Notes to Frederick Douglass

1. For excellent biographies of Frederick Douglass, see Waldo E. Martin’s The Mind of Frederick Douglass (1984), and David W. Blight’s Frederick Douglass’ Civil War: Keeping Faith in Jubilee (1989) and his Frederick Douglass: Prophet of Freedom (2018). See note 4, infra.

2. Scholarly research into the year of Douglass’ birth has yielded no consensus. He was born either at the beginning of 1817 or the beginning of 1818. No official record of his birth exists, but the historian Dickson J. Preston argues that the date of 1818 is supported by the documents of the family of his master. Douglass himself, in his last autobiography, Life and Times of Frederick Douglass (1892), states that,

…Masters allowed no questions were their ages to be put to them by slaves. Such question were regarded by the masters as evidence of an impudent curiosity. From certain events, however, the dates of which I have since learned, I suppose myself to have been born in February, 1817. (FDAB: 475)

Philip Sheldon Foner, the editor of the Life and Writings of Frederick Douglass, a multi-volume collection of Douglass’s works, writes in the first volume of that collection and in his biography of Douglass:

Once when Frederick Douglass was asked when and where he was born, he replied: “I cannot answer; don’t know my age. Slaves have no family records”. All any biographer of Douglas can say is that the man who was christened Frederick Douglass was born in February, 1817, somewhere in Tuckhoe, Talbot County, on the eastern shore of Maryland, the son of an unknown white Father and Harriet Bailey, a slave. (Douglass 1950: 15).

However, later historians have cited the date 1818. For example, the date of 1818 is provided by John W. Blassingame (FDP v.1: xi) and Dickson J. Preston (1980: 8). Blassingame gives no supporting source, but Preston cites the records of the family of Douglass’s former “master”. Preston’s research on this question informs the research of Waldo E. Martin (1984), William S. McFeely (1991), and David Blight (2018).

3. This entry cites the Library of America’s collection of all three of Douglass’s autobiographies (1994, hereafter FDAB). See David Blight’s editions for a stand-alone version of the Narrative (2003) and My Bondage and My Freedom (2014). See also Angela Y. Davis’s edition, Narrative of the life of Frederick Douglass, an American slave, written by himself: a new critical edition (2010). The Angela Davis edition will appeal to students interested in her legacy, the history of 1960s black nationalism, critical theory, and critical race theory.

4. New students of Douglass will find convenient access to many of Douglass’s speeches in John R. McKivigan, Julie Husband, and Heather L. Kaufman’s excellent collection, The Speeches of Frederick Douglass: A Critical Edition (2018, hereafter SFD). It is a valuable to students and teachers of Douglass’s work, not only because it collects some of his most important speeches and writings, but also because it is available in digital format. Additionally, I generally rely on Philip Sheldon Foner and Yuval Taylor’s volume, Frederick Douglass: Selected Speeches and Writings (1999, hereafter FDSW). Likewise, Howard Brotz’s (1992) survey of late nineteenth-century through early twentieth-century African American social-political thought remains a handy source of some of Douglass’s speeches. Another useful collection, The Essential Douglass, is edited by Nicholas Buccola (Douglass 2016). This entry was written with high school to undergraduate students in mind and those that teach them, so, insofar as I am able, I cite The Speeches of Frederick Douglass as a source for his speeches and Frederick Douglass: Selected Speeches and Writings for other writings, because of their wide availability. I also would like to thank the readers who shared with me over the years their questions and stories about their encounters with the work of Douglass. Additionally, I would like to thank the participants and organizers of the New Currents in Teaching Philosophy workshops, which were held in 2021 and 2022 and sponsored by the Council of Independent Colleges. Their comments about this entry, and in reaction to my related presentations on teaching Douglass in philosophy courses, have contributed to the crafting of this entry.

5. Bill E. Lawson and Frank M. Kirkland’s Frederick Douglass: A Critical Reader (1999), is a reliable guide earlier to lines of inquiry about Douglass and the debates he inspired within philosophy in the United States. For a contemporary interdisciplinary collection, see Neil Robert’s A Political Companion to Frederick Douglass (2018).

6. John R. McKivigan, Julie Husband, and Heather L. Kaufman’s The Speeches of Frederick Douglass: A Critical Edition (SFD: Parts 2–5) is a useful resource on Douglass’s oratory; it includes sections on the influences on his oratory, Douglass’s comments about his public speaking, contemporary commentary about his speeches, and modern criticism of his oratory. For discussion of Douglass’s rhetoric see the collections edited by Eric Sundquist, Frederick Douglass: New Literary and Historical Essays (1990), Neil Roberts, A Political Companion to Frederick Douglass (2018: Part 4). Robert Levine’s The Lives of Frederick Douglass (2016) is a historical analysis of the meanings and purposes of Douglass’s autobiographies that is relevant to this issue.

7. David Blight’s Frederick Douglass’ Civil War (1989) is an invaluable history of Douglass’s ideas and efforts leading up to, during, and immediately following the U.S. Civil War.

8. It is worth reading the rest of the definition in his 1846 speech, “American Slavery, American Religion, and the Free Church of Scotland” (SFD: 17–54), because it includes a passage about what slavery is not. Douglass was concerned about the conceptual inflation of the term “slavery”, and he remarks about the dangers of its dilution as a term that refers to a particular evil and object of moral condemnation.

9. See George Fredrickson’s review of the history of the idea of race in his Racism (2002), and Paul C. Taylor’s philosophical analysis of classic, nineteenth-century racialist racism and its precedents, in his Race (2022).

10. See Yaure (2018) for a distinctive reading of this speech. Yaure contends that Douglass’s refusal to acknowledge that the humanity of blacks was something that should be argued over in the first place and that instead such views and the practices they support deserve nothing but “scorching irony”, reveals that Douglass was attuned to the limits of public reason in moral suasion and challenged those limits by forcefully declaring the moral personhood of blacks persons and the civic belonging of black Americans.

11. Howard McGary and Bill E. Lawson’s Between Slavery and Freedom: Philosophy and American Slavery (1992) is a useful source for philosophical analyses of these arguments. Additionally, Angel Davis was an early and key contributor to the philosophical literature on Douglass and American philosophical literature. Her groundbreaking lectures on Douglass, “Lectures on Liberation,” argued for an active rather than static conception of liberty and applied Marxist analysis to the Civil Rights struggles she was involved in during the late 1960s and early 1970s (Davis 1971). The first was published in 1971 by the New York Committee to Free Angela Davis. The second is available as “Unfinished Lecture on Liberation–II” in Philosophy Born of Struggle: Anthology of Afro-American Philosophy from 1917 (Davis 1971 [1983]). Davis released an edition of Douglass’s Narrative that includes the full versions of both lectures (Douglass 1845 [2010]), and they are collected in Roberts’s A Political Companion to Frederick Douglass (2018: 107–134). See also Davis’s “From the Prison of Slavery to the Slavery of Prison: Frederick Douglass and the Convict Lease System” (Davis 1999).

12. A portion of that speech was quoted in Blight’s Frederick Douglass’ Civil War (1989: 6), which is an invaluable historical guide to Douglass’ antebellum politics and how he employed ideas like “natural law”. The passage is not a one-off; the content is there, even more so, at the beginning of the speech and is consistent with his other works. Douglass took the idea of natural law very seriously. See Martin (1984) for more on how Douglass thought about Enlightenment ideas, and how he used the idea of natural rights, which are derived from natural law. See Myers (2008) and Buccola (2012) for more how Douglass and his use of those ideas are connected to liberalism as an ideology and political theory. And see Moses (1978) for how Douglass and his ideas were a part of and contributed to the early history of black nationalism. Furthermore, Douglass’s use of Christian doctrine reflects a central feature of the Anglo-American abolition movement; it was primarily a religiously motivated reform movement. Blight (1989 and 2018) and Myers (2008) are good sources for background information about Douglass’s religiosity and his use of Christian ideas. And Sinha’s The Slave’s Cause: A History of Abolition (2016) is an invaluable resource about the history and ideas, religious and otherwise, that motivated the abolition movement.

13. The psalm reads: “Princes shall come out of Egypt; Ethiopia shall soon stretch out her hands unto God” (King James Version). Douglass’s view and rhetoric of enacted providence and the historical necessity of reform are apparent through many of his works. Still, two deserve to be highlighted: First, his “The Significance of Emancipation in the West Indies” from 1857 is another display of his vision of global enlightenment but with specific mention of its implications for the African diaspora. Second, “‘It Moves’, Or the Philosophy of Reform” from 1883b (SFD: 374–400) is interesting because he intentionally presents a theory of reform that is consistent with his understanding of historical and civilizational development. It is a work that is directly comparable to theories of development offered by his contemporaries in American philosophy, in particular the ideas of Ralph Waldo Emerson ([1850] 2004).

14. It is remarkable that the major single-volume selected collections of Douglass’s speeches and writings do not include this speech. This includes Foner and Taylor’s Frederick Douglass: Selected Speeches and Writings (1999, FDSW), Buccola’s The Essential Douglass: Selected Writings & Speeches (2016), and even a collection explicitly devoted to Douglass’s oratory, McKivigan et al.’s The Speeches of Frederick Douglass: A Critical Edition (2018). Furthermore, McKivigan’s collection includes the illustration from 1860 that depicts the mob’s violent interruption of the abolition meeting at Tremont Temple in Boston that inspired the speech. Those edited collections serve a pedagogical purpose: to gather Douglass’s historically and politically significant writings for the use of students, teachers, and the general readers. That “A Plea for Freedom of Speech in Boston” was excluded from these educational collections is disappointing because they miss an opportunity to provide a speech by Douglass that directly relates to current controversies over freedom of speech and to educate readers about Douglass’s view.

15. Douglass further detailed his view is a series of speeches and articles, see, for example, “The American Constitution and the Slaves” from 1860 (1860a [SFD: 151–185]) or “The Constitution of the United States: Is it Pro-Slavery or Anti-Slavery” from 1860 (1860a [FDSW: 380–390]).

16. For more on the debate over Douglass’s constitutional interpretation, see Robert Bernasconi’s “The Constitution Of The People: Frederick Douglass And The Dred Scott Decision” (1991), David E. Schrader’s “Natural Law in the Constitutional Thought of Frederick Douglass” (1999), and Charles W. Mill’s “Whose Fourth of July? Frederick Douglass and ‘Original Intent’” (1999). For a contrasting view on Douglass’s position, see “Frederick Douglass’s Political Apostasy” (Sundstrom 2008: 11–35).

17. The meaning of this fight has been explained using a variety of theoretical frameworks. In addition to the dominant Kant-inspired deontological account, some apply an existentialist reading to the fight and even to Douglass as a figure (L. Gordon 1999; Yancy 2008), while others argue that the fight is better understood through various political and philosophical lenses (Buccola 2012: 14–40; McGary & Lawson 1992: 163–209; Willett 1998 and 2001).

18. In his reflections on the debate between Booker T. Washington and W.E.B. Du Bois over the politics of protest versus accommodation, Boxill (1976) extended the lesson of the fight, and others from Douglass’s legacy of activism, to illuminate the ethical motivation and obligation to protest injustice.

19. I am grateful to Daniel Bramer, Associate Professor of Philosophy and Religious Studies at Holy Family University, for bringing this connection to my attention.

20. Davis (1971) and Boxill (1997 and 1998) were right to emphasize the central role of struggle and self-defense in Douglass’s view of self-respect. Standing up for oneself and one’s group is key to commanding respect and asserting and protecting individual and group dignity. This is important for all, but it is crucial for those suffering from domination because their dignity is imperiled or denied. It is immediately apparent that this is relevant to the history of race, slavery, and racism in America and thus is a crucial aspect of black American political thought. In this vein, see Bromell (2021) for an account of Douglass’s view of dignity that wrongly attempts to separate Douglass’s view of dignity from its liberal, republican, and Judeo-Christian sources. While his reading is enthusiastic, his analysis is more in line with an ideological rejection of liberalism than Douglass’s own words and history. For example, Bromell makes much of Douglass’s references to “power” (as seemingly opposed to reason) to distinguish his power-centered analysis from Boxill’s deontological one. Although a Kantian analysis should not be the only lens through which to examine Douglass’s view, that does not entail that Douglass’s references to the idea of power separate him from the liberal tradition on dignity. Consider Thomas Hobbes on the subject for just one example of the link between dignity, power, and self-worth. He wrote,

The value or Worth of a man, is as of all other things, his price, that is to say, so much as would be given for the use of his power; and therefore is not absolute, but a thing dependent on the need and judgment of another. (Hobbes 1651/1668 [1994: 51])

And about dignity, he wrote, “[t]he public worth of a man, which is the value set on him by the commonwealth, is that which men commonly call Dignity” (Hobbes 1651/1668 [1994: 52]). I cite Hobbes here to demonstrate the link, made early in liberal political theory, between dignity, self-recognition, the recognition of others, and bodily and cognitive power, as expressed through action, such as labor or, more pointedly, war. Douglass would have certainly rejected the idea that persons have a price, and on that score, he is more in line with Kant than Hobbes, but he would have recognized, and perhaps agreed with, the implicit threat in Hobbes’s insights about the state of war and the imperative to seek peace. The point, though, is that there is a rich connection between Douglass and the liberal tradition, and it is a connection that magnifies both.

21. Ronald Dworkin’s (2006: 9–11) view of dignity as having two dimensions corresponds to Douglass’s view. Dworkin states these dimensions as principles, the first being the “principle of inherent value”, and the second being the “principle of personal responsibility”. The latter principle involves the obligation to fulfill one’s moral obligations, including the obligation to stand up for oneself as a moral being. As with Douglass’s view of natural law, there were many sources of his view of equality, self-respect, and dignity. Interestingly, he offhandedly mentioned Joseph Mazzini while making a point about sympathizing with the oppressed in a speech promoting abolition and condemning slavery (FDAB: 379). This is relevant because Mazzini was an Italian philosopher active in Italian republican politics who, in 1860, published The Duties of Man (English translation, 1907), which offers a conception of human dignity as something inherent and expressed that is similar to Douglass’s. Mazzini was in England in the 1840s, in exile from Italy, just as Douglass was in exile there from 1845 through 1847, to escape capture and return to slavery. Incidentally, Douglass referred to Louis Kossoth, a Hungarian political leader and reformer from that period who also had to flee in exile to escape political persecution. Mazzini’s The Duties of Man was first translated into English in 1862, so Douglass could have been reacting to Mazzini’s situation rather than that book. All the same, William Lloyd Garrison, who, of course, Douglass first collaborated with, admired Mazzini and that book. The connection is, at the very least intriguing.

22. Douglass a great admirer of Burns’ poetry and cited it often (Blight 2018). On how Burns’ poem is connected to the idea of dignity, see Waldron (2012: 33).

23. In contrast to Douglass, Martin Delany supported emigration. See his, The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States (1852 [1968]). I also recommend Robert S. Levine’s Martin Delany, Frederick Douglass, and the Politics of Representative Identity (1997).

24. The topic of black leadership, and its relationship to elitism, uplift, and solidarity, has a substantial literature. A great place to start is Harold Cruse’s 1967 classic on black leadership, The Crisis of the Negro Intellectual: A Historical Analysis of the Failure of Black leadership.

25. The conservation of race debate, especially Du Bois’s argument, has a lengthy bibliography. Two touchstone essays are Anthony Appiah’s “The Uncompleted Argument: Du Bois and the Illusion of Race” (1985) and Lucius Outlaw’s “Against the Grain of Modernity: The Politics of Difference and the Conservation of ‘Race’” (1992). For an analysis of the debate, see Gooding-Williams, In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-modern Political Thought in America (2009) and Paul Taylor’s Race (2022).

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