The Frege-Hilbert Controversy

First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Thu Mar 7, 2024

In the early years of the twentieth century, Gottlob Frege and David Hilbert, two titans of mathematical logic, engaged in a controversy regarding the correct understanding of the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and the correct way to demonstrate consistency and independence results for such axioms. The controversy touches on a number of difficult questions in logic and the philosophy of logic, and marks an important turning-point in the development of modern logic. This entry gives an overview of that controversy and of its philosophical underpinnings.

1. Introduction

In June 1899, at a ceremony marking the installation of the new Gauss-Weber monument in Göttingen, David Hilbert delivered a lecture on the foundations of geometry. Published later that year by Teubner under the title “Grundlagen der Geometrie” (“Foundations of Geometry”), the piece stands as a watershed in the development of modern mathematics and logic. Though the subject-matter of the work is geometry, its lasting influence concerns more broadly the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and the systematic treatment of such metatheoretical questions as consistency and independence. By presenting a rich trove of consistency and independence demonstrations, Hilbert displays here the power of the “structural” approach to axioms, and lays the groundwork for what soon becomes our own contemporary model-theoretic approach to formal systems. (For the historical background to Hilbert’s treatment of axioms, see Hallett 2012 and Nineteenth Century Geometry; for the role of Hilbert’s work in the development of model theory, see model theory and Eder & Schiemer 2018.)

Hilbert’s lecture and monograph inspired a sharp reaction from his contemporary Gottlob Frege, who found both Hilbert’s understanding of axioms, and his approach to consistency and independence demonstrations, virtually incomprehensible and at any rate seriously flawed. Frege’s reaction is first laid out in his correspondence with Hilbert from December 1899 to September 1900, and subsequently in two series of essays (both entitled “On the Foundations of Geometry”) published in 1903 and 1906. Hilbert was never moved by Frege’s criticisms, and did not respond to them after 1900. Frege, for his part, was never convinced of the reliability of Hilbert’s methods, and held until the end that the latter’s consistency and independence proofs were fatally flawed.[1]

In this philosophical debate between the two mathematicians, we see a clash between two quite different ways of understanding the nature of mathematical theories and of their justification. The difference of opinion over the success of Hilbert’s consistency and independence proofs is, as detailed below, the result of significant differences of opinion over such fundamental issues as: how to understand the content of a mathematical theory, what a successful axiomatization consists in, what the “truths” of a mathematical theory really are, and finally, what one is really asking when one asks about the consistency of a set of axioms or the independence of a given mathematical statement from others.

In what follows, we look briefly at Hilbert’s technique in Foundations of Geometry, detail Frege’s various criticisms thereof, and finally outline the overall conceptions of logic that give rise to the differences.

2. Hilbert’s Foundations of Geometry

2.1 Outline

Hilbert’s work in Foundations of Geometry (hereafter referred to as “FG”) consists primarily of laying out a clear and precise set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and of demonstrating in detail the relations of those axioms to one another and to some of the fundamental theorems of geometry. In particular, Hilbert demonstrates the consistency of various sub-groups of the axioms, the independence of a number of axioms from others, and various relations of provability and of independence of important theorems from specific sub-groups of the axioms. Included are new demonstrations of the consistency of the entire set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and of the independence of the axiom of parallels from the other Euclidean axioms.

The notion of “independence” at issue here is that of non-provability: to say that a given statement is independent of a collection of statements is to say that it is not provable from them. Consistency, too, is understood in terms of provability: to say that a collection of statements is consistent is to say that no contradiction is provable from it. Hence the two notions, consistency and independence, are inter-definable: a set of statements is consistent if an arbitrarily-chosen contradiction is independent of it, and a statement S is independent of a set C if the set \(C \cup {\sim}S\) is consistent.

Hilbert’s consistency demonstrations in FG are all demonstrations of relative consistency, which is to say that in each case the consistency of a set AX of geometric axioms is reduced to that of a familiar background theory B, demonstrating that AX is consistent if B is. The important technique Hilbert employs is the reinterpretation of the geometric terms appearing in AX in such a way that, as reinterpreted, the members of AX express theorems of B. For example, Hilbert’s first consistency-proof interprets the terms “point”, “line”, and “lies on” as standing respectively for a particular collection of ordered pairs of real numbers, for a collection of ratios of real numbers, and for an algebraically-defined relation between such pairs and ratios; under this reinterpretation, the geometric sentences in question express theorems of the background theory of real numbers.

That such a reinterpretation strategy guarantees relative consistency can be seen via the following reasoning: If the set AX were inconsistent, then there would be a proof of a contradiction from it. But since this proof would remain a proof (and the contradiction would remain a contradiction) when the terms “point,” “line,” etc. are reinterpreted in Hilbert’s way, this means that a contradiction would be provable from the resulting set of theorems of B. And hence B itself would be inconsistent.

Independence is demonstrated in exactly the same way. To show that a statement I is independent of a set AX of statements (relative to the consistency of B), one interprets the relevant geometric terms in such a way that the members of AX, as interpreted, express theorems of B, while I expresses the negation of a theorem of B. That is, the independence of I from AX (relative to the consistency of B) is demonstrated by proving the consistency of \(\textit{AX} \cup \{{\sim}I\}\) relative to that of B.

The general idea of using interpretations to prove consistency was not novel in FG; similar strategies had been recently applied in various mathematical schools to show consistency and independence in arithmetic and in class theory, as well as in geometry.[2] The technique also has antecedents in the earlier use of geometric models to prove the consistency of non-Euclidean geometries. [3] Hilbert’s work in FG brings however a significant advance in terms of the clarity and systematic application of the technique, and an influential account of the nature of the metatheoretic reasoning involved in demonstrating consistency and independence via reinterpretation. Once Hilbert’s technique is applied to the sentences of a fully formalized language, a development that took place in stages over the three decades following FG, we obtain essentially the modern understanding of models, whose use today in demonstrations of consistency and independence differs only in detail from that of Hilbert’s technique.[4]

Hilbert’s central idea, again, is to focus not on particular geometrical concepts like point and line, but to pay attention instead to the logical relations that are said, by the axioms, to hold between those concepts. The question of the independence of the parallels axiom from the other Euclidean axioms, for example, has entirely to do with the logical structure exhibited by these axioms, and nothing to do with whether it is geometric points and lines one is talking about, or some other subject-matter altogether. As Hilbert says,

[I]t is surely obvious that every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary relations to one another, and that the basic elements can be thought of in any way one likes. If in speaking of my points I think of some system of things, e.g., the system: love, law, chimney-sweep … and then assume all my axioms as relations between these things, then my propositions, e.g., Pythagoras’ theorem, are also valid for these things. In other words: any theory can always be applied to infinitely many systems of basic elements. (Letter to Frege of December 29, 1899, as excerpted by Frege [ellipsis Hilbert’s or Frege’s] in Frege [PMC]: 40)

There are two important ways, then, in which the geometric terms in FG serve essentially as placeholders. The first is that the axioms and theorems of FG are understood as reinterpretable sentences, where a reinterpretation is simply an assignment of new content to the geometric terms. The second is that a proof – a set of sentences leading logically from premises to conclusion – relies not at all on the contents of those simple terms, and so retains its status as a proof through reinterpretation.

When sentences are viewed in this way, as containing a targeted collection of re-interpretable terms, a set of sentences can be viewed as providing a definition of a certain kind, a kind typically referred to as “implicit definition.” Specifically: A set AX of sentences containing n reinterpretable terms implicitly defines an n-place relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) holding of just those n-tuples which, when taken respectively as the interpretations of AX’s reinterpretable terms, render the members of AX true. (For example: if AX is the set {There are at least two points; Every point lies on at least two lines}, then \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) is the relation that holds of any triple \(\langle P, \textit{LO}, L\rangle\) such that P has at least two members, L has at least two members, and LO is a relation that holds between each member of P and at least two members of L.) The defined relation is simply the abstract structure, or as Hilbert puts it the “scaffolding”, shared by any such n-tuple.[5]

When a set of sentences provides an implicit definition of a relation, one can ask whether that relation (and, by extension, the set of sentences itself) is satisfiable. That is, one can ask whether there is an n-tuple which, when serving as the interpretation of the relevant terms in the sentences, will make each sentence true. Each of Hilbert’s consistency-demonstrations in FG provides an n-tuple that satisfies the relevant defined relation, and hence provides a proof of the satisfiability of that relation. Satisfiability in this sense is sufficient for consistency, via the reasoning given above.[6]

We can now redescribe Hilbert’s technique, in a nutshell, as follows: Given a set AX of sentences, Hilbert appeals to a background theory B to construct an interpretation of AX’s geometric terms under which the members of AX express theorems of B. This interpretation is, assuming the consistency of B, an n-tuple satisfying the relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) defined by AX. Its existence demonstrates the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) and consequently the consistency of AX relative to that of B. Similarly, an interpretation under which each member of a set \(\textit{AX} \cup \{{\sim}I\}\) expresses a theorem of B demonstrates that I is independent of AX if B is consistent.

2.2 The Novelty of the Strategy

Two crucial featues of Hilbert’s strategy, as we’ve seen, are (i) the understanding of axioms as reinterpretable sentences, and (ii) the understanding of provability as insensitive to the meanings of mathematical terms. The novelty of this approach can be seen by a comparison with mainstream views of mathematics leading up to the mid-19th century, and specifically with views of the connection between proof and conceptual analysis. In geometry, investigations of the provability of Euclid’s parallels postulate from at least the time of Proclus until the end of the 18th century involved detailed attempts to analyze the notion of straight line, with the goal of discovering conceptual connections between the straightness of a pair of lines and the impossibility of asymptotic approach. Leibniz, for example, proposed a number of strategies for reducing the concept straight line to simpler concepts, as part of his sophisticated attempts to prove the parallels postulate (see DeRisi 2016, esp. Chapter 4). We see the importance of this concept (and the frustration of the centuries-long failure of attempts to prove the parallels postulate) in D’Alembert’s remark that “[t]he definition and the properties of the straight line, and hence of parallel lines, are therefore the pitfall, and one might say, the scandal of the elements of Geometry” (D’Alembert 1767, pp. 206–7, as quoted by De Risi 2016, 57n). The main point to notice here, for our purposes, is the role of conceptual analysis in settling questions of provability. In the kinds of geometric investigations relevant to Leibniz and his contemporaries, the term “straight line” is not merely a reintepretable symbol; the fact that it stands for a specific kind of geometric entity, one with clear conceptual connections to spatial intuition and to the other fundamental concepts of geometry, is critical to questions about the provability of the claims expressed by sentences involving that term. Similarly for the remainig geometric terms. The core idea is that logical connections obtain between sentences (or between the claims expressed by them) not just in virtue of the superficial structure of the sentences themselves, but also in virtue of conceptual connections, sometimes revealed by conceptual analysis and expressed by definitions, between the contents of individual geometric terms. Outside of geometry, we see a similar pattern in 19th-century developments in set theory and in real analyiss, where conceptual clarifications of such notions as equi-cardinality and of continuous function played a central role in the proof of foundational theorems. (See the entries on the early development of set theory, continuity and infinitesimals, and Bernard Bolzano.) As Frege puts the general point in 1914:

In the development of science it can indeed happen that one has used a word, a sign, an expression, over a long period under the impression that its sense is simple until one succeeds in analysing it into simpler logical constituents. By means of such an analysis, we may hope to reduce the number of axioms; for it may not be possible to prove a truth containing a complex constituent so long as that constituent remains unanalysed; but it may be possible, given an analysis, to prove it from truths in which the elements of the analysis occur. [Logic in Mathematics manuscript; Frege [PW] 209]

The new understanding of axioms and of provability exemplified in Hilbert’s work effectively separates questions of conceptual analysis from questions of rigorous proof. When Hilbert asks whether a given geometric sentence S is provable from a collection AX of geometric axioms, this is not a question that can be informed by providing a conceptual analysis of concepts expressed by the relevant geometric terms. It is instead a question about what we might call the “formal” provability of S from AX, where a formal proof makes no appeal to the contents of geometric (or other mathematical) terms. This indifference of provability (and hence of consistency and independence) to the contents of individual terms results both in the demonstrability of consistency and independence via re-interpretations, and in an important increase in the precision of questions about provability, consistency, and independence. The question of how best to understand and analyze geometrical concepts, while still important to decisions about how to present a given theory - i.e. about which terms and sentences to use - now plays no role in questions of provability, strictly speaking.

The new understanding of axioms as re-interpretable sentences that we see in FG is motivated not just by the increase in precision that this conception allows, but also by a new conception of mathematical theories that emerged in the work of a number of mathematicians at the end of the 19th century. (See the entry structuralism in mathematics, and also Dedekind 1888; Peano 1889; Huntington 1902; Veblen 1904; Awodey and Reck 2002.) Perhaps most clearly expressed in the work of Richard Dedekind (1888, 1890), the idea is that a mathematical theory does not describe a particular collection of objects (say, numbers or lines in space), but instead characterizes an abstract structure that can be instantiated by different ordered collections. This view of the content of mathematical theories, now often termed the “structuralist” view, goes hand in hand with the idea that the individual terms of a theory are, as outlined above, placeholders that can take on any syntactically-permissible content. The abstract structure-type implicitly defined by a collection of axioms so understood is, on the structuralist view, the subject-matter of the mathematical theory so axiomatized. Unlike the earlier Leibnizian view, then, the newer structuralist view makes it natural to understand the provability of a sentence from other sentences as a matter of the abstract relations expressed by those sentences when their geometric terms are re-interpretable placeholders. With provability so understood, relative consistency and independence are demonstrable straightforwardly via Hilbert’s reinterpretation strategy.

We can sum up the important innovations found in the work of a number of authors at the end of the 19th century, but most clearly exemplified by Hilbert’s Foundations of Geometry, as follows: The first is the understanding of rigorous provability, and hence of consistency and independence, as independent of the meanings of targeted (e.g. geometric) terms. This makes it possible to demonstrate relative consistency and independence via the technique of reinterpretation. The second is the understanding of mathematical theories, and their axioms, as characterizing not a particular collection of objects, but a multiply-instantiable abstract structure. The latter innovation is not essential to the effectiveness of the re-interpretation strategy in proving consistency and independence, but it is a way of understanding mathematical theories that makes the first innovation, and hence the reinterpretation strategy, especially natural.

3. Frege—Background And Initial Differences

Frege’s view of mathematical theories is in many ways similar to the older tradition sketched above. A mathematical theory, for Frege, has a particular subject-matter: number theory is about the natural numbers; geometry is about figures in space; and so on. Frege takes it that the sentences we use in mathematics are important only because of the nonlinguistic propositions (or, as he puts it, the “thoughts”) they express. Mathematicians working in French and in German are working on the same subject because, as Frege sees it, their sentences express the same thoughts. Each thought is about a determinate subject-matter, and says something true or false about that subject-matter.[7] Thoughts are also on this view the things that logically imply or contradict one another, the things that are true or false, and the things that together constitute mathematical theories. Hence, in Frege’s view, thoughts, rather than sentences, are the items about which the questions of consistency and independence arise.

Because each thought has a determinate subject-matter, it makes no sense to talk about the “reinterpretation” of thoughts. The kind of reinterpretation that Hilbert engages in, i.e., of assigning different meanings to specific words, is something that can apply only to sentences, from the Fregean point of view. Accordingly, the first difficulty Frege notes with Hilbert’s approach is that it is not clear what Hilbert means by “axioms:” if he means the kinds of things for which issues of consistency and independence can arise, then he must be talking about thoughts, while if he means the kinds of things that are susceptible of multiple interpretations, then he must be talking about sentences.

The difficulties multiply from here. When Hilbert provides a specific reinterpretation of the geometric terms en route to proving the relative consistency of a set AX of sentences, Frege notes that we now have two different sets of thoughts in play: the set we might call “\(\textit{AX}_{G}\)” of thoughts expressed when AX’s terms take their ordinary geometric meanings (e.g., on which “point” means point) and the set we might call “\(\textit{AX}_{R}\)” of thoughts expressed when AX’s terms take the meanings assigned by Hilbert’s re-interpretation (on which, e.g., “point” means pair of real numbers). Hilbert’s reinterpretation strategy involves, from Frege’s point of view, simply shifting our attention from the set \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) of thoughts ordinarily expressed by the sentences AX (and in whose consistency we are interested) to the new set \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) of thoughts expressed by AX under the reinterpretation. And the fact that the reinterpreted sentences express truths about real numbers has little to do, from Frege’s perspective, with the consistency and independence questions that arise for the original thoughts about points, lines, and planes.

In addition to the confusing (as Frege sees it) practice of shifting back and forth between different sets of thoughts while discussing a given set of sentences, Hilbert’s procedure also involves, as Frege sees it, two further questionable aspects.

The first concerns the need for consistency proofs. On Frege’s view, the axioms of a theory always form a collection of true thoughts; and since truth implies consistency, the consistency of a collection of axioms is never in need of demonstration. For Hilbert on the other hand, the fact that a collection of sentences is taken as axiomatic is no guarantee of truth (or of truth under a given interpretation), and a demonstration of consistency is often a crucial step in establishing the mathematical respectability of that collection of axioms.

Secondly, Hilbert and Frege differ importantly over the connection between consistency and existence. Taking a theory to be axiomatized by a set of multiply-interpretable sentences, Hilbert’s view is that the consistency of such a set suffices for the existence of the (or a) collection of mathematical entities mentioned in the theory. The consistency, for example, of a theory of complex numbers is all that’s needed to justify the mathematical practice of reasoning in terms of such numbers. For Frege on the other hand, consistency can never guarantee existence. His preferred example to make this point is that the consistency (in Hilbert’s sense) of the trio of sentences

  • A is an intelligent being
  • A is omnipresent
  • A is omnipotent

is insufficient to guarantee their instantiation. (See, e.g., Frege’s letter to Hilbert of 6 January 1900; Frege [PMC]: 47.)

The central difference between Frege and Hilbert over the nature of axioms, i.e. over the question whether axioms are determinately true claims about a fixed subject-matter or reinterpretable sentences expressing multiply-instantiable conditions, is essentially the difference outlined above, between an older and a newer (ca 1900) way of thinking of mathematical theories and their axioms.[8] This issue still animates much work in the philosophy of mathematics, not just with respect to the question of how best to understand specific mathematical theories (e.g., Euclidean geometry or real analysis), but also with respect to the question whether the structuralist approach to mathematical theories requres that there be some foundational theories – whose subject matter supplies the material for interpreting the remaining theories – the axioms of which must be understood in some non-structuralist vein. See the entries on philosophy of mathematics, and set theory.

The second issue that divides Frege and Hilbert, regarding the justifiability of the inference from consistency to existence, is also still alive. While everybody (including presumably Hilbert) would agree with Frege that outside of the mathematical domain we cannot safely infer existence from consistency, the question remains whether we can (or must) do so within mathematics. The Fregean point of view is that the existence of mathematical objects can only be proven (if at all) by appeal to more fundamental principles, while the Hilbertian point of view is that in appropriate purely-mathematical cases, there is nothing more to be demonstrated, in order to establish existence, than the consistency of a theory (see entries on philosophy of mathematics and Platonism in the philosophy of mathematics).

Despite these differences, Frege and Hilbert agree that there are important mathematical questions to be asked regarding consistency and independence, and they agree that, e.g., the classic question of the independence of the parallels postulate from the remainder of Euclidean geometry is a significant one. But they disagree, as noted above, about whether Hilbert’s procedure suffices to settle these questions. We turn next to the issue of Frege’s rationale for rejecting Hilbert’s method for proving consistency and independence.

4. The Deeper Disagreement

As noted above, Frege views Hilbert’s reinterpretations as involving a shift of attention from geometric thoughts (whose consistency and independence are at issue) to thoughts of a wholly different kind, those about the background theory B (whose consistency and independence are not in question). Regarding consistency proofs, his view is that Hilbert makes an illegitimate inference from the consistency of a collection \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) of thoughts about real numbers to the consistency of a collection \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) of thoughts about geometric points, lines, and planes. Frege acknowledges that Hilbert’s set AX of sentences can be understood as providing an implicit definition of an abstract relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\), one that is satisfied by Hilbert’s constructed n-tuples, and that the consistency (i.e., satisfiability) of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) entails the consistency of that defined relation. But here too, Frege takes it that Hilbert’s crucial inference, from the consistency of the abstract relataion \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) to the consistency of the collection \(\textit{AX}_{G}\)of thoughts, is problematic. As Frege himself puts it, referring to \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) and \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) as “special geometries”, and to \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) as the “general case:”

[G]iven that the axioms in special geometries are all special cases of general axioms, one can conclude from lack of contradiction in a special geometry to lack of contradiction in the general case, but not to lack of contradiction in another special case. (Letter of January 6, 1900 in Frege [PMC]: 48)

Once he has pointed out what he takes to be the questionable inference, Frege takes it that the burden of argument is squarely with Hilbert: if Hilbert thinks that the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) follows from either the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) or from the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\), then it is up to Hilbert to show this. Frege does not go out of his way to demonstrate that the crucial inference is invalid, but seems to take his point to have been essentially made once he has pointed out the need for a justification here.

From Hilbert’s point of view, of course, there is no need for such a justification. The differences that Frege insists on over and over again between the sets of sentences (AX) and the different sets of thoughts (\(\textit{AX}_{G}\), \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) etc.) are entirely inconsequential from Hilbert’s standpoint. Because consistency as Hilbert understands it applies to the “scaffolding” of concepts and relations defined by AX when its geometric terms are taken as place-holders, the consistency he has in mind holds (to put it in terms of thoughts) of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) iff it holds of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\), since both sets of thoughts are instantiations of the same “scaffolding”. The same point can be put in terms of sentences: Frege insists that the consistency-question that arises for the sentences under their geometric interpretation is a different issue from the one that arises for those sentences under their real-number interpretation; for Hilbert on the other hand, there is just one question, and it is answered in the affirmative if there is any interpretation under which the sentences express truths. Hence while Frege takes it that Hilbert owes an explanation of the inference from the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) to that of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\), for Hilbert there is simply no inference.

Frege’s lack of clarity about his reasons for rejecting Hilbert’s procedure leaves an interpretive gap, with respect to which there is room for controversy. We should recall, to begin with, that Hilbert is clearly right that his own reinterpretation strategy suffices for the relative consistency and independence results he claims. If consistency and independence are understood, as above, in terms of non-provability, and if proof is, as Hilbert assumes, independent of the meanings of geometric terms, then \(\textit{AX}_{R}\), \(\textit{AX}_{G}\), and even AX itself are all consistent if one of them is. Frege’s rejection of Hilbert’s technique must involve, then, either some confusion about what Hilbert has established, or a different understanding of what is at issue in claims of consistency and independence.

One way to understand Frege’s contribution to the Frege-Hilbert debate, then, is to recognize the contributions Frege makes in clarifying Hilbert’s own approach to axioms, but to hold that Frege’s negative assessment of Hilbert’s technique for proving consistency and independence is mistaken. On this account, despite the difference between Frege and Hilbert over the nature of axioms, nevertheless the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) does show the consistency of the collection of axioms in question, whether one conceives of those axioms in Hilbert’s way as sentences (i.e., as the collection AX) or in Frege’s way as thoughts (i.e., as the collection \(\textit{AX}_{G}\)). Similarly for independence. Frege’s mistake, on this view, is to have failed to notice that the kind of non-provability result (i.e., consistency or independence) that Hilbert takes his reinterpretations to demonstrate for geometric sentences entails a corresponding non-provability (consistency or independence) result for geometric thoughts (see Resnik 1974, Currie 1982, Dummett 1975).

The second interpretation argues that Frege’s understanding of consistency and independence is sufficiently different from Hilbert’s that the entailment in question does not hold: that the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\), and the consequent consistency in Hilbert’s sense of AX, does not entail the consistency in Frege’s sense of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\). Similarly for independence. According to this interpretation, Frege is right to claim that Hilbert’s demonstrations fail to show consistency and independence in the sense in which he, Frege, understands these terms.[9]

The central idea of the second interpretation is that for Frege, the question whether a given thought is provable from a collection of thoughts is sensitive not just to the formal structure of the sentences used to express those thoughts, but also to the contents of the simple (e.g., geometric) terms that appear in those sentences. On this account, Frege’s understanding of provability is similar to the earlier tradition outlined above, and exemplified in Leibniz’s work. If Frege does in fact take provability to be content-sensitive in this way, then we see immediately that the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) does not entail the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\), since the question whether a contradiction is provable from \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) may turn in part on the specifically geometric parts of the thoughts in question, i.e., on the usual geometric meanings of AX’s geometric terms. To choose an illustrative example, though not one that Frege himself gives, consider the pair of sentences

  • Point B lies on a line between points A and C;
  • Point B does not lie on a line between points C and A.

This pair of sentences is demonstrably consistent in Hilbert’s sense. But on the interpretation of Frege suggested here, this consistency (in Hilbert’s sense) does not ensure that the thoughts expressed by these sentences under their ordinary interpretation form a consistent collection. If, for example, Frege understands the relation ‘between’ as susceptible to conceptual analysis in such a way that its definition underwrites the proof of a contradiction from (the thoughts expressed by) the pair of sentences, then that pair is, in Frege’s sense, inconsistent.

The idea that Frege takes provability to be sensitive to conceptual analysis in the way just suggested is taken, on this account, to be evident in the strategy Frege employs in his life-long attempt to demonstrate his logicist thesis, the thesis that the truths of arithmetic are provable from pure logic. In the course of that project, Frege regularly provides demonstrations that a given thought τ follows logically from a set T of thoughts, in a way that involves two steps. First, Frege subjects τ and/or the members of T to conceptual analysis, bringing out previously-unrecognized conceptual complexity in those thoughts. Secondly, he proves the thus-analyzed version of τ from the thus-analyzed members of T. For example, Frege takes himself to demonstrate that the thought expressed by

The sum of two multiples of a number is a multiple of that number

follows logically from the thoughts expressed by

\(\forall m\; \forall n\; \forall p((m+n)+p = m+(n+p))\)

and by

\(\forall n (n = n+0).\)

The demonstration proceeds by providing a careful analysis of the notion of “multiple of” in terms of addition, giving us in place of (i) a more-complex (i′) which is then proven from (ii) and (iii).[10] Similarly, a significant part of Frege’s logicist project consists of the careful analysis of such arithmetical notions as zero and successor, analysis which brings out previously-unnoticed complexity, and facilitates the proof of arithmetical truths. (For a discussion of the logicist project, see entries on Frege and logicism and neologicism.)

As Frege puts it in the early pages of his Foundations of Arithmetic, when we are trying to prove the truths of arithmetic from the simplest possible starting-points,

… we very soon come to propositions which cannot be proved so long as we do not succeed in analysing concepts which occur in them into simpler concepts or in reducing them to something of greater generality. (Frege 1884: §4)

In short: the components of thoughts can sometimes be analyzed in terms of simpler or more general constituents, in a way that brings to light previously-hidden relations of logical entailment. Hence when we want to know whether a given thought is logically entailed by a set of thoughts, we need to pay attention, from Frege’s point of view, not just to the overall structure exhibited by the sentences expressing those thoughts, but also to the contents of the individual terms that appear in those sentences.

The connection between this aspect of Frege’s work and his views regarding independence, on the interpretation in question, is as follows. Because we can sometimes discover that a thought τ is logically entailed by a set T of thoughts only after a careful analysis of some of the apparently-simple components of those thoughts, so too we will sometimes be able to discover that a set of thoughts is inconsistent, i.e., that it logically entails a contradiction, on the basis of such conceptual analysis. Hence the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed by a set Σ of sentences is something which turns not just on the overall structure of the sentences in Σ, but on the meanings of the terms appearing in Σ’s sentences.

To clarify this last point, let’s look at a non-mathematical example, one which neither Hilbert nor Frege explicitly dealt with. Consider the set of sentences {Jones had a nightmare, Jones didn’t have a dream}, or equivalently its first-order rendition, \(\{Nj, {{\sim}Dj}\}\). The set is clearly consistent in the sense used by Hilbert in FG; it is a straightforward matter to provide interpretations of “Jones”, “x had a nightmare” and “x had a dream” (or of “j”, “N”, and “D”) such that the sentences, so interpreted, express truths. (Consider, for example, an interpretation on which “j” is assigned the number 7, “N” the set of prime numbers, and “D” the set of numbers greater than 12.) But from the Fregean point of view, the thoughts expressed are arguably inconsistent, since part of what it is to have a nightmare is to have a dream. The inconsistency from Frege’s point of view can be demonstrated by providing an analysis of the thoughts expressed, and noting that the results of this analysis yield the set {Jones had a disturbing dream, Jones didn’t have a dream}.

For the same reason, two sets of thoughts that are structurally similar in the sense that they can be expressed, under different interpretations, by the same set of sentences, can differ with respect to Frege-consistency. As applied to the geometric context, the central idea, on this account of Frege’s objection to Hilbert, is that the kinds of re-interpretation in which Hilbert engages can take one from a consistent set of thoughts (e.g., \(\textit{AX}_{R}\)) to an inconsistent one (e.g., \(\textit{AX}_{G}\)) because of the shift in subject-matter, hence invalidating the inference from the consistency of the first to the consistency of the second. Equivalently, the inference from the consistency of the general relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) to the consistency of the set of geometric thoughts \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) is, on this understanding of Frege’s conception of consistency, invalid, since the additional geometric content involved in the latter is a potential source of inconsistency. As Frege puts it in a letter to Liebmann,

As far as the lack of contradiction and mutual independence of the axioms is concerned, Hilbert’s investigation of these questions is vitiated by the fact that the sense of the axioms is by no means securely fixed... I have reasons for believing that the mutual independence of the axioms of Euclidean geometry cannot be proved. Hilbert tries to do it by widening the area so that Euclidean geometry appears as a special case; and in this wider area he can now show lack of contradiction by examples; but only in this wider area; for from lack of contradiction in a more comprehensive area we cannot infer lack of contradiction in a narrower area; for contradictions might enter in just because of the restriction. (Letter to Liebmann 29 July 1900, in Frege [PMC]: 91)

Frege does not claim to demonstrate the existence of such latent contradictions in any specific cases. That is, he does not provide conceptual analyses which reveal inconsistencies where Hilbert claims to have shown consistency, and there is no evidence that he takes any of Hilbert’s specific consistency-claims to be false. That Frege might have had some such analyses in mind is hinted at in a letter to Hilbert in which he claims that in his own unfinished investigations into the foundations of geometry, he was able to “make do with fewer primitive terms”, which presumably means that he takes some of the terms treated as primitive by Hilbert to be susceptible of analysis via others (see the letter to Hilbert of December 27, 1899 in Frege [PMC]: 34). Any such analysis would reveal relations of logical dependence (from Frege’s point of view) where Hilbert would find independence.

Because none of Frege’s work on this topic has survived, we have no details about the specific analyses he might have given. The crucial point in Frege’s criticism of Hilbert, however, on this account, is not a disagreement about particular analyses or the consequent failure of particular consistency and independence claims, but is instead about the general methodology of consistency and independence proofs. Because for Hilbert the consistency of a set of sentences turns entirely on the overall structure they exhibit, while for Frege the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed turns additionally on the contents of the non-logical terms appearing in the sentences, on this account, Hilbert-consistency doesn’t imply Frege-consistency.

5. Lingering Issues

We have surveyed two ways of understanding Frege’s objections to Hilbert’s techniques for proving consistency and independence. The first takes Frege to be fundamentally mistaken, with the error located in his failure to appreciate the connection between the satisfiability of a set of reinterpretable sentences and the associated independence/consistency claims. The second takes Frege to be fundamentally correct in the sense that (i) he understands the consistency and independence of thoughts to turn not just on the surface syntax of the sentences that express them but also on the contents of the simple terms used in their expression, and (ii) consistency and independence, so understood, are not demonstrable in Hilbert’s manner.

Neither of these interpretive options is entirely unproblematic. An important difficulty with the first is its attribution to Frege of a severe degree of confusion about the force of Hilbert’s re-interpretations, which is arguably in some tension with the fact that, generally speaking, Frege’s account of Hilbert’s methodological procedure in FG is considerably clearer than is Hilbert’s own. A further source of difficulty is that the understanding of independence attributed on this account to Frege is in tension with the understanding of logical entailment that figures centrally in his logicist work, an understanding on which the contents of mathematical terms can be crucial to questions of logical entailment. The second interpretation, though more charitable to Frege and more in keeping with his general work in logic, arguably suffers from the lack of explicit mention by Frege of the relevance of conceptual analysis to questions of consistency and independence.

A final source of potential difficulty for any account of Frege’s views of independence and consistency is the very interesting Part (iii) of the 1906 “Foundations of Geometry” essay. The importance of that text, and the interpretive difficulties it poses, can be sketched as follows.

The 1906 “Foundations of Geometry” essay is primarily a re-statement of Frege’s earlier objections (discussed above) to Hilbert’s treatment of consistency and independence. After a rehearsal of those objections, Frege turns in Part iii to the problem of giving a positive method for proving independence. How, he asks, might one prove a given thought independent of a collection of thoughts? In answer, Frege provides a sketch of a potential method, and ends the discussion by noting that the method sketched is still incomplete, and that it faces some difficulties. Despite its obvious incompleteness, Frege never (as far as we can tell) returns to the proposal, and would seem in the end to have found it unsatisfactory. That he thought it unsatisfactory in principle is indicated by his claim four years later, in a note to Jourdain, that the unprovability of the parallels axiom cannot be proven (see Frege [PMC]: 183n). That is, he would seem in 1910 to maintain his earlier view that there is no systematic method for proving independence.[11]

The 1906 proposal itself can be outlined as follows. Suppose, says Frege, that we have a collection C of sentences each of which expresses a determinate thought, and a sentence S that similarly expresses a determinate thought. The heart of the proposed method for proving the independence of the S-thought from the C-thoughts is that we employ a mapping μ of terms to terms (and hence also of sentences to sentences) that preserves syntactic type (mapping names to names, one-place predicates to one-place predicates, etc.) and maps ’logical’ terms to themselves. Then: the S-thought is independent of the C-thoughts if μ maps S to a false sentence while mapping all the members of C to true sentences. (For discussion and development of Frege’s proposal, see Antonelli & May 2000, Eder 2016. For discussion of Frege’s reasons for rejecting the proposal, see Ricketts 1997, Eder 2013, Blanchette 2014.)

The first intriguing thing about the proposal is its striking similarity to Hilbert’s method. Assuming Frege’s language to be rich enough to include terms for all of the objects, functions and sets that Hilbert might use in reinterpretations, there will arguably be a mapping of the kind Frege describes if and only if there is a reinterpretation of the kind Hilbert uses to show (his version of) independence: where Hilbert’s reinterpretation provides a term t with new content, Frege’s method would simply map t to a new term with that very content. And this would mean that, despite all of the objections raised by Frege, Hilbert’s method would in the end suffice to demonstrate what Frege regards (in 1906) as the independence of thoughts. If this is correct, then we have reason to doubt any interpretation of Frege on which his rejection of Hilbert’s method is justified, and we have in particular a reason to reject the view that consistency and independence, for Frege, are sensitive to the contents of mathematical (e.g. geometric) terms.

The central reasons one might doubt the strong equivalence just suggested between Hilbert’s method and Frege’s proposal are (i) that it is not clear whether the class of terms Frege would count as “logical”, i.e., the class whose members μ must map to themselves, is the same as the class of terms that Hilbert would count as having a fixed interpretation; and most importantly (ii) that it is not clear just what kind of language Frege has in mind. Regarding the first: if Frege’s class of fixed terms is wider than is Hilbert’s, and/or Frege’s language lacks some of the terminology of Hilbert’s, then a demonstration of independence in Hilbert’s sense will not imply the existence of a mapping demonstrating independence in Frege’s sense. Regarding the second: the crucial question is whether terms like “number” or “between”, terms that Frege treats as susceptible to conceptual analysis, will appear in the kind of language that Frege is concerned with (as opposed, say, to requiring the language to contain only “fully-analyzed” terms), and whether such terms will be amongst those that μ maps to arbitrary new terminology. Frege himself notes the importance of the first terminological demarcation problem just raised, i.e., the problem of determining which terms are mapped to themselves, and remarks that this problem is one that would need to be addressed in order to turn his sketch into a workable strategy. Because he never answers the question of the fixed terminology or of the kind of language in question, Frege’s proposal is not sufficiently determinate for a clear comparison with Hilbert’s. We are left, then, with the interpretive issue of making sense of Frege’s proposal of a method and what appears to be his subsequent repudiation of it, while recognizing the incomplete nature of that proposal. (For further discussion of the 1906 text, see: Ricketts 1997, Tappenden 2000, Blanchette 2014.)

6. Conclusion

Because claims of consistency and of independence are fundamentally claims of non-entailment or of unprovability, it is not obvious, even once we are in possession of strong techniques for proving mathematical results, how one might go about proving consistency and independence. What Hilbert offers us, in 1899, is a systematic and powerful technique that can be used across all formalized disciplines to do just this: to prove consistency and independence. In doing so, he lays the groundwork, in concert with various of his contemporaries, for the emergence of contemporary model-theoretic techniques. (For further discussion, see Mancosu, Zach, & Badesa 2009; also see entry on nineteenth-century geometry.)

What we find through Frege’s rejection and Hilbert’s defense of that technique is a clarification of the assumptions that are essential for its success. As we have seen, the crucial feature of proof that must be assumed, in order for a Hilbert-style reinterpretation to demonstrate an unprovability result, is that provability is insensitive to the contents of those terms that Hilbert takes to be reinterpretable—in this case, the geometric terms. The alternative view of consistency and independence, on which entailment and provability are sensitive to the contents of geometric terms, is one with respect to which Hilbert-style reinterpretations cannot demonstrate consistency and independence so understood. As outlined above, the reading of Frege on which he holds such a view of consistency and independence provides a rationale for his objections to Hilbert, and an alternative account of what is at stake in claims of geometric consistency and independence.

Despite the clear failure of communication between Hilbert and Frege, their debate brings to light a number of important issues, not least of which are (i) the role of schematically-understood sentences in providing implicit definitions, which Frege articulates more clearly on Hilbert’s behalf than Hilbert had yet done, and (ii) the extent to which the logical relations are to be treated as “formal”. On this last issue, the difference between Frege and Hilbert is instructive. Long before the debate with Hilbert, Frege already held that logical rigor requires the use of formal systems of deduction, “formal” in the sense that all thoughts are expressed via precisely-determined sentences, and that all inference-rules and axioms are presented syntactically (see, e.g., Frege 1879). Most important for our purposes is the fact that Frege’s formal systems are entirely modern in the sense that the derivability in such a system of a sentence from a set of sentences turns just on the syntactic form of those sentences. The famous conceptual analyses on which much of Frege’s work turns are all provided prior to proof; it is on the basis of conceptual analyses that one arrives at the appropriate sentences to treat within the formal system, but the analyses themselves play no role within the derivations proper. Hence when it comes to the positive work of demonstrating that a given sentence is derivable from a set of sentences, Frege is just like Hilbert: meanings don’t matter. Indeed, at the time of their correspondence, Frege’s work was considerably more “formal” than Hilbert’s, since Hilbert at this time was not using an explicit syntactically-defined system of deduction.

Nevertheless, Frege’s conception of logic has the result that there is only a one-way connection between logical implication (or provability) as this holds between thoughts and formal derivability as this holds between sentences. Given a good formal system, a sentence σ is deducible from a set Σ only if the thought expressed by σ is in fact logically entailed by the thoughts expressed by the members of Σ. (This simply requires that one’s axioms and rules of inference are well-chosen.) But the converse is false: that σ is not deducible in such a system from Σ is no guarantee that the thought expressed by σ is independent of the set of thoughts expressed by the members of Σ. For it may well be, as in the cases treated explicitly by Frege’s own analyses, that further analysis of the thoughts and their components will yield a more-complex structure. When this happens, the analysis may return yet-more complex (sets of) sentences σ′ and Σ′ such that σ′ is, after all, deducible from Σ′. According to the more-charitable of the two interpretive options outlined above, this is the explanation of Frege’s rejection of Hilbert’s treatment of consistency and independence in geometry. As we might put it, because considerable logical complexity can lie undiscovered in the thoughts expressed by relatively-simple sentences, non-derivability is no guarantee of independence, in the Fregean scheme of things. There is a significant gap, as one might put it, between the logical and the formal.

For Hilbert on the other hand, at least in the context of axiomatized geometry, the logical relations simply are the formally-describable relations, since they have entirely to do with the structure exhibited by the sentences in question, or equivalently with the “scaffolding” of concepts defined by these sentences. It is because consistency in Hilbert’s sense turns just on this abstract structure, and not on the contents of the terms instantiating the structure, that the reinterpretation strategy is effective.

Hilbert is clearly the winner in this debate, in the sense that roughly his conception of consistency is what one means today by “consistency” in the context of formal theories, and a near relative of his methodology for consistency-proofs is now standard. We now routinely take consistency and independence, as Hilbert does, to hold independently of the meanings of the so-called “non-logical” terms, and hence to be straightforwardly demonstrable in essentially Hilbert’s way. This is not to say that Frege’s objections have been met, but rather that they have essentially been sidestepped via the enshrinement of the formal notion of consistency, and a lack of concern, at least under that title, with what Frege called “consistency”.


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Thanks to Edward N. Zalta for helpful suggestions on this entry.

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