Notes to The Frege-Hilbert Controversy

1. Some of the important details are these: (i) Hilbert's interpretations do not specify a “universe” in the sense now standard for models; no such specification is relevant to his purposes, since in Hilbert's geometric sentences, quantifiers are always relativized to specific predicates. (ii) Contemporary models are typically understood as constructed via an axiomatized set theory, rather than via more general appeal to assumed mathematical background. Finally, (iii) Hilbert uses ordinary German (with mathematical terminology), rather than a formal language, to present his axioms; no truth-definition is given, but the truth-conditions of sentences are taken as understood.

2. It is important to keep in mind that a thought (Gedanke) is not a mental entity, but is rather an objective, intersubjectively-accessible proposition, the kind of thing ordinarily expressed by a declarative sentence. It is what Frege also refers to as the sense (Sinn) of a sentence.

3. For Frege, this is a complex higher-level relation.

4. See Frege 1881, p. 27. For discussion of this example, see Blanchette 2007.

Copyright © 2012 by
Patricia Blanchette <>

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