Friedrich Hayek

First published Sat Sep 15, 2012; substantive revision Wed Dec 14, 2016

Friedrich Hayek was born in Vienna in 1899 into a family steeped in academic life and scientific research. He worked as a statistician from 1927–31, became a Lecturer in Economics at the University of Vienna in 1929, then moved to the University of London in 1931, the University of Chicago in 1950, and the University of Freiburg in 1962, retiring in 1967. He continued writing into the late 1980s, dying in 1992.

Hayek worked in the areas of philosophy of science, political philosophy, the free will problem, and epistemology. For all that, Hayek was more hedgehog than fox. His life’s work, for which he won a Nobel Prize in 1974, illuminated the nature and significance of spontaneous order. The concept seems simple, yet Hayek spent six decades refining his idea, evidently finding elusive the goal of being as clear about it as he aspired to be.

This essay concentrates on this enduring theme of Hayek’s work, and a question: why would the scholar who did more than anyone in the twentieth century to advance our understanding of price signals and the emergence of spontaneous orders also be driven to claim that social justice is a mirage?

1. Price Signals and Spontaneous Order

1.1 Order Can Be Undesigned

Over hundreds of millions of years, order emerged in the natural world. How? It is only human to wonder. “Design arguments” come to mind, but like most philosophers, Hayek considers such arguments fallacious as arguments that we need to posit a designer to explain the emergence of order in nature. (See the entry on teleological arguments for God’s existence.) Hayek, however, was frustrated to find the same fallacy in arguments that we need to posit a designer to explain the emergence of order in society (Hayek 1960, 59).

Just as no one had to invent natural selection, no one had to invent the process by which natural languages evolve. A language is a massively path-dependent process of unending mutual adjustment. Language evolves spontaneously. It would make no sense to call any language optimally efficient, but it does make sense to see languages as highly refined and effective adaptations to the evolving communication needs of particular populations (Hayek 1945, 528).

It would be no exaggeration to say that social theory begins with—and has an object only because of—the discovery that there exist orderly structures which are the product of the action of many men but are not the result of human design. In some fields this is now universally accepted. Although there was a time when men believed that even language and morals had been invented by some genius of the past, everybody recognizes now that they are the outcome of a process of evolution whose results nobody foresaw or designed (Hayek 1973, 37).

1.1 Order Can Be Unpredictable

Natural selection operates on mutations, making the path of natural selection unpredictable, regardless of how well we understand the underlying principles. To Hayek, social and cultural evolution are much the same: driven by innovation, fashion, and various shocks that “mutate” people’s plans in unpredictable ways with unpredictable results. The system may be more or less logical. Most things seem in retrospect to have happened for a reason. Yet, however logical the system may be, its logic does not render the system deterministic. We can make predictions in the broadest sense, such as when we say that increasing the money supply causes prices to rise, other things equal, but we have no basis for predicting the fine details. The system is technically chaotic, to such a degree that even something as straightforward as next week’s stock prices will always remain a matter of guesswork even for experts. (See the entry on chaos.)

1.3 Order Can Embody Essentially Decentralized Information

To Hayek, prices are like languages. How do we know what it will take to get our product to whomever wants or needs it most? Maybe we take bids. As we (and our rivals) take bids for x, x comes to have a price. As with language, prices enable people to form mutual expectations. Free-floating prices help people coordinate in intricate and mutually considerate ways as they individually decide what to produce or consume. To think that an authority needs to decide what the price of rice ought to be is like thinking that an authority needs to decide what sound people should make when they want to refer to rice.

It is a mundane yet intriguing fact that price signals induce people to respond to information they do not possess: such as the changing cost of drilling, or the discovery of a cheap substitute, or that political unrest has made a key input harder to acquire. Having no inkling of those variables, buyers nevertheless respond to them in a rational way, because they know the one thing they need to know: namely, the price (Hayek 1978a, 4).

Assume that somewhere in the world a new opportunity for the use of some raw material, say, tin, has arisen, or that one of the sources of supply of tin has been eliminated. It does not matter for our purpose—and it is very significant that it does not matter—which of these two causes has made tin more scarce. All that the users of tin need to know is that some of the tin they used to consume is now more profitably employed elsewhere and that, in consequence, they must economize tin (Hayek 1945, 526).

1.4 Communities Tend To Be Spontaneous Orders

What emerges from the haggling is not only a deal, but something larger: a community. There was no central decision about who should produce tin, or whether anyone should; no central decision about who should consume tin, or whether anyone should; no central decision about what should be given in return for tin. All that happened is that some people guessed that if they were to produce tin and bring it to market, it would be worth something to customers—enough to make the venture worthwhile. When some of these guesses prove correct and trades are consummated, a market in tin emerges and becomes part of what brings people together as partners in mutually beneficial ventures.

Price signals thus economize on information. In the process, they induce patterns of cooperation that involve multitudes. Cooperation evolves among people who need not share a language, need not be aware of each other’s existence, and need not be aware of their mutual dependence. They are only vaguely aware of the thousands of jobs that need doing so as to supply inputs that enable them to have a finished product to sell. Particular agents seldom if ever have more than a glimpse of the big picture, yet they manage to come together to form a community, and almost all are vastly better off as a result.

2. Progress

Technological progress extends the frontiers of the possible. To Hayek, it is the freedom of the few to do something novel that matters most, not the freedom of the many to do something familiar. Accordingly, the freedom I exercise myself often is not the freedom that has the most bearing on my future (Hayek 1960, 32). Consider that early adopters finance research that brings down production costs and thus finances a dispersion of products and services at falling prices that eventually bring late adopters like me to the market. I may never trade with early adopters, yet even so I depend on them, for they help to finance the invention and ongoing re-invention of products whose marginal cost eventually falls to a point where I can afford them.

Often, technological progress consists of innovations that lower transaction cost: steam boat, railroad, air travel, telegraph, telephone, internet, bar code reader, “apps” that make possible such businesses as Uber and AirBnB, along with innovative organizational structures and business models such as Federal Express or container ships (which, after a ten-year legal battle with trade unions, reduced from days to minutes the time that a truck’s contents would spend at the dockyard before being transferred to a ship). In many cases, the cost of transacting concerns the cost of information. As the frontier of knowledge expands, the slice that a given individual can grasp inevitably becomes a smaller part of the whole. Prices become an increasingly indispensable window to a world of tacit knowledge.

In summary, technological innovation shocks economies. Once profitable investments become relics of a bygone age and must be liquidated. Workers get laid off until they find some other way to produce goods wanted by today’s customers. Transitions are tough, miscalculations abound, but the upshot is that we grope toward heights made possible by a given innovation. Innovative ways of lowering transaction cost spread throughout a community, and failures (including once-useful but now obsolete innovations) are discarded. More precisely, failures are discarded if and when decision makers are innovators on the ground, learning to avoid losing their own money on ideas that fail to bear fruit in a given time and place.

Hayek denies that resources will ever be used at theoretical peak efficiency (1945, 527). Humans being what they are, waste is ubiquitous. Mistakes are ubiquitous. The “marvel” of markets is that people make mistakes, learn from mistakes, and avoid repeating them. By contrast, if decision makers are bureaucrats in large organizations, their focus is not on avoiding mistakes but on avoiding budget cuts. If bureaucrats acknowledge that their plan is failing, the consequences is not that they retrench and divert their own resources to better purposes but that higher administrators cut their budgets. Note: what cuts their budget is not the mistake so much as someone learning from the mistake. Bureaucratic structure makes new information a threat that needs suppressing (1944, 130).

Bureaucrats experience mistakes not as events from which they need to learn but rather as events that they need to cover up. Their mistakes are with other people’s money, so bureaucrats learn to say with a straight face, when confronted, that their budget was not large enough, or that things would have been worse without their policies.[1] They may even believe what they are saying, but they do not know and have every incentive to avoid learning.

3. Planned Orders Are Inferior

If we understand the principles that drive the logic of the system, we may be able to predict that a population of insects will evolve resistance to a pesticide. We may be able to predict that a society that declares war on drugs will lose. Beyond the question of what we can predict, then, Hayek has a further and more precise target: however much we can predict, there is a drastic limit to what we can simply decide.[2] No one can decide that people won’t respond in predictable ways to perverse incentives unintentionally created by a central plan, in the same way that no one can decide that insects will not become resistant to an insecticide.

This point, as Adam Smith observed, is not obvious. There is a class of technocrats who will not appreciate the difficulty. As Smith famously observed, and as Hayek quotes approvingly, the “man of system”

seems to imagine that he can arrange the different members of a great society with as much ease as the hand arranges the different pieces upon a chess-board. He does not consider that the pieces upon the chess-board have no other principle of motion besides that which the hand impresses upon them; but that, in the great chess-board of human society, every single piece has a principle of motion of its own, altogether different from that which the legislature might choose to impress upon it. If those two principles coincide and act in the same direction, the game of human society will go on easily and harmoniously, and is very likely to be happy and successful. If they are opposite or different, the game will go on miserably, and the society must be at all times in the highest degree of disorder (Smith 1790, 234).

The system has a logic. Planners cannot change that logic. Their main decision is whether to work with that logic or against it (which Smith regards as a choice between harmony and misery). Smith holds that planners who disregard economic logic are deciding in effect to sacrifice their “pawns,” something that a person of true benevolence would not do.

When Hayek explains the obstacle to effective central planning, his claim is not merely that information is widely dispersed and therefore hard to acquire. Rather, it is impossible to acquire (Hayek 1973, 51). When prices are set periodically by a central planner, rather than instantaneously by consumers and producers who are the first and typically the only people to have that information in reliable and timely form, prices inevitably carry less reliable, less timely information. As Hayek notes,

If we possess all the relevant information, if we can start out from a given system of preferences, and if we command complete knowledge of available means, the problem which remains is purely one of logic. That is, the answer to the question of what is the best use of our available means is implicit in our assumptions. This, however, is emphatically not the economic problem which society faces. And the economic calculus which we have developed to solve this logical problem, though an important step toward the solution of the economic problem of society, does not yet provide an answer to it. The reason for this is that the “data” from which the economic calculus starts are never for the whole society “given” to a single mind which could work out the implications and can never be so given (Hayek 1945, 519).

Soviet central planners made decisions by checking prices on international markets, but suppose there were no information about supply and demand to be had anywhere. Suppose you are a planner, but all you know is that demands are coming in for wire and for jewelry. How do you decide whether to direct factories to make wire out of copper or platinum, or whether smiths should make jewelry out of gold or silver? How do you decide who should get silver jewelry and who should get gold? How do you decide whether anyone at all should get jewelry, as opposed to reserving all such metals for use as wire?

When consumers are not paying for what they receive, their demand is effectively infinite. Inevitably, a central planner’s task eventually becomes one of cost containment. Worse yet, a planner with no measure of cost has only a limited basis for deciding what to count as containing cost. If a given ton of steel can make one car or ten refrigerators, which way of using steel is economical? How does a planner decide whether to invest in upgrading water supplies or nuclear reactors? If all you know as a producer is that people are asking for infinitely more than you can give, then eventually you turn a deaf ear, deliver your quota, and pay no attention to whether preferences are being satisfied or needs are being met.

Suppose that prices are set by planners. Hayek says with a thought more characteristic of neoclassical economists: “Only prices determined on the free market will bring it about that demand equals supply” (Hayek 1960, 63). Price controls—floors and ceilings—make buyers and sellers less able to respond to the signals they would send each other if they could raise their offer or lower their asking price. If price cannot rise, then buyers cannot signal producers that demand has increased and that producers would sell more if they were to increase supply. And if producers do not increase supply, rising demand results in shortages rather than economic growth. (See especially Zwolinski 2008 for further elaboration.)[3]

A central planner could have the world’s most powerful computer, beyond anything imagined when Hayek published “Use of Knowledge” in 1945. No computer, however, could solve the problem that Hayek was trying to articulate. The problem is not lack of processing power so much as a lack of access to the information in the first place. That much seems clear enough, but the problem has a deeper level. The problem is not merely lack of access to information; rather the information does not exist. There is no truth about what prices should be, accessible or otherwise, except to the extent that prices represent what customers are paying for a given service. That is the precise way in which prices are of service to a community (1944, 51–52).

For example, suppose that a manufacturer figures out how to make an “epipen” that can save the lives of consumers otherwise at risk of fatal allergic reaction to bee stings. Suppose the manufacturer can produce a limited supply of epipens for a little less than a hundred dollars each, and proceeds to offer them for sale for a hundred dollars. Suppose that the manufacturer finds that buyers line up by the thousands wanting to buy the pens, and suppose that there emerges a group of “scalpers” willing to stand in line for weeks, who buy all the pens for a hundred dollars each, then resell the pens for two hundred dollars, then three hundred, then four hundred, and the demand is still strong. Hayek would predict that if we let the price signals be the marvels that they are, then other producers will jump in and begin to manufacture pens for a hundred dollars each. Eventually the demand is met, and the scalpers go away. Then other producers invent a new process that enables them to produce the pens for ninety dollars, then eighty, and again the price will fall, as competition leads the price signal to track the falling cost of production. Of course, if we issue a patent or a licensing scheme or some other way of preventing rival producers from entering the market, then this will not occur. By the same token, if we impose a price ceiling of a hundred dollars, then no signal is sent to prospective rivals, unless scalpers send the signal to rivals willing to produce for the black market. Or if there is some other reason why it is impossible to increase the supply, then prices may drift up toward the limits of a customer’s willingness to pay. Barring this, there are many ways for kings, legislators, or other planners to interfere, but price signals work in a particular way if planners let it be: supply and demand tend to equilibrate, and to converge on a price in the neighborhood of the cost of production. A product tends to end up in a consumer’s hands just in case that particular consumer wants the product enough to pay what it cost to produce it.

Although computers cannot solve the problem, Hayek thought radically dispersed decision making by buyers and sellers can and does solve the problem, so far as it can be solved. Sellers who charge too much end up without customers; they learn to be more efficient or else go out of business.[4] Buyers who want x but consider it overpriced stay home for a while, waiting for the price to fall, but when they see x flying off the shelves, some of them learn something about themselves: that they would rather have the product at that price than not have it at all. To Hayek, only a price mechanism can process changing information almost instantaneously. Ironically, the most efficient thing a central planner could possibly do would be to set a price right where it would have been without the planner’s intervention.

3.1 Trucking, Bartering, Community, Esteem

Insofar as society is a cooperative venture for mutual advantage, learning to survive—not just physically but as full members of a community—will involve learning to cooperate. Learning to cooperate involves learning to become a trading partner. In other words, cooperation begins with having something to offer: a way of making people better off.

Clearly in Smith, who inspired Hayek, but also in Hayek himself, one infers that the driving motivation is not greed or even well-being so much as a propensity to truck and barter. Neither is the objective for buyers and sellers to coordinate on a price that a central planner might stumble on, but to coordinate, period. Mutually satisfying coordination, the ongoing equilibration of supply and demand, constantly evolving in response to changing conditions, is itself the achievement. There is no need for that coordination to be tracking anything beyond itself. To Hayek, the value that we hope to see realized in a marketplace is not so much that the correct volume of goods gets exchanged at the correct price. Rather, the genesis and point of the division of labor is not only a prospect of realizing gains from trade but trade per se. The valued result is buyers and sellers responding to each other, becoming more attuned to what people around them want, and helping to create a community in which their role in an important one. Thus, traders make a living while at the same time becoming worthy of their own esteem. Successful traders become esteemed and worthy of esteem because they went to market with a vision of how to make people better off. At the end of the day, they go home not only materially enriched but vindicated (Schmidtz 2016a).

Such sensitivity is good, but there is little that central planners can do to encourage it. Central planners replace what could be a complex, decentralized network of interdependence and mutual responsibility with something more like a society of spokes tethered to a central distributor at the hub but otherwise dangling. It is no substitute for real community.

3.2 Law As An Ecological Niche

In nature, for biological adaptation to culminate in better-adapted populations over time, the niche to which a population is adapting must be relatively stable. Likewise, under a rule of law, the aim of government is not to win but to provide a stable ecological niche that enables the game’s true players to evolve strategies apt for success within that niche. An elaborate crystal structure cannot form unless the medium in which crystals form is left undisturbed. Hayek’s ideal is a legal “medium” of society, liberal enough to permit creativity, stable enough to reward creativity, and constraining enough (in the right ways) to steer creativity away from zero-sum and negative-sum games and toward positive-sum games: that is, wealth creation, not wealth capture.

Here, then, in a few sentences, is one way of understanding Hayek’s point. Not everything that happens in an evolving community is foreseen or intended. Actions have more than one consequence, and more than the intended consequence. This is especially so when there is more than one decision maker. No one follows a planner’s plan simply because the planner intends that they do so. “Pawns” adjust to the planner’s plan in whatever fashion best fits their own plans, and the result is too chaotic to be safely predictable. Further, the rule of law itself is an evolving product of ongoing decision making, so it likewise takes a shape not intended by any legislator. Does this mean that every order is tautologically a spontaneous order? The answer: it is a universally true empirical generalization, not a tautology, that every social organization, even a dictatorship, is partly an ongoing product of ordering processes that are to some degree spontaneous. However, while the degree to which outcomes are unintended is a continuum, there remains a point in categorizing communities as centrally planned as opposed to spontaneous. A central plan is designed to yield an end-state. The plan aims to bring about particular outcomes—what roles people will play, what they will achieve in those roles, and what they will win by so achieving. By contrast, in what we should call spontaneous order, government provides a stable and known framework of rules (Hayek 1944, 113). Although this ideal can never be fully achieved in practice, a government under rule of law acts as referee and provider of the rule book (Hayek 1960, 114) and operates as much as possible by an ideal of “letting the players play.”

Is letting the players play good? Necessarily good? Adam Smith might have said no, as might Hayek. A praiseworthy rule of law facilitates mutually beneficial trade by internalizing externalities, by minimizing transaction cost (especially when it comes to acquiring information), by minimizing opportunities to acquire people’s goods without their consent (thereby encouraging people to trade on agreeable—thus typically beneficial—terms), and by being extremely cautious about trying to do more than that.

Hayek had no particular complaint about providing public education or the minimal elements of a welfare state, but not because such institutions are essential. Hayek would simply have said that such institutions need not devolve into central planning and thus need not be antithetical to a free society. Issuing vouchers, for example, to subsidize the purchase of epipens or education would to some extent distort markets in the subsidized products (having an inflationary impact on prices for those products) but it would not distort to the extent that price controls would.

4. Justice as Impartiality, Politics As Entrepreneurship Without Restraint

Hayek was a consequentialist of sorts, as was Adam Smith, and yet Hayek’s defense of economic freedom, like Smith’s, hints at a contractarian or deontological (and also, in Smith’s case, virtue-theoretic) moral sensibility that regards the separateness of persons as morally fundamental. Thus, for example, Hayek says, “the test of the justice of a rule is usually (since Kant) described as that of its universalizability” (Hayek 1969, 168). As John Gray sees it, Hayek commended the laws of justice “as being the indispensable condition for the promotion of the general welfare” but Hayek held, at the same time, that “an impartial concern for the general welfare is itself one of the demands of universalizability” (Gray 1984, 65).

In service of the overall project of fostering the general welfare, the point of law and legislation is to craft a framework such that a market order is a history of pareto-improving trades.[5] A primary role of law and (when necessary) legislation is to narrow people’s options so as to limit opportunities to get rich at other people’s expense.[6] So long as the rule of law can internalize external cost and thereby steer innovation in mutually beneficial rather than parasitic directions, an evolving order will be an order of rising prosperity.

By contrast, in a planned order, even astute and conscientious decisions by men of system are damaging in a particular way. Namely, as they become micro-managers, these men of system become players rather than umpires. If bureaucrats start playing the game—responding to ephemeral events with centralized fine tuning—then even if they play as cleverly as bureaucrats could possibly play, the fact remains that in consequence, the dispersed and tacit knowledge of ordinary buyers and sellers ends up on the sidelines watching. People who would have been job creators become mere spectators, hamstrung by uncertainty, waiting to see what the plan is going to be. Until they know the plan, they have no way of knowing, or even intelligently guessing, something as simple as whether their staff is too small or too large.

Government provides the framework for interaction. Ideally, as mentioned, government operates only within a stable and known framework of rules (Hayek 1944, 113). This is Hayek’s ideal of good government. Is it realistic? Could any government be expected to act as an impartial umpire? Hayek saw the rule of law as the market’s exogenous ecological niche, and thought that this niche, the rule of law, must be properly constructed if the process of spontaneous order is be a good thing. However, Hayek seemingly came to doubt there could be any such thing as properly constructed rule of law, for the following reason. Law-making is a process driven by processes more or less indistinguishable from market process except that benefits to legislators of their law-making are concentrated while costs are widely dispersed and thus only dimly understood even after the fact.[7] This is not only a moral hazard but an information problem. A piece of legislation may be thousands of pages. No one intends the bill as a whole. Indeed, there is no overall point to the bill, known or otherwise, because, prior to passage, literally no one has even read more than a few pages of it, not even the hundreds of legislators who each added a few pages of earmarks to it as the price of securing their vote.

Common law, by contrast, is a body of practice and tradition that sometimes needs to be supplemented by legislation. Crucially, however, by virtue of passing the test of time as a device for settling disputes, common law cannot be seen as mere prejudice or superstition. On the contrary, it will have a decided advantage over ongoing legislation, given that legislation is driven by untested ideas about how to respond to the crises of the day, and will be passed without anyone knowing the larger and lasting consequences. Hayek never doubted the need for legislation but lamented our propensity to be oblivious to its inevitable unintended consequences and to radically discount its inevitably unseen cost (Hayek 1973, 86).

5. Hayek Against Justice

To Hayek, it matters far more that the law be a framework for coordination than exactly what the coordination points are (Hayek 1960, 118). Hayek realizes that many coordination points have distributive implications, which leads Hayek to lament our tendency to evaluate distributions by asking whether they are just. (Yet, Hayek concedes, at least in principle, the legitimacy of a minimum income or welfare safety net of some sort. See Tebble 2015 for a sympathetic yet acute argument that this concession on Hayek’s part is a “fatal ambivalence.” In fact, Tebble argues, Hayek’s repudiation of social justice leaves no room for any such concession.)

Hayek says, “one of my chief preoccupations for more than 10 years” has been coming to terms with the idea that social justice is a mirage (Hayek 1978b, 57).[8] By social justice, Hayek seems to mean distributive justice, and more specifically what Nozick called end-state principles of distributive justice, which treat justice as a feature of outcomes rather than of procedures.

Why would justice so conceived be a mirage? Hayek says, “there can be no distributive justice where no one distributes” (Hayek 1978b, 58 or 1976, 68–69). In Hayek’s words, “considerations of justice provide no justification for ‘correcting’ the results of the market” (1969, 175). So long as traders are voluntarily making pareto-superior moves, there is nothing else that can be said or needs to be said by way of justification.

Why resist applying conceptions of justice and injustice to situations where no one distributes? What is haunting Hayek here is not the idea that one person might be more deserving than another, but that a “merit czar” might presume to correct markets that fail to give people what they deserve. Fearing the potential for tyranny, Hayek argues not that markets are just but that they are not the kind of thing that can be just or unjust. Where no one distributes, there may be something lamentable about the result, but the result will not be an injustice in the way that engineering such a result would be. Outcomes that would have been unjust if deliberately imposed (such as being born with a cleft palate) sometimes simply happen. As Rawls says, “The natural distribution is neither just nor unjust; nor is it unjust that persons are born into society at some particular position. These are simply natural facts.” Hayek would agree.

Rawls, however, immediately adds what Hayek would call a non sequitur: “What is just and unjust is the way that institutions deal with these facts” (Rawls, 1971, 102). If Rawls is right to deem the natural distribution neither just nor unjust, then when institutions “deal with natural facts,” they are not undoing wrongs. Hayek would never deny that cleft palates are bad or that fixing them is good, but would insist that fixing what is not unjust cannot count as rectifying injustice. If we feel called upon to invent something to help children with cleft palates, it will be because having a cleft palate is bad, not because having it is unjust. When we help, we are not fixing an improper distribution of cleft plates. We are simply fixing cleft palates (Schmidtz 2006, 219). The problem to which we are responding has nothing to do with envy, inequality, rights, or fair shares. The stand we take when we create a safety net is not against injustice but against suffering (Hayek 1976, 87).

If this is right, then it illuminates why Hayek’s real concern cannot be simply that there can be no injustice in a market where no one distributes. For example, suppose I accidentally destroy your car. No one distributed the damage. The situation is neither just nor unjust. Yet, if Rawls were to say that what is just or unjust is how we respond to the damage, Hayek would have to agree. Somehow, the situation is different when an accountable agent caused the damage.

Hayek seems to worry that our sense of justice can make it harder for us to live together, and make progress together. To Hayek, if people cannot claim that a starting point is unjust, then whatever we do must be justified as an improvement, not as rectification. If there is no injustice needing rectification, then the improvement we have a right to strive for is pareto-improvement, or in any case, improvement by mutually acceptable means. By contrast, if (contra Rawls) the natural distribution were unjust, that would open the field to all of the zero-sum and negative-sum moves that people feel warranted in imposing on each other under the guise of being fair. The right to make such moves with other people’s money becomes an overwhelmingly lucrative political football, luring a society’s entrepreneurial talent into politics, where instead of creating new social capital, entrepreneurs spend their time inventing clever new ways of dividing it. (Rawls could note that money being in the possession of others does not entail that the money is rightfully theirs, but Hayek is doing social science here. He would not deny the plain fact that people can and often do treat other people’s possessions as a political football, and sometimes even invent theories according to which they have a right to do so. Hayek is talking about the empirical cost of treating other people’s possessions as a political football, not the theoretical possibility.)

In Hayek’s mind, we should want from a system of justice what we want from a system of traffic management: a framework that helps us form mutual expectations about who has the right of way. An effective system of traffic management allows us simply to coordinate on a set of mutual expectations that we each find useful in helping us stay out of each other’s way as we each set a course for our individually chosen destinations. A traffic management system does not pick our destination for us. Neither does it require us to justify our destination to others. Indeed, a traffic system’s utility largely lies in people not needing to justify themselves. If we operated by end-state principles of justice (Nozick 1974), we would need to justify every move that bore on how goods would be distributed in the evolving end-state, which is to say we would need to justify virtually every trade we contemplate, which would gridlock us rather than facilitate our inventing new ways of making ourselves more valuable to the people around us.

Perhaps Hayek is overreacting here, but this (I believe) accounts for his seemingly dogmatic dismissal of end-state principles of justice. For reasons reminiscent of Nozick’s, Hayek finds such principles unaffordable, and incompatible with autonomous agents minding their own business in a free society. Indeed such principles make it impossible to say what could count as minding one’s own business. In that respect, in trying to carve out a coherent realm of individual autonomy, Hayek is, as he often claimed, paradigmatically a liberal, not conservative.

5.1 Input, Output, and What It Means To Economize

Merit, as Hayek understands it, concerns the character of the action as opposed to the nature of the achievement (Hayek 1960, 94). In other words, to Hayek, merit-claims concern the inputs one brings to a process, not the output. In Hayek’s mind, nothing good can come of that. In a free society, to Hayek, we are rewarded for our output, not our input (Hayek 1960, 98).

Hayek has an important point. His core concern is the “mirage” of thinking that justice requires rewarding people for supplying inputs rather than for supplying outputs. Yet, if it is a mirage that only inputs should be rewarded, surely it is equally a mirage that justice is only about inputs. Admittedly, if we leave customers to their own devices, output is what they will reward, which is what Hayek wants. By the same token, when people left to their own devices choose to reward us for our output, their behavior will not be insensitive to merit. The tendency of market rewards to track merit will be merely a tendency, but meritocracy being merely a tendency is not the same as meritocracy being a mirage. A key element of the success of a system in promoting prosperity will be that in rewarding excellent output, it will be rewarding the hard work, courage, alertness, and commitment that makes for excellence. It will be rewarding luck too, to be sure, but typically not sheer random fluke.[9] Hayek speaks as if merit has everything to do with trying hard, and nothing to do with excellent output, but saying it does not make it so, and there is no reason to believe it (Schmidtz 2008, 34).

Hayek says we want to economize on merit (Hayek 1960, 96). If merit were tied exclusively to supplying inputs, the Hayek would be right. But even if Hayek were right, it it is hard to see why Hayek thinks this is relevant. Consider that we economize on gold. Why? Answer: because gold is valuable. In fact, saying we economize on hard work is another way of saying hard work is important. It is not evidence that hard work is a mirage. It is not evidence that we are in the grip of a mirage when we imagine that we have reason to reward hard work that culminates in excellent output.

In sum, a merit theorist might concede to Hayek that rewards ought to track actual performance, not inner merit. Customers can judge your product’s merits without needing to know whether you were lucky. The crucial point is that wherever it is more rewarding to work hard than not, more rewarding to do excellent work than not, more rewarding to be alert to customer needs than not, a system is tending to reward the right things. In that system, output will tend to be increasingly excellent over time. Products will tend to work. People will tend to prosper, and will tend to aim at being meritorious to boot.

5.2 The Right To Distribute

As noted, Hayek’s critique of social justice is more specifically a critique of centrally planned distribution according to merit. He thinks a merit czar would be intolerable. However, the nightmarish aspect of this vision has everything to do with the idea of central planning and nothing to do with the idea of merit. Anyone who takes merit seriously agrees with Hayek that it is imperative to decentralize evaluation. If Hayek is right that there is no place for a merit czar in a good society, then, contra Hayek, the implication is not that merit does not matter but precisely that merit does matter (Hayek 1976, 64). The reason why we cannot tolerate a merit czar is that a merit czar would reward obsequiousness, not merit.

Hayek also seems to take for granted, as do many of his philosophical opponents, that, in a merit-based system, if you cannot prove you deserve G, that licenses merit czars to take it away. Or if I cannot prove that the person to whom I want to give G deserves it, then that licenses the merit czar to stop me from giving G to that person. In any case, the crucial point is that before we get to the question of whether I am giving G to the most deserving recipient, there is a prior question about whether G is mine to give. Suppose I receive excellent service at a restaurant and I judge that my server deserves $20. I cannot justify taking $20 from a patron at a neighboring table merely by explaining that my server has done something to deserve the $20. Once the $20 is mine to give, then I can ask whether my server deserves it. But the prior warrant for taking $20 from my fellow patron will be a question not of what my server has done to deserve G but of what I have done to be entitled to it. The point is crucial not because it refutes Hayek but because it reveals the exact nature of Hayek’s real concern. Hayek’s concern is not the mirage of thinking merit does matter, but the mirage of thinking entitlement doesn’t.[10]

5.3 Fair Practices

Note the similarity between Hayek’s view and the view expressed by John Rawls in “Two Concepts of Rules” (1955). Hayek and Rawls both understood what is involved in a practice having utility. To use Rawls’s example, the practice of baseball is defined by procedural rules rather than by end-state principles of distributive justice. One has to be dogmatic (Hayek would say) about how many strikes a batter should get, in order to have a practice at all.

Imagine changing the concept of the game so that the umpire’s job is to make sure the good guys win. What would that do to the players? What would become of their striving? The result of the change would not be baseball. If we end up with a game where the umpire is making sure the favored side wins, then the players are sitting on the sidelines watching, hoping to be favored. Hayek’s insight (and Rawls’s insight at that stage of his career) is that genuine fairness is not about making sure prizes are equally distributed.[11] It is not even about making sure outcomes are not unduly influenced by morally arbitrary factors such as how well the players played or how hard they worked to develop their talent. True fairness is about being impartial, nonpartisan—proverbially, “letting the players play.”

One of Hayek’s problems with the kind of justice that amounts to making sure the good guys win is that it tends to turn society’s basic structure into a political football, which tends to squander gains from trade. To Hayek, again, true justice is about letting the players play, in the same way as pareto-improving economic coordination is about letting the players play. (See also Gaus 2016.)[12]

5.4 Just Price

Whether we realize gains requires only that we trade, not that we trade at any particular price. Thus, we don’t want to focus on price when the wealth of nations has everything to do with gains from trade and nothing to do with price.

Indeed, Hayek observes, being obsessed with just price would make trading less likely, which would tend to squander some of the cooperative surplus. Much of Hayek’s aversion to justice stems from a sense that (for thousands of years) talk of justice has had a way or turning into talk of just price (Hayek 1976, 73). This makes prices appear morally important, which to Hayek is a mirage.[13] Of Adam Smith’s butchers and bakers, Hayek says,

Precisely because they were interested only in who would offer the best price for their products, they reached persons wholly unknown to them, whose standard of life they thereby enhanced much more than they could have that of their neighbors… (Hayek 1978b, 60).

Hayek’s dismissal of social justice as a mirage is a gratuitously tendentious way of packaging his actual view. However, the motive for his dismissal is understandable: namely his dread of the prospect of licensing a justice czar to intervene to make sure prices are fair, thus derailing the wealth-creating spontaneous trading of a free society within the rule of law. Paraphrasing Michael Munger (2013), the closest thing we have to an omniscient social planner are the twin forces of supply and demand, but those forces speak to people through prices. When the state makes it a crime to charge what the market will bear, the only voice that could give people reliable, timely advice is struck dumb.

For example,

If there is a shortage of refrigerants during a power failure, and if price-gougers are free to charge whatever the market will bear for ice, then people who want ice for no better reason than to chill warm beer are systematically outbid by buyers to whom the ice is worth a great deal more than that. This is a good thing. Customers who want ice to chill insulin or baby formula bid the price up to a level that secures their supply by shutting out the beer drinkers. In effect, beer-cooling two-dollar ice disappears from the market, while life-saving twelve-dollar ice remains in adequate supply. By contrast, if the price of ice is legally prevented from rising above $2, then two things happen, not one. First, as per the standard neoclassical model, ice supply falls because suppliers do not supply as much ice at a lower price. Second, there is a tragic distributive implication overlooked by the standard analysis. Namely, if prices are capped at $2, then buyers who want ice only to chill their beer are still in the market. Beer drinkers will consume some fraction of the scarce supply that a free-floating price would have reserved for insulin users who need it more. When we look at the deadweight loss triangle on the standard equilibrium model, we miss this second effect (Schmidtz 2016b offers graphical analysis as well).

The standard neoclassical model assumes that it is the lowest value buyers who are shut out by the controlled price. However, it is a robustly replicable result of classroom auction experiments that the empirical scope of the tragedy of price controls is larger than that predicted by neoclassical theory. The difference has to to with, as Hayek might have said, knowledge that is effectively embodied only in prices. In capping the price of ice at $2, we ensured that rising prices would not signal low-value consumers that new special circumstances have given them special reason to defer to high-value consumers. We intuitively endorse price controls on grounds of social justice, as if it would be unfair to let insulin users outbid beer drinkers for ice when supply runs short. But our intuition does not survive scrutiny. The canonical case for price controls applies when an economy is in some way under siege and supply is fixed (or in any case inelastic). In this strongest case for price controls, there is a distributive problem. In the abstract, we think that equal access, that is, beer drinkers ending up with an equal share of the ice, is in some way fair. That appearance of fairness is a mirage.

Hayek never doubts that we sometimes need legislation, but he thinks the aim of legislation should be to make things better, not fairer; to make things more productive, not more level; to channel innovative thinking in the direction of wealth creation, not wealth capture. Hayek in fact endorses norms of pure procedural justice, and would agree that there is such a thing, after all, as fairness. True fairness, he would say, is about letting players play on a more or less level playing field, but he would insist that this is not about making sure everyone wins their share. Hayek saw a free society as one where people are evaluated on basis of how well they perform, not how hard they try—what they produce, not what they intend.


Primary Literature: Work by Hayek

  • 1944, The Road to Serfdom, Chicago: University of Chicago Press).
  • 1945, “The Use of Knowledge in Society,” American Economic Review, 35: 519–30.
  • 1948, Individualism and Economic Order, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1958, “Freedom, Reason, and Tradition,” Ethics, 68: 229–45.
  • 1960, The Constitution of Liberty, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1969, Studies in Philosophy, Politics, and Economics, London: Routledge.
  • 1973/76/79, Law, Legislation, and Liberty, in 3 volumes, Chicago: University of Chicago Pres).
  • 1978a, “Coping with Ignorance,” Imprimis, 7: 1–6.
  • 1978b, New Studies in Philosophy, Politics, Economics, and the History of Ideas, London: Routledge.
  • 1988, The Fatal Conceit: The Errors of Socialism, W. W. Bartley III (ed.), Volume 1 of The Collected Works of F. A. Hayek, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Secondary Literature

In addition to the sources below, as a general reference, see the Review of Austrian Economics.

  • Boettke, Peter J., 1995. “Hayek’s Road to Serfdom Revisited: Government Failure in the Argument Against Socialism,” Eastern Economic Journal, 21: 7–26.
  • Buchanan, James M., and Gordon Tullock, 1962. A Calculus of Consent, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Burczak, Theodore, 2009. Socialism After Hayek, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Caldwell, Bruce J., 2004. Hayek’s Challenge: An Intellectual Biography of F.A. Hayek, University of Chicago Press.
  • Critical Review, 1997. Special Issue on F. A. Hayek, 11: 1.
  • Feinberg, Joel, 1970. Doing & Deserving, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Feser, Edward (ed.), 2006. The Cambridge Companion to Hayek, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gaus, Gerald, 2007. “Social Complexity and Evolved Moral Principles,” in Liberalism, Conservatism, and Hayek’s Idea of Spontaneous Order, Peter McNamara (ed.), London: Palgrave Macmillan, 149–76.
  • Gaus, Gerald, 2016. The Tyranny of the Ideal: Justice In a Diverse Society, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Gray, John, 1984. Hayek on Liberty, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Hoy, Calvin, 1984. A Philosophy of Individual Freedom, Westport: Greenwood.
  • Machlup, Fritz (ed.), 1976. Essays on Hayek, Hillsdale: Hillsdale College Press.
  • Munger, Michael, 2013. “They Clapped: Can Price-Gouging Laws Prohibit Scarcity?” See below, under "Other Internet Resources"
  • Nozick, Robert, 1974. Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York: Belknap.
  • Pennington, Mark, 2011. Robust Political Economy, Northampton, MA: Edward Elgar.
  • Rawls, John, 1955. “Two Concepts of Rules,” The Philosophical Review, 64: 3–32.
  • –––, 1971. A Theory of Justice, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Schmidtz, David, 2006. Elements of Justice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2008. Person, Polis, Planet, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016a. “Adam Smith’s Theory of Freedom,” in Adam Smith: A Princeton Guide, Ryan Hanley (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2016b. “Are Price Controls Fair?” Supreme Court Economic Review, 23: 221–33. See entry at
  • Shearmur, Jeremy, 1996. Hayek and After: Hayekian Liberalism as a Research Programme, London: Routledge.
  • Smith, Adam, 1790. Theory of Moral Sentiments, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1984.
  • Tebble, Adam, 2015. Epistemic Liberalism: a Defense, London: Routledge
  • Zwolinski, Matt, 2008. “The Ethics of Price-Gouging,” Business Ethics Quarterly, 18: 347–78.

Other Internet Resources


I thank Pete Boettke, Mark Budolfson, Suzi Dovi, David Friedman, Jerry Gaus, Michael Gill, Pete Leeson, Elijah Millgram, Dan Russell, Jeremy Shearmur, Ionut Sterpan, Virgil Storr, Adam Tebble, John Thrasher, and audiences at the Southern Economic Association, George Mason University’s Political Economy seminar, Bucharest School of Social Science and Philosophy, the Asan Institute in Seoul, and the Arizona Freedom Center for their encouragement and advice. My work on this revision was supported by a grant from the John Templeton Foundation. Opinions expressed here do not necessarily reflect the views of the Templeton Foundation. Thanks also to the Georgetown Institute for the Study of Markets and Ethics at Georgetown’s McDonough School of Business for their generous support in the fall of 2016.

Copyright © 2016 by
David Schmidtz <>

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