Notes to The Frege-Hilbert Controversy

1. Though Hilbert does not reply directly to Frege after 1900, Alwin Korselt defends Hilbert against Frege’s criticisms in his 1903. Frege’s 1906 is, in part, a response to Korselt.

2. See for example the use of reinterpretation in Peano 1889, Pieri 1898, Padoa 1900, Huntington 1902, and Veblen 1904.

3. For an account of the antecedents of Hilbert’s method and of modern model-theoretic techniques, see Nagel 1939; Mancosu, Zach, & Badesa 2009; Hallett 2012; and Blanchette 2017.

4. Some of the important details are these: (i) Hilbert’s interpretations do not specify a “universe” in the sense now standard for models; no such specification is relevant to his purposes, since in Hilbert’s geometric sentences, quantifiers are always relativized to specific predicates. (ii) Contemporary models are typically understood as constructed via an axiomatized set theory, rather than via more general appeal to assumed mathematical background. Finally, (iii) Hilbert uses ordinary German (with mathematical terminology), rather than a formal language, to present his axioms; no truth-definition is given, but the truth-conditions of sentences are taken as understood.

5. Hilbert’s own way of describing the definitional role of his axioms is less clear than one might like; a better account is found in Frege’s description of Hilbert’s method. For further discussion, see Resnik 1974.

6. Two technical points: (i) The existence of the n-tuple, and the claim that it satisfies the defined relation, both rely on the assumption of the accuracy of the background theory B. (ii) The relation of satisfiability described here is an ancestor of the modern Tarskian notion, differing from it in relying on an intuitive understanding of the idea of a sentence expressing a truth under an interpretation.

7. It is important to keep in mind that a thought (Gedanke) is not a mental entity, but is rather an objective, intersubjectively-accessible proposition, the kind of thing ordinarily expressed by a declarative sentence. It is what Frege also refers to as the sense (Sinn) of a sentence.

8 On the importance of Hilbert’s new conception of axioms, see Bernays 1922 and Hallett 2010.

9 This interpretation is first presented in Blanchette 1996. For an argument against this interpretation, see Hodges 2004. For a response, see Blanchette 2007.

10. See Frege 1881: 27. For discussion of this example, see Blanchette 2007.

11. Tappenden, however, argues that the 1910 claim should not be taken as a rejection of the possibility of proving independence. See Tappenden 2000. For a contrary view, see Blanchette 2014.

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Patricia Blanchette <>

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