Fanon’s careful thinking is exemplary.
3. Black Africa
In terms of volume, Fanon’s turn to Africa in the years following the publication of Black Skin, White Mask is overwhelmingly occupied with North Africa, and Algeria in particular. However, he also gives some key attention to sub-Saharan Africa or what he called “black Africa” in key essays, editorials, and letters collected in Toward the African Revolution.
Though there is some variety in terms of content and particular thematic sites, Fanon’s relationship to sub-Saharan Africa is fairly consistent. The Algerian experience and ideology that emerged from it structures Fanon’s take on anti-colonial struggle in the region, but he does not return to questions of anti-Black racism. Algeria is for Fanon the exemplar of revolutionary struggle. So, when talking about black Africa, Fanon will urge forgoing deep connections to or retrievals of pre-colonial Africa—something that reflects his early critiques of Négritude, for sure, but are in these later essays really plainly political and strategic. Africa is, ideologically, a unity for Fanon, and that unity is regularly articulated in terms of shared colonial struggle. Thus, the divisions between North and sub-Saharan Africa are erased in a shift of perspective; memories and grievances that might flow from legacies of the Arab slave trade are part of the disposable past. What matters is the shared condition in the present, and therefore to the future of unified anti-colonial struggle. In “Unity and Effective Solidarity are the Conditions for African Liberation” (“Unité et solidarité effective sont les conditions de la libération africaine”) (1960), Fanon is plain in writing that “inter-African solidarity must be a solidarity of fact, a solidarity of action, a solidarity concrete in men, in equipment, in money” (1964 [1994: 173]). All of these solidarities reflect an anti-essentialist approach to revolutionary struggle, which is consonant with Fanon’s work from the beginning. Also of note is how Fanon, in this context, asserts the necessity of the neutrality of anti-colonial struggle in Africa with regard to Cold War alliances. The history of post-independence Africa, which was the site of so many proxy wars and destabilization efforts from both sides of the Cold War, bears out Fanon’s observation and assertion.
Fanon also pauses to pay special attention to Patrice Lumumba who in 1961, when “Lumumba’s Death: Could We Do Otherwise” (“La mort de Lumumba: pouvions-nous faire autrement?”) was written, was known as a promising and important revolutionary leader. Lumumba immediately after became emblematic of both the revolutionary promise and seemingly inevitable neo-colonial fate of independent black Africa. This short essay is full of interesting observations, most of which revolve around the failure in Congo to unify around an anti-colonial ideology. The lack of this ideology, he notes, is what made Congo susceptible to Belgian and other European/American meddling, which then made Lumumba a natural target. Lumumba’s bold identification with anti-colonialism enacted what Fanon most wanted: neutrality in the Cold War, singular focus on the nation and the continent against colonialism in all forms. Lumumba’s death leads to the greatest threat to genuinely independent, anti-colonial Africa: national infighting instead of continental solidarity and the return of intra-national ethnic conflict that destabilizes what is most in need of stabilization.
In the end, it remains unclear how well Fanon understood the diversity of sub-Saharan Africa and its difference from North Africa, where he spent most of his time on the continent and to which his reflections are largely dedicated. The occasional pieces leading up to The Wretched of the Earth raise interesting questions and show how Fanon was dedicated to building lines of solidarity and shared struggle. African unity was paramount in Fanon’s work on the continent, and he boldly extends the Algerian experience to the central and southern regions of Africa. At the same time, and this becomes particularly clear when he reflects on black Africa’s memory of the slave trade, Fanon in The Wretched of the Earth calls for a suppression of memory and historical difference in the name of broader solidarity among the continent’s oppressed peoples. This has the strength of forging a vision of a future de-linked from the past—a project consistent with the revolutionary conclusion to Black Skin, White Masks—and yet seems largely unaware of or unconcerned with the consequences of forgetting the historical experiences of large swaths of sub-Saharan Africa. As well, the difference between settler colonies and those administered from a distance fades a bit when Fanon travels his reflections to black Africa, a difference that has received a more nuanced treatment in postcolonial theory since Fanon.
That said, work by Nigel Gibson in Fanonian Practices in South Africa (2011) and Achille Mbembe in Critique of Black Reason (2013 ) and Politiques de l’inimitié (2016), as well as essays by thinkers such as Mabogo Percy More, Richard Pithouse, and others, have placed Fanon in critical dialogue with sub-Saharan African political realities and emerging theoretical movements. This is some of the most exciting contemporary work in Fanon studies and indicates the rich, provocative resources in his work for the twenty-first century.
4. The Wretched of the Earth
Without question, the 1961 publication of The Wretched of the Earth (Les damnés de la terre) changed Fanon’s global profile as a thinker of anti-colonial struggle, revolutionary action, and post-colonial statecraft and imagination.
In many ways, Wretched is a fulfillment of the short, suggestive promissory notes on anti-colonial struggle found in the many essays, editorials, and letters written in the time following Black Skin, White Masks. Those occasional writings and major essays shift focus away from anti-Blackness as a core theme and toward a broader sense of the effects of colonialism on the psyche, cultural formation, and political organization. That shift in focus allows Fanon to think more broadly about the meaning and purpose of revolutionary struggle.
The opening chapter to Wretched is surely the most famous, in part because of the sheer power and provocation of its reflections, in part because it is the focus of Jean-Paul Sartre’s well-known Foreword. Fanon’s concern with violence is critical for understanding the trajectory of Wretched, which ambitiously moves from political agitation to cultural formation to postcolonial statecraft to global philosophical re-orientation. It all begins with violence.
Violence is important for Fanon as a precondition to liberation, something George Ciccariello-Maher in Decolonizing Dialectics (2017) links to a broader concern in Fanon with decolonizing methodology and revolutionary praxis. Violence as precondition operates in two directions: internal to the colony among the colonizers and external in the formative conflict between the colonized and the colonizer. Internal to the colony, Fanon breaks the colonized into three groups. First, there is the worker whose relationship to both the colonized and colonizer is organized around its capacity to work. This is a complicated relationship, one that is both a relation of dependency (material needs are supplied by the colonial system) and naturally revolutionary (exploited, yet also that upon which the colonizer depends). Second, there is the colonized intellectual, a compromised figure who plays a crucial role across the body of Wretched, whether in relation to cultural renewal or to political resistance. The colonized intellectual mediates the relation of the colonized for the colonizer, translating the terms of colonial life into the language, concepts, and thinkable politics of the colonial power. There is potential in the colonized intellectual, insofar as it is a figure whose epistemological roots cross with the life of the colonized masses, but any potential is compromised, if not outright obliterated by the role the intellectual plays: to aid and abet the colonizer. Third, there is the lumpen proletariat, a term borrowed from Karl Marx’s analysis of the dialectic’s remainder and translated into the conditions of colonialism. The colonial lumpen are disposable populations that provide nothing to the colonial system (displaced people, slum dwellers, subsistence farmers), and therefore, from the outside, remain the greatest threat to the system. In a certain sense, this is a formalization of Fanon’s earlier reflections on the role of the fellah in colonial Algeria—the group lying outside the system of urban colonial and anti-colonial struggle, a figure of purity and pure revolutionary power.
Violence emerges as a critical concept in this moment. Part of the colonizer’s fantasy of power and control lies in a perception of weakness, of inferiority, that is inherent in the colonized. The colonized are weak and therefore, in some fundamental sense, deserve their abject condition. This is consistent with Fanon’s reflection on the inferiority complex in Black Skin, White Masks, but writ large and as a characteristic of a population and people. If the inferiority of the colonized is an assumption and psychological reality of colonial life, then revolutionary violence cannot but be a shock to the entire system. The colonizer is shocked into awareness of the humanity of the colonized in the moment in which they are willing to risk their lives for another future. The colonized are shocked into awareness of their own potential and, in that potential, find themselves capable for forming a wide cultural, social, and political identity. Identity formation is critical in Fanon’s analysis; colonialism is a total project, so the colonized find themselves adrift in abjection. But violence changes all of that. Violence is simultaneously a saying of no to colonialism and a saying of yes to the possibilities of post-colonial life. The system cannot survive this shock. And so it means everything to the three classes of colonized life. The workers see the system on which they are dependent begin to collapse. Exploitation becomes a site of resistance, rather than something to be endured for the sake of material needs. The colonized intellectual is exposed as counter-revolutionary and a key element in the oppressive system. And the lumpen find an identity for the first time, moving from disposable excess to anti-colonialism’s most potent revolutionary force.
Violence is therefore tasked with the greatest of pair of intertwined tasks: elimination of the colonial system at the level of imagination (how colonizer-colonized relations are naturalized as superiority and inferiority) and of material reality (exploitative relations of subordination and extraction), as well as formation of cultural, social, and political identities. The first chapter of Wretched outlines and amplifies this enormous potential of revolutionary, anti-colonial violence, and the chapters that follow elaborate the complexities of post-colonial formations of culture and politics.
The next three chapters explore in great detail how revolutionary violence is related to collective identity formation (Chapter Two), consciousness of national identity (Chapter Three), and perhaps most importantly the formation of national culture (Chapter Four). What we see across these chapters is how potent and fecund Fanon’s conception of violence is, as well as how his various meditations on revolution and identity in the essays between his first and his last book pay real conceptual and strategic dividends. Conceptually, Fanon draws the sharpest contrast between what he calls the colonized intellectual and the revolutionary masses. The colonized intellectual is exactly what the terms suggests: a go-between who translates the colonized for the colonizer, in the colonizer’s language and for the political, social, and cultural purposes of the colonizer. The masses do not drive the colonized intellectual’s reflections, but rather the colonial vision of the world structures everything. Contrasted to that are the revolutionary masses who make a new political, social, and cultural order through revolutionary struggle itself. In this characterization, Fanon eschews vanguardism and all the sorts of elite revolutionary structures that follow from it. Rather, for Fanon, struggle itself generates political, social, and cultural identities and concepts; there is no prefiguring this element of a postcolonial world. Revolution makes everything revolutionary, and the postcolonial state cannot be thought without it. And so Fanon’s elaboration of this movement also criticizes atavistic notions of postcolonial state- and culture-craft, rejecting nostalgic turns to a precolonial African society as a vision for post-revolutionary society.
If the colonized intellectual and the precolonial forms of life are not just insufficient for, but actually damaging to, postcolonial world-making, then the future is a break with the past. Grievances composed of memories of historical violence (e.g., the Arab slave trade in black Africa) or ethno-religious and other cultural disputes give way to revolutionary action that dispenses with, rather than draws on, memory. The break with the past, at the level of organization and intellectual formation, is made through revolutionary violence. So too is the future. There is no pre-existing national consciousness or national culture, no genius or visionary who conceives it ahead of time, which means that revolutionary violence must be purposeful, intentional, and oriented toward world-making. In this way, Fanon’s work on violence is never nihilistic or random. Strategically, this means everything because conceptions of politics, culture, and the postcolonial social order hinge on the proper sense of violence.
The Wretched of the Earth concludes with one of Fanon’s most provocative and exciting pieces, evoking in much the same way as the conclusion to Black Skin, White Masks the possibility of a new future. In 1961, the future is for Fanon the question of the fate of humanism, a motif he shares with, most notably, Césaire’s 1955 text Discourse on Colonialism. What is humanism, Fanon asks, if it is held up to the measure of the world? That is, what does humanism look like if disentangled from the European concept, which is riddled with histories of violence and subjugation, and instead reflects or is infused with the liberation struggles of the global South? In terms of conceiving the post-colonial nation, Fanon returns to one of his earliest motifs: measure. Post-colonial nations, created through anti-colonial violence, cannot be duplications or imitations of European states. In part, this is a resolutely anti-colonial ideological position: make for yourself, do not make for the colonizer. But it is also, if not largely, based in a critique of Europe that understands Europe to be in crisis itself, to be dependent upon (at every level) structures of exploitation and extraction. Europe is a “spirit built on strange foundations” and characterized by “stasis”. (1961 [2005: 237]) Post-colonial states need different foundations, and so must work with new concepts and new imaginations of collectivity. Central to this are conceptions and imaginations of the human itself. “[W]e must make a new start”, Fanon writes, “develop a new way of thinking, and endeavor to create a new man”. (1961 [2005: 239]) Fanon does not give this “new man” content. The new man belongs to the future. The new man is to come.
5. The Case Studies
Fanon’s training in psychiatry is a central part of his work, from the methodological approaches to and characterizations of the dynamics of anti-Black racism in Black Skin, White Masks through the attention to postcolonial anxieties of cultural formation and statecraft in The Wretched of the Earth.
But apart from method alone, Fanon’s published and unpublished works offer case studies of victims of colonialism, studies which emphasize the lived pathologies of everyday life under colonial rule. Many of these are in the unpublished writings collected in Écrits sur l’aliénation et la liberté, but a key series of case studies are included in The Wretched of the Earth. These studies are generally under-thematized by Fanon scholars and postcolonial theory scholars more widely, though a few recent publications indicate a renewed interest in how concrete psychiatric work might function as part of the postcolonial theory archive and in Fanon’s larger project. The collaborative study by Nigel Gibson and Roberto Beneduce Frantz Fanon: Psychiatry and Politics (2017) goes a long way toward closing this gap in the literature, examining in detail both the history and theoretical work underlying Fanon’s psychiatric writings and case studies. As well, David Marriott’s Whither Fanon (2018) embeds the psychiatric writings and therapeutic practice inside Fanon’s work on anti-blackness and postcolonial politics.
Fanon’s original studies consider a range of disorders resulting from colonial violence. Some are mental disorders, by which Fanon means a generalized sense of anxiety caused by colonial domination and acted out in discrete parts of the personality. Others bear the disorder on the body and disfigure the person from the inside out or create sexual disorders connected to colonial degradations around femininity and masculinity. As well, Fanon includes a short piece at the end of The Wretched of the Earth on the medicalization of criminality in Algeria, with particular interest in how those disorders might be repurposed for the sake of revolutionary struggle. The studies are very detailed and narrativized, which opens up a new dimension of Fanon as critical observer. The studies also draw out the tension between psychiatric treatment and political ideology, something Fanon would argue is not overlaid on the situation by the therapist, but instead discovered, in therapy, to have been installed by the colonial order. The influence of this aspect of Fanon’s work can be seen in the Black Panther Party’s work in the United States on prisoner reintegration and public health initiatives, all of which were seen as blending care for the oppressed with harnessing revolutionary potential.
6. Legacy and Influence
We could say that, in many ways, Fanon’s legacy and influence outsizes his modest output as a writer. Fanon wrote for about a decade, which, in any comparison with other major thinkers, is almost no time at all. The pages produced, as well, are modest. Black Skin, White Masks and The Wretched of the Earth are substantial books composed of original chapters and analysis, but the other two works A Dying Colonialism (1959) and Toward the African Revolution (posthumously published in 1964) are comprised of short essays, preliminary analyses, and occasional pieces. While those shorter, preliminary, and occasional works are fascinating and important, they are a portrait of a thinker in motion, a thinker whose commitment to diverse and unfolding revolutionary sites required both quick takes and patient contemplation. Fanon moved very quickly through the Algerian struggle and did not hesitate to be declarative, and his work on black Africa is very much the same, albeit without the same concrete engagement and intellectual background. Yet, Fanon is also patient and reflective, something we see in the psychiatric studies that simultaneously underpin his broader analyses and suggest other productive avenues for thought.
In other words, looking back six-plus decades later, we can see Fanon’s oeuvre as composed of profound, enduring insights and a body of un- and under-developed work. This mixed legacy in the written work has not limited Fanon’s enormous influence. He was, in his time and certainly in the decades following his death, a hero to and intellectual inspiration for anti-colonial and anti-racist struggle, informing the work of thinkers from all over the global South. Latin American militants drew on Fanon’s insights, as did so many on the continent of Africa and across South Asia. His impact on cultural studies is also sizable. Fanonian concepts inform countless discussions of race, nation, migration, language, representation, visuality, and so on. This is largely due to Fanon’s unique ability to engage across theoretical approaches and, in those approaches, infuse analysis with rich phenomenological descriptions of the body and psyche under colonial domination. Reiland Rabaka’s Forms of Fanonism (2011) is especially interesting here for its careful work to reinscribe these kinds of analysis into the Black radical tradition more broadly.
The recent publication and translation into English of Fanon’s unpublished works, which range from letters to a draft of a play, will surely open up new dimensions of commentary. One of the signature features of Fanon-commentary is the creativity of the interlocutors who, if not doing lineage of influence textual study, have worked to interpret and extend Fanon’s ideas. Indeed, this is one of the more interesting features of Fanon scholarship, something Henry Louis Gates, Jr. famously described as Fanon’s function as a sort of Rorschach test—we see more in Fanon than is in the text. This is the fecundity of Fanon’s thinking, really. Books like Glen Coulthard’s Red Skin, White Masks (2014) and Hamid Dabashi’s Brown Skin, White Masks (2011) rewrite Fanon’s first work with an eye toward the similar-yet-different forms of colonial experience in indigenous North America (Coulthard) and the Middle East (Dabashi). Other writers such as Homi Bhabha, Nigel Gibson, Lewis Gordon, Richard Pithouse, and others have extended Fanonian categories and concepts to treat the experience of exile, migration, diaspora, African-American and Caribbean experiences, contemporary post-Apartheid South African struggles for justice, and so on. This kind of work underscores the fecundity of Fanon’s ideas, their elasticity and capacity for extending across historically and culturally diverse geographies. Such elasticity and capacity largely derives from Fanon’s attention to the colonized as a lumpen and revolutionary force, something to which he gives great descriptive and existential depth, rather than merely making an abstract ideological centerpiece. This attentiveness to the presence of deep resistance amongst the masses, even in the midst of profound and powerful forms of colonial oppression, is one of Fanon’s greatest contributions to revolutionary theorizing of the black Atlantic, global south, and racially marginalized populations. It is why Fanon’s work so exceeds page count and number of books. To have located and described the colonized subject under colonial domination with such precision and texture—this is Fanon’s gift to scholars, for sure, but more than that it is his gift to all who are engaged in radical struggle against racialized oppression.
- Capécia, Mayotte, 1948, Je suis Martiniquaise, Paris: Corrêa. Translated as I Am a Martinican Woman in I Am a Martinican Woman/The White Negress: Two Novelettes, Beatrice Stith Clark (trans.), Pueblo, CO: Passeggiata Press, 1997.
- Césaire, Aimé, 1955 , Discours sur le colonialisme, Pris/Dakar: Présence Africaine. Translated as Discourse on Colonialism, Joan Pinkham (trans.), New York: MR.
- Frantz Fanon, 1952 , Peau noire, masques blancs, Seuil. Translated as Black Skin, White Masks, Richard Philcox (trans), New York: Grove Books, 2008.
- –––, 1959 , L’an V de la
Révolution algérienne, Maspero. Translated as A
Dying Colonialism, Haakon Chevalier (trans.), New York: Grove
Books, 1994. Includes the essays
- “Algeria Unveiled”
- “The Algerian Family”
- “Algeria’s European Minority”
- –––, 1961 , Les damnés de la terre, Maspero. Translated as The Wretched of the Earth, Richard Philcox (trans.), New York: Grove Books, 2005.
- –––, 1964 , Pour la révolution
africaine. Écrits politiques, Maspero. Translated as
Toward the African Revolution, Haakon Chevalier (trans), New
York: Grove Books, 1994. Includes the essays
- 1955, “West Indians and Africans”.
- 1956, “Racism and Culture”.
- 1960, “Unity and Effective Solidarity are the Conditions for African Liberation”.
- 1961, “Lumumba’s Death: Could We Do Otherwise”.
- –––, 2006, The Fanon Reader, Azzedine Haddour (ed.), London: Pluto Press.
- –––, 2014, Decolonizing Madness: The Psychiatric Writings of Frantz Fanon, Nigel Gibson (ed.), London: Palgrave.
- –––, 2015 , Écrits sur l’aliénation et la liberté, Jean Khalfa and Robert J.C. Young (eds), Paris: La Découverte. Translated as Alienation and Freedom, Steven Corcoran (trans.), London: Bloomsbury, 2018.
- Guex, Germaine, 1950, La Névrose d’abandon, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
- Sartre, Jean-Paul, 1946, Réflexions sur la question juive, Paris: Editions Morihien. Translated as Anti-Semite and Jew, George J. Becker (trans.), New York: Schocken, 1948.
Selected Secondary Sources
- Alessandrini, Anthony C. (ed.), 2005, Frantz Fanon: Critical Perspectives, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203979501
- –––, 2014, Frantz Fanon and the Future of Cultural Politics, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
- Batchelor, Kathryn and Sue-Ann Harding (eds), 2017, Translating Fanon Across Continents and Languages, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315620626
- Bhabha, Homi, 1994, The Location of Culture, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203979501
- Ciccariello-Maher, George, 2017, Decolonizing Dialectics, (Radical Américas), Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
- Coulthard, Glen Sean, 2014, Red Skin, White Masks: Rejecting the Colonial Politics of Recognition, (Indigenous Americas), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
- Dabashi, Hamid, 2011, Brown Skin, White Masks, London: Pluto.
- Farred, Grant (ed.), 2013, Fanon: Imperative of the Now, special issue of South Atlantic Quarterly 112(1/Winter).
- Gates, Henry Louis, Jr, 1991, “Critical Fanonism”, Critical Inquiry, 17(3): 457–470. doi:10.1086/448592
- Gibson, Nigel, 2011, Fanonian Practices in South Africa, London: Palgrave.
- –––, 2017, Fanon: The Postcolonial Imagination, London: Polity Press.
- Gibson, Nigel and Roberto Beneduce, 2017, Frantz Fanon, Psychiatry and Politics, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers.
- Gordon, Lewis R., 1995, Fanon and the Crisis of European Man: An Essay on Philosophy and the Human Sciences, New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2015, What Fanon Said: A Philosophical Introduction to His Life and Thought, New York: Fordham University Press.
- Gordon, Lewis, T. Denean Sharpley-Whiting, and Renee T. White (eds), 1996, Fanon: A Critical Reader, Hoboken: Wiley-Blackwell Publishers.
- Lee, Christopher J., 2015, Frantz Fanon: Toward a Revolutionary Humanism, Athens, OH: Ohio University Press.
- Marriott, David, 2018, Whither Fanon? Studies in the Blackness of Being, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
- Mbembe, Achille, 2013 , Critique de la Raison Nègre, Paris: Editions La Découverte. Translated as Critique of Black Reason, Laurent Dubois (trans.), Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2017.
- –––, 2016, Politiques de l’inimitié, Paris: La Découverte.
- Nayar, Pramod, 2013, Frantz Fanon, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203073186
- Rabaka, Reiland, 2015, The Negritude Movement: W.E.B. Du Bois, Leon Damas, Aime Cesaire, Leopold Senghor, Frantz Fanon, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
- –––, 2014, Concepts of Cabralism: Amilcar Cabral and Africana Critical Theory, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
- –––, 2011, Forms of Fanonism: Frantz Fanon’s Critical Theory and the Dialectics of Decolonization, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
- –––, 2009, Africana Critical Theory: Reconstructing the Black Radical Tradition, from W.E.B. Du Bois and C.L.R. James to Frantz Fanon and Amilcar Cabral, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
- Sekyi-Otu, Ato, 1997, Fanon’s Dialectic of Experience, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
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Other Internet Resources
- Fondation Frantz Fanon (in French, but with English language option).