Notes to Friedrich Hayek

1. As Hayek knew, principal-agent problems can and do afflict private as well as public bureaucracies. In either setting, agents gamble with other people’s money when they can, and seek a “bailout” when their gambles do not pay off. The theoretical and practical question is whether a private company’s board of directors is in a better position than taxpayers are to contain and limit the damage caused by wayward agents.

2. Although “spontaneous order and organization will always coexist, it is still not possible to mix these two principles of order in any way we like” (Hayek 1973, 48).

3. If a product is readily available on official markets, it must be because it has been over-priced by the central planner. The only exception occurs when planners are so inhumanly well-informed that they can set a price exactly where the market would set it if the planner had left it alone. A more likely result: when the official price is too high, consumers stop buying. Then producers sound the alarm: no one wants their product! Central planners respond with price supports, buying an unwanted product themselves, then giving it away at subsidized prices to citizens who decline to buy at the official price. But citizens ends up paying the official price anyway, involuntarily, in the form of taxes that underwrite the price supports. As consumers they are thwarted. As taxpayers they are impoverished (Hayek 1945, 527).

4. Although Hayek never stresses the point so far as I know, one gets the sense that he saw this learning as moral education, not only as economic education. I thank a reviewer for the thought.

5. On pareto-criteria, see Dan Hausman on Philosophy of Economics or Bruno Verbeek & Chris Morris on Game Theory and Ethics.

6. A reviewer here asks whether Hayek assumes that the point of law is to protect property rights conceived as existing prior to legislation. I am not sure. Hayek does not argue the point so far as I know. Arguing against any assumption about natural rights is the fact that his hostility toward redistribution is targeted specifically against implicit redistribution through price controls.

7. Thus Hayek would likely have accepted, and perhaps was influenced by, the analysis of James Buchanan and Gordon Tullock. Political order cannot evolve within the right kind of ecological niche, for political entrepreneurship is largely devoted to the self-interested manipulation of the shape of the niche itself. Adaptation to the niche of political entrepreneurship consists of becoming a better predator in a game where the predators make the rules. Politicians learn to cooperate, to be sure, but mainly with fellow predators. An evolving political order is increasingly dominated by corporatism (more pejoratively known as crony capitalism, where politically favored CEOs acquire the power to regulate their competitors), which is entrepreneurship of a destructive kind. Boettke 1995 articulates the theory of public choice implicit in Hayek.

8. This is not quite the broadside against political philosophy that it may appear to be (Shearmur 1996, 138).

9. Hayek simply concedes that he has little to say to end-state egalitarians other than to say they must choose between end-state equality on one hand and freedom and prosperity on the other.

10. Suppose Betty is sitting in a restaurant and has received excellent service, in a country where Betty understands that servers are working for tips. In that case, Betty ought to leave a tip because her server did what he needed to do to deserve it. We are talking about money to which Betty is uncontroversially entitled, but even so, she ought to give it to the server who deserves it. That truth about what Betty ought to do, however, does not license some merit czar to redistribute from Betty to her server. The thing about Betty’s duty to give money to which she is entitled to a server who deserves it is: it is her call, her jurisdiction. She ought to do it, but it is uniquely she who ought to do it, because it is her from whom the server deserves the recognition. Even in this case, principles hold sway not by trumping Betty’s entitlement but by presenting Betty with an imperfect duty.

11. Tebble observes that the choice between a market order and central planning is not a choice between inequality and equality but between two kinds of inequality (Tebble 2015). The difference is that under central planning, “these inequalities would be determined not by the interaction of individual skills in an impersonal process, but by the uncontradictable decision of authority” (Hayek 1976a p. 83).

12. Hayek never rejected taxes per se, so far as I know, but he did have a general concern. Taxes will be a drag on an economy to some degree, on any standard neoclassical analysis. Hayek’s biggest concern, though, is that a tax that is a political football—an unstable result of an ongoing struggle—is worse. It induces investment of precious resources in an ongoing zero-sum fight to move rates in one direction or another (a fight that is more vicious if different rates apply to different income classes). It reduces the ability of employers to make informed decisions about whether to hire. Uncertainty leads to underinvestment; in consequence, the depths of business cycles, far from being smoothed out by Keynesian fine tuning, will be deeper and longer than under a rule of law.

13. There is an alternative economic model, of course. In a Marxist model, there is a single monopsonist buyer of labor who can dictate the price of labor and drive the wage down to a subsistence level, unless labor organizes, becomes a monopoly seller of labor and thus establishes equal bargaining power with the employer.

Copyright © 2016 by
David Schmidtz <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free