Notes to Frederick Douglass

1. For an excellent biography of Frederick Douglass, see Waldo E. Martin, The Mind of Frederick Douglass (1984). See also Peter Myers’s study of Douglass’s politics and its relation to American liberalism (Myers 2008). See also, Maurice S. Lee, The Cambridge Companion to Frederick Douglass (2009).

2. Scholarly research into the year of Douglass’ birth has yielded no consensus. He was born either at the beginning of 1817 or the beginning of 1818. No official record of his birth exists, but the historian Dickson J. Preston argues that the date of 1818 is supported by the documents of the family of his master.

Douglass himself, in his last autobiography, Life and Times of Frederick Douglass (1892), states on the first page, that

…Masters allowed no questions were their ages to be put to them by slaves. Such question were regarded by the masters as evidence of an impudent curiosity. From certain events, however, the dates of which I have since learned, I suppose myself to have been born in February, 1817.

Philip Sheldon Foner, the editor of the Life and Writings of Frederick Douglass, a multi-volume collection of Douglass’s works, writes in the first volume of that collection and in his biography of Douglass:

Once when Frederick Douglass was asked when and where he was born, he replied: “I cannot answer; don’t know my age. Slaves have no family records.” All any biographer of Douglas can say is that the man who was christened Frederick Douglass was born in February, 1817, somewhere in Tuckhoe, Talbot County, on the eastern shore of Maryland, the son of an unknown white Father and Harriet Bailey, a slave. (Foner 1964: 15).

However, later historians have cited the date 1818. For example, the date of 1818 is provided by John W. Blassingame (FDP1 v.1: xi) and Dickson J. Preston (1985: 8). Blassingame gives no supporting source, but Preston cites the records of the family of Douglass’s master. Preston’s research informs Waldo E. Martin (1984); and William S. McFeely (1991).

3. This entry cites the Library of America’s collection of all three of Douglass’s autobiographies (1994, hereafter FDAB). For a stand-alone edition of the Narrative, see the edition edited by David Blight (2003). See also Angela Y. Davis' edition, Narrative of the life of Frederick Douglass, an American slave, written by himself : a new critical edition (2010, hereafter FDN-Davis). The Angela Davis edition will appeal to students interested in her legacy, the history of 1960s black nationalism, critical theory, and critical race theory.

4. For a stand-alone, see William L. Andrews’ edition of My Bondage and My Freedom (1987).

5. New students of Douglass will find convenient access to many of Douglass’s important articles, letters, and speeches in the shorter collection, Philip Sheldon Foner and Yuval Taylor, Frederick Douglass: Selected Speeches and Writings (1999, hereafter FDSW). Likewise, Brotz’s survey of late 19th-century and early 20th-century African American social political thought remains a handy source of some of Douglass most important speeches (Brotz 1992).

6. For more on the idea of social death and natal alienation, see Orlando Patterson 1982.

7. The essay (Davis [1971] 1983) was published in 1971, as part of a series of lectures first given in 1969 (1971). For a discussion of the historical context of Davis’s essay, see Joy James’s introduction to The Angela Y. Davis Reader (James 1998). See also, Angela Y. Davis, “From the Prison of Slavery to the Slavery of Prison: Frederick Douglass and the Convict Lease System” (Davis 1999). Davis has also released a new edition of Douglass Narrative that includes her “unfinished lecture” on Douglass (in FDN-Davis).

8. The psalm reads: “Princes shall come out of Egypt; Ethiopia shall soon stretch out her hands unto God” (King James Version).

9. For more on the idea of the racial contract, see Mills 1997. See also, David E. Schrader, “Natural Law in the Constitutional Thought of Frederick Douglass” (1999). For a contrasting view on Douglass’s position, see Ronald R. Sundstrom, The Browning of America and the Evasion of Social Justice (2008: 11–35).

10. It is easy to read “manhood” as an expression of nineteenth century conception of independence, vigor, or virility. Its phalli-centric connotations, however, have not escaped critical analysis. See, Maurice O. Wallace, “Violence, Manhood, and War in Douglass” (2009).

11. For a more detailed discussion of Douglass’s assimilationism and amalgamationism, as well as the multiple competing claims to his legacy, see Ronald R Sundstrom, “Douglass & Du Bois’s der Schwarze Volksgeist” (2003). See also “Frederick Douglass’s Political Apostasy” in Sundstrom 2008: 11–35.

12. For a general history of assimilation and its relationship to whiteness in the United States, see Milton Myron Gordon, Assimilation in American Life: The Role of Race, Religion, and National Origins (1964); Ian Haney-López, White By Law: The Legal Construction of Race (2006).

13. For Delany’s position see his The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States (1852). For a reading of Delany’s support of emigration that offers a reading that is counter to Douglass’s, see Tommie Shelby, We Who are Dark: The Philosophical Foundations of Black Solidarity (2005).

14. The topic of black leadership, and its relationship to elitism, uplift, and solidarity, has a substantial literature. A great place to start is Harold Cruse’s 1967 classic on black leadership; see Harold Cruse, The Crisis of the Negro intellectual: A Historical Analysis of the Failure of Black leadership. For a contemporary critique of this tradition see, Joy James, Transcending the Talented Tenth: Black leaders and American intellectuals (1997).

15. The conservation of race debate, and especially Du Bois’s argument, has a long bibliography. Two key initial essays were, Anthony Appiah, “The Uncompleted Argument: Du Bois and the Illusion of Race” (1985); Lucius Outlaw, “Against the Grain of Modernity: The Politics of Difference and the Conservation of ‘Race’” (1996). For an analysis of the debate, see Gooding-Williams, In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-modern Political Thought in America (2009).

16. Douglass wrote several articles and speeches on John Brown and other figures whom he considered “representative” and self-made.

Copyright © 2017 by
Ronald Sundstrom <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free