Perhaps no other medieval Jewish philosopher has been so maligned over the centuries as Gersonides (Levi ben Gerson, acronym Ralbag). Indeed, his major philosophical work, Sefer Milhamot Ha-Shem (The War of the Lord, 1329), was called “Wars against the Lord” by one of his opponents. Despite the vilification of his position, Gersonides emerges as one of the most significant and comprehensive thinkers in the medieval Jewish tradition. He has been constantly quoted (even if only to be criticized), and, through the works of Hasdai Crescas and others, Gersonides’ ideas have influenced such thinkers as Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz and Benedict de Spinoza. This article will survey his major contributions to medieval philosophy.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Biography
- 3. Major Works
- 4. Major Themes in Milhamot Ha-shem
- 5. Gersonides’ Astrological Determinism
- 6. Ethical Views
- 7. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In the introduction to his recently completed translation of Wars of the Lord, Feldman suggests that the significance of Gersonides lies in his emphasis upon “religious rationalism in Judaism.” According to Feldman, we see a man who “has taken seriously the fact that he has reason, who believes that this faculty is God-given, and who attempts to understand God with this instrument” (Wars, p. 52). Gersonides is the philosopher who attempted to show that philosophy and Torah, that reason and revelation are co-extensive; he is a philosophical optimist who believes that reason was fully competent to attain all the important and essential truths. Thus, according to Feldman, Gersonides is “a most vigorous and consistent defender of human reason in religion”(Wars, p. 53).
This trust is reflected in Gersonides’ introductory remarks to Wars. There, Gersonides upholds the primacy of reason, attributing to Maimonides the position that “we must believe what reason has determined to be true. If the literal sense of the Torah differs from reason, it is necessary to interpret those passages in accordance with the demands of reason” (Wars, p. 98). Gersonides believes that reason and Torah cannot be in opposition: “if reason causes to affirm doctrines that are incompatible with the literal sense of Scripture, we are not prohibited by the Torah to pronounce the truth on these matters, for reason is not incompatible with the true understanding of the Torah” (ibid.). Thus reason is upheld as a criterion for achieving truth.
Gersonides left few letters and does not talk about himself in his writings; nor is his life discussed at great length by his contemporaries. Hence, what is known of his biography is sketchy at best. Levi ben Gerson was born in 1288 in Provence and may have lived for a time in Bagnol sur-Ceze. It is probable that his father was Gershom ben Salomon de Beziers, a notable mentioned in medieval histories. With the decline of Spanish Judaism in the thirteenth century, Provence quickly became the cultural center for Jewish intellectual activity. The popes in Avignon had a lenient policy toward the Jews, whose creative life flourished, particularly in philosophy and theology. Jewish philosophers did not have direct access to the works of Aristotle, but Provençal Jews learned of Aristotle through the commentaries of Averroes, the twelfth-century Spanish Muslim philosopher. By the end of the thirteenth century these commentaries had been translated from Arabic into Hebrew, and Averroes’ thought, as well as that of Aristotle, was being integrated into the mainstream of Jewish philosophy.
Gersonides may have married a distant cousin; it is not known whether he had any offspring. Although Gersonides spoke Provençal, his works are all written in Hebrew, and all of his quotations from Averroes, Aristotle, and Moses Maimonides are in Hebrew as well. He may have had a reading knowledge of Latin; he appears to manifest an awareness of contemporary Scholastic discussions. He might, however, have learned of such discussions in oral conversations with his Christian contemporaries. Apart from several trips to Avignon, Gersonides most likely resided his entire life in Orange. There is some evidence that he may have followed the traditional occupation of his family, moneylending. He died on 20 April 1344.
In addition to Averroes and Aristotle, Gersonides was influenced by Moses Maimonides, his greatest Jewish philosophical predecessor. Gersonides’ works can be seen as an attempt to integrate the teachings of Aristotle, as mediated through Averroes and Maimonides, with those of Judaism. In Milhamot Ha-Shem he laid down the general rule that “the Law cannot prevent us from considering to be true that which our reason urges us to believe.” His adherence to this principle is reflected throughout his work.
In her recent study of Gersonides’ science, Glasner notes that Gersonides “stands out as one of the more creative and daring figures in the medieval west” (Glasner 2015, p. 13). What distinguished Gersonides from his predecessors was his reliance upon and consummate knowledge of mathematics, coupled with his belief in the accuracy of observations achieved by the use of good instruments. Because of this rootedness in empirical observation bolstered by mathematics, Gersonides believed that he had the tools to succeed where others had failed. Only when he has resolved the problems in astronomy does Gersonides apply their findings to theological cosmology. As we shall see, Gersonides’ theology and astronomy are deeply involved with each other.
This realist stance is stated in the context of examining al-Bitruji’s astronomical proposals. Gersonides’ contention is that “no argument can nullify the reality that is perceived by the senses, for true opinion must follow reality but reality need not conform to opinion” (Goldstein 1974, p. 24). That Gersonides clearly considered his own observations to be the ultimate test of his system is explicit from his attitude towards Ptolemy. The importance of empirical observation cannot be underestimated, he claims, and he values his own observations over those of others. “We did not find among our predecessors from Ptolemy to the present day observations that are helpful for this investigation except our own” (Wars, V.1.3, p. 27), he says in describing his method of collecting astronomical data. Often his observations do not agree with those of Ptolemy, and in those cases he tells us explicitly that he prefers his own. Gersonides lists the many inaccuracies he has found trying to follow Ptolemy’s calculations. Having investigated the positions of the planets, for example, Gersonides encountered “confusion and disorder” which led him to deny several of Ptolemy’s planetary principles (Goldstein 1988, p. 386). He does warn his colleagues, however, to dissent from Ptolemy only after great diligence and scrutiny. Both John Buridan and Gersonides took the first steps in the 14th century toward a principle of inertia; in the words of Touati, Gersonides was the first to “have a presentiment of the principle of inertia” (see Touati 1973, pp. 103, 311). Glasner supports Touati’s contention, claiming that “Gersonides had a rudimentary, not yet correct, but insightful understanding of the concept of inertial motion.” Gersonides was aware of its significance and used it in order to lay the basis for a new physics, an alternative to that of Aristotle. (see Glasner 2015, p 36) He did not rely on a theory of impetus [as did Buridan], which turned out to be an advantage.
Gersonides’ scientific works comprise mathematics and astronomy. His Sefer Ma’aseh Hoshev (The Work of a Counter, 1321) is concerned with arithmetical operations and uses of a symbolic notation for numerical variables. Gersonides’ major scientific contributions were in astronomy; his works were known by his contemporaries and influenced later astronomers. His astronomical writings are contained primarily in book 5, part 1 of Milhamot Ha-Shem. In 136 chapters Gersonides reviews and criticizes astronomical theories of the day, compiles astronomical tables, and describes one of his astronomical inventions. This instrument, which he called Megalle ‘amuqqot (Revealer of Profundities) and which was called Bacullus Jacobi (Jacob’s staff) by his Christian contemporaries, was used to measure the heights of stars above the horizon. The astronomical parts of Milhamot Ha-Shem were translated into Latin during Gersonides’ lifetime. One of the craters of the moon, Rabbi Levi, is named after him.
Gersonides was well known as a Halakhist, one who deals with the intricacies of Jewish law. From this respect, his greatest contribution to Judaica was in the area of biblical commentary. His commentary on the Book of Job, completed in 1325, proved to be one of his most popular works and was one of the earliest Hebrew books to be published (in Ferrara, 1477). The commentary, which complements book 4 of Milhamot Ha-Shem, is concerned with the problem of divine providence. Each of the characters in the Book of Job represents a different theory of divine providence; Gersonides’ own position is a restatement of Elihu’s theory that providence is not directed to particulars but rather to groups of individuals, or universals.
Gersonides also wrote a logical treatise, Sefer Ha-heqesh Ha-yashar (On Valid Syllogisms, 1319), in which he examines problems associated with Aristotle’s modal logic as developed in the Prior Analytics. This treatise was translated into Latin at an early date, although Gersonides’ name was not attached to it.
Gersonides’ major philosophical work, Milhamot Ha-Shem, was completed in 1329; it had been twelve years in the making. In 1317 Gersonides began an essay on the problem of creation. This problem, which has vexed Jewish philosophers since Philo Judaeus, had recently received elaborate treatment by Maimonides. Gersonides was dissatisfied with Maimonides’ discussion and proposed to reopen the issue. This project was soon laid aside, however, for he felt that it could not be adequately discussed without proper grounding in the issues of time, motion, and the infinite. By 1325 his manuscript had developed to include discussion not only of creation but also of immortality, divination, and prophecy. By 1328 it included a chapter on providence as well. Books 5 and 6 were completed, by Gersonides’ own dating, by 1329.
As Isaac Husik has pointed out, Gersonides “has no use for rhetorical flourishes and figures of speech … the effect upon the reader is monotonous and wearisome.” His style has been compared to that of Thomas Aquinas and even of Aristotle in its use of a precise, technical vocabulary which eschews examples. In contradistinction to Maimonides, who introduced allegory, metaphor, and imprecise language into his work to convey the ambiguity of the subject matter, Gersonides saw it as his function to elucidate the issues as clearly as possible. Gersonides is the first Jewish philosopher to use this analytic, scholastic method.
In the introduction to Milhamot, Gersonides specifies six questions which he hopes to examine: Is the rational soul immortal? What is the nature of prophecy? Does God know particulars? Does divine providence extend to individuals? What is the nature of astronomical bodies? Is the universe eternal or created? Each question occupies a separate book. Gersonides attempts to reconcile traditional Jewish beliefs with what he feels are the strongest points in Aristotle’s philosophy. Although a synthesis of these systems is his ultimate goal, philosophy often wins out at the expense of theology.
Gersonides’ attitude toward previous astronomers, coupled with his faith in human reason, are reflected in his discussion of creation. Maimonides went to great lengths to maintain that the topic of creation is beyond rational demonstration. Gersonides, on the other hand, devotes many chapters in Milhamot VI to proving that the Platonic theory of creation out of an eternal formless matter is rationally demonstrable. The question of whether the universe was created or had existed from eternity had been treated by Maimonides in an ambiguous manner; scholars still disagree over whether Maimonides ultimately upheld an Aristotelian, Platonic, or scriptural doctrine of creation. Gersonides’ position is unambiguously Platonic. Gersonides argues that the world was created outside of time by a freely willing agent. He must then decide whether the world was engendered ex nihilo or out of a preexistent matter. Arguing that ex nihilo creation is incompatible with physical reality, he adopts a model drawn from Plato’s Timaeus. Gersonides interprets the opening of Genesis to refer to two types of matter. Geshem is the primordial matter out of which the universe was created; not capable of motion or rest, it was characterized by negation and was inert and chaotic. This matter is identified with the primeval waters described in Genesis. Homer is prime matter, in the Aristotelian sense of a substratum always aligned with form. It contains within itself the potentiality to receive forms but is not an ontologically independent entity. Gersonides compares this matter to darkness: just as darkness is the absence of light, this matter represents the absence of form or shape. As noted by Glasner (2015) and Freudenthal (1987), this notion of a body that does not preserve its shape offered several important advantages. First, the space between the spheres, which is subject to continuous change, is filled by the body that does not preserve its shape, and so transmission can be explained by contact. Second, in the context of his theory of creation, this amorphous body is a remnant of the pre-existent entity (thou va-vohu) from which God shaped the world. On this basis Gersonides argues that the world was created out of an eternally preexistent matter.
Gersonides’ cosmology forms the backdrop of the other books of Milhamot. His predecessor Maimonides had claimed that no valid inference can be drawn from the nature of the sublunar sphere to that of the superlunar sphere. Gersonides, however, rejects the metaphysical bite to the distinction, and argues that inasmuch as both spheres contain material elements, what we know about creation is based on astronomy, and astronomy is fundamentally no different a human science than physics. Astronomy can only be pursued as a science by “one who is both a mathematician and a natural philosopher, for he can be aided by both of these sciences and take from them whatever is needed to perfect his work” (Wars, V.1.1, p. 23). Gersonides sees the ultimate function of astronomy to understand God. Astronomy, he tells us, is instructive not only by virtue of its exalted subject matter, but also because of its utility in the other sciences. By studying the orbs and stars, we are led ineluctably to a fuller knowledge and appreciation of God. Astronomy thus functions as the underpinning of the rest of the work.
Gersonides’ discussion of immortality of the soul in book 1 must be understood against the backdrop of a notoriously difficult passage in Aristotle’s On the Soul, book 3, chapter 5 (430a22–25). In this passage Aristotle seems to postulate the existence of an active intellect which is separable from the passive intellect and which is primarily responsible for the intellectual activities of the human soul. But what is the relation between the active and passive intellects, and which, if either, is immortal? Gersonides states and rejects three positions that elucidate a version of the unity of intellect. The import of Gersonides’ critique of his predecessors can be reduced to three main issues. From a theological perspective, it is clear that the doctrine of unity of intellect threatens the notion of personal immortality. For if all humans share the same intellect, then upon physical death, all that remains of the person is an unindividualized intellect. Epistemologically, the doctrine is unable to account for how it is that two (or more) knowers can entertain contrary items of knowledge; or, more stringently, how one person can be mistaken about something another person knows. And from a metaphysical perspective, the main problem is how to individuate this separate intellect when it is manifested in many individuals: for if it is individuated materially on the basis that individual bodies differ, then the substance is no longer incorporeal or separate. As Feldman has pointed out, on this theory an incorporeal substance is either a unique member of a species or is not a member of a species at all (Wars, I.4, p. 79).
Gersonides avoids these untoward consequences by adopting the position of Alexander of Aphrodisias. Gersonides agrees with Alexander of Aphrodisias that immortality consists in the intellectual perfection of the material intellect. He disagrees with Alexander, however, over the precise nature of this intellectual attainment. For Alexander (according to Gersonides) had claimed that immortality is achieved when the intellect acquires knowledge of the Agent Intellect (hence the term “acquired intellect” is introduced). Immortality is thus understood by Alexander to be a form of conjunction between the Agent and acquired intellects. “They [the followers of Alexander] maintain that the material intellect is capable of immortality and subsistence when it reaches that level of perfection where the objects of knowledge that it apprehends are themselves intellects, in particular the Agent Intellect…[material intellect] is immortal when it is united with the Agent Intellect” (Wars, I.8, p. 170).
Gersonides rejects this notion of conjunction, however, and replaces it with a model of immortality according to which it is the content of knowledge of the acquired intellect that matters. When the content of the acquired intellect mirrors the rational ordering of the Agent Intellect, immortality is achieved. What is the content of this knowledge? The Agent Intellect must possess complete knowledge of the sublunary world; that is, it “contains a conception of the rational order obtaining in all individuals” (Wars, I.4, p. 136). The anti-Platonic tenor of this position is emphasized when Gersonides describes in more detail what it is that the Agent Intellect knows. For according to Gersonides, the knowledge of the Agent Intellect must be grounded in the domain of particulars. Thus Gersonides’ position avoids the epistemological difficulties apparent in a realist ontology. Inasmuch as the material intellect reflects the knowledge inherent in the Agent Intellect, and inasmuch as this knowledge is grounded in particulars, it follows that humans can have knowledge of particulars; in this acquisition of knowledge lies immortality.
Books 2 to 4 focus on the relation between God and the world. The general problem is whether God’s knowledge is limited to necessary states of affairs or extends to the domain of contingency as well. If the former, then God could not be said to have knowledge of humans, and so divine providence would not be efficacious. But if God does know contingents—in particular, future contingent events—then it would appear that human freedom is curtailed by God’s prior knowledge of human actions. The problem of the apparent conflict between divine omniscience and human freedom was discussed by many medieval philosophers. Gersonides does not follow the majority opinion on this issue: rather than claim that God does know particulars and that this knowledge somehow does not affect human freedom, Gersonides argues that God knows particulars only in a certain sense. In an apparent attempt to mediate between the view of Aristotle, who said that God does not know particulars, and that of Maimonides, who said that he does, Gersonides holds that God knows particulars only insofar as they are ordered. That is, God knows that certain states of affairs are particular, but he does not know in what their particularity consists. God knows individual persons, for example, only through knowing the species humanity.
Whereas Maimonides claimed that God’s knowledge does not render the objects of his knowledge necessary, Gersonides maintains that divine knowledge precludes contingency. To retain the domain of contingency, he adopts the one option open to him: namely, that God does not have prior knowledge of future contingents. According to Gersonides, God knows that certain states of affairs may or may not be actualized. But insofar as they are contingent states, he does not know which of the alternatives will be the case. For if God did know future contingents prior to their actualization, there could be no contingency in the world.
In book 2, in an attempt to explain how prophecies are possible in a system which denies the possibility of knowledge of future contingents, Gersonides claims that the prophet does not receive knowledge of particular future events; rather his knowledge is of a general form, and he must instantiate this knowledge with particular facts. What distinguishes prophets from ordinary persons is that the former are more attuned to receive these universal messages and are in a position to apply them to particular circumstances.
A further dilemma surrounds the doctrine of divine providence. If God does not have knowledge of future contingents, how can he be said to bestow providence on his creatures? This problem is discussed by Gersonides both in his commentary on Job and in book 4 of Milhamot. In both texts he argues that providence is general in nature; it primarily appertains to species and only incidentally to particulars of the species. God, for example, does not know the particular individual Levi ben Gerson and does not bestow particular providence on him. Rather, inasmuch as Levi ben Gerson is a member of the species humanity and the species philosopher, he is in a position to receive the providential care accorded to those groups.
For Gersonides, the issues of prophecy, omniscience and providence are developed against the backdrop of astrological determinism. Like many thinkers of the late Middle Ages, Gersonides had to confront two opposing sets of traditions: on the one hand, attacks by religious authorities (e.g. Augustine’s attack in City of God; Maimonides’ letters) on the grounds that astrology compromised human free will; on the other hand, the wide scale acceptance of astrology from the 12th century on. In the 12th and 13th centuries, most Jewish and Christian philosophers supported natural astrology, the view that the celestial bodies affect sublunar life and existence to some extent at least. That the sun and moon both affect natural cycles and events on earth is unequivocal and represents a classic paradigm of natural astrology. The calculations of natural astrology overlapped those of astronomy, and could be utilized for practical purposes such as fixing the calendar. According to astrologers, each planet and sign of the zodiac has its own character, power and attributes. Inasmuch as the characters of the planets and the signs of the zodiac are opposed to each other, they are engaged in a perpetual power struggle. Thus the position of the planets and their interrelation with the signs of the zodiac, regulate the fate of both individuals and nations. Astrological predictions could apply, then to both individuals as well as to the history of Israel and its place in universal history.
An attack upon astrology as a whole belonged to a much larger conflict, that between the roles of reason and faith. Thus, astrology should not be situated within the context of magic or the occult, but rather should be construed as a robust contender to science. Based on a precise scientific astronomy, astrology was a science accepted from the second to the seventeenth centuries. On the scientific level it prevailed almost uncontested until and including Newton.
Even a summary reading of Gersonides’ major philosophical work evinces an explicit “belief in” astrology. Gersonides develops his astral determinism in two contexts: in book II of Wars he interweaves astrological motifs into his discussion of divine providence and prophecy, while in Book V astrology occupies a central role in the context of his cosmological speculations. His major concern is the extent to which the stars and planets exerted an influence over human events in general, or more particularly, over those actions that entail human choice. Judicial astrology was based on the assumption that the entire world of nature was governed and directed by the movement of the heavens and the celestial bodies, and that man, as an animal naturally generated and living in the world of nature, was also naturally under their rule.
Langermann emphasizes the teleological nature of astrology for Gersonides, its chief merit being its ability to provide “teleological explanations for the wide variety of stellar motions that are observed to take place” (Wars, Vol III, p. 506). This teleology is reflected in V.2 ch 7–9 where, after listing 27 problems raised by the heavenly bodies, Gersonides suggests that only astrological considerations can furnish satisfactory replies; it is astrology alone that can explain the connection between the two realms. It is worth noting that on this point, Gersonides disagrees with Maimonides over the ultimate purpose of the celestial bodies. For Maimonides it is not possible that a greater entity, the heavens, would exist for the sake of the sublunar universe. Gersonides disagrees, maintaining that it is not inappropriate that the more noble exist for the less noble. The stars, he argues, exist for the sake of things in the sublunar world (Wars, V.2.3, p. 194). More explicitly, the heavenly bodies are designed for the benefit of sublunar existence, and they guarantee the perpetuation of life on earth.
This teleology is spelled out in Milhamot II, in which Gersonides is concerned to explain how divine knowledge operates, and to what extent divine foreknowledge of future contingents affects human choice. His major thesis is that divine knowledge is predicated to a great extent upon knowledge of the heavenly bodies, which bodies are in turn “systematically directed toward his [man’s] preservation and guidance so that all his activities and thoughts are ordered by them” (Wars, II.2, p. 33). In support of this teleological cosmology, Gersonides presents an extensive argument to the effect that the celestial bodies have a purpose. On the basis of this argument Gersonides concludes that from the perspective of the teleological structure of the universe, we can understand why the heavenly bodies behave the way they do. This teleology is reflected by a “law, order and rightness” in the universe, implying the existence of an intellect that orders the nature of things: “you see that the domain of the spheres provides, in the best way possible, for the sub-lunar world” (Wars, V.2.5, p. 137).
As we have seen, the existence of a connection between celestial and terrestrial events was admitted by most everybody, but not everybody agreed on the nature of this connection. Gersonides as well must account for the type of relation obtaining between celestial and terrestrial events. Having articulated the ordering power of the astral bodies, Gersonides describes in Milhamot V.3 the separate intellects and the spheres that they move. The main characteristic of the astral bodies is their luminosity (nitzutz). This luminosity affects their actions and effects (Wars, V.2.3, p. 137). Gersonides is very much aware of the problem of accounting for how the astral bodies can affect actions at a distance. The sun, for example, functions as a paradigm for action at a distance. Once we understand, Gersonides claims, how the activity of heating reaches earth from the sun, we can understand how the particular activities of the other stars reach the sublunar realm as well. By explaining the efficient cause as the light or radiation of the stars, Gersonides can account for weak or strong effects. As Langermann has pointed out, Gersonides’ account furnishes the basis for the introduction of astrological causation into natural philosophy.
In Milhamot V.2.8 Gersonides lays out six astrological principles that affect his general cosmological scheme. These can be summarized as follows. First, each astral body exercises a different influence specific to it. Second, astral influence depends upon its position in the zodiac (galgal hamazalot). Third, the longer a star stays in one place in the zodiac, the greater its effect because of the strength of its luminosity. Fourth, astral influence is dependent upon its inclination to the north or to the south; its effect will be strongest when it is in the middle, as evidenced by the sun, whose heat is strongest when it is at the Tropic of Cancer as opposed to being at the Tropic of Capricorn. Fifth, the greater the radiation or luminosity of a star, the stronger its influence. And finally, the closer to earth a star is, the stronger will be its influence (Wars, V.2.8, p. 207–8). These principles function as the underpinnings of his general astronomy as well.
In light of the original problems posed by astrology above, let me propose that the most important piece of Levi’s astrology is what Langermann calls the variety of the heavens (ribbui hayahasim). Gersonides must be able to account for individual variety in the sublunar realm. Inasmuch as stellar radiation is the means by which stellar influences are conveyed, the wide variety of mixtures of stellar radiation guarantees a sufficient variety of “influences” on terrestrial processes. The movers emanate from God who is construed as the “First Separate Intellect” (Wars, V.3.8, p. 272). They are ordered in a rational system that governs the sublunar domain. If there were no one first intellect, Gersonides argues, the rational order we see in the heavens would be the result of chance, which is unacceptable. The agent intellect thus functions as the link between these celestial bodies and human affairs. The kinds of information it transmits are of an astronomical type, as evidenced in the following example: “it [the agent intellect] knows how many revolutions of the sun, or of the diurnal sphere, or of any other sphere [have transpired] from the time at which someone, who falls under a particular pattern, had a particular level of good or ill fortune…” (Wars, II.6, p. 64). The agent intellect serves as the repository of information communicated by the heavenly bodies. The patterns revealed in this communication between agent intellect and diviner (astrologer, prophet) are from the heavenly bodies which themselves are endowed with intellects and so “apprehend the pattern that derives from them.” Each mover apprehends the order deriving from the heavenly body it moves, and not patterns that emanate from other heavenly bodies. As a result, the imaginative faculty receives the “pattern inherent in the intellects of the heavenly bodies from the influence deriving from them.” This influence derives from the position of the heavenly bodies “by the ascendent degree or the dominant planet [in a particular zodiacal position]” (Wars, II.6, p. 64). However, inasmuch as the heavenly bodies do not jointly cooperate with one another (lo yishtatfu) in this process, it is possible for the communication to be misconstrued.
Of course, as we all know, astrologers often err in their predictions. Astrological errors can be due to several factors. In general, Gersonides claims, we know very little of the order of the heavenly bodies. “In general, it is impossible for man to know the [complete] truth of the order of the sublunar world. This is nicely illustrated in astrology, where frequently false predictions are made. All the more so is it impossible for man to know the general order of the sublunar world by means of its causes so that his knowledge would be perfect” (Wars, I.12, p. 219). In some cases, the information is not transmitted clearly. Why is it that certain communications are received more clearly than others? A constitutionally perfect imaginative faculty receives information from both dominant and weak heavenly bodies. By ‘weak’, Gersonides means that certain celestial bodies are too weak both to bring about events on earth as well as to transmit information about these events. Hence he concludes that information about the future emanates “from the dominant body in the particular proper face (panim) in which it has dominance but not from any of the attending planets (ha-meshartim)” (Wars, II.7, pp. 69–70). But to constitutionally imperfect imaginative faculties, the information received is only from the dominant heavenly bodies. Hence the overall quality of the information received will differ in the two cases. More specifically, because of the difficulty of obtaining the necessary positions of these bodies by observation, astrologers are often unable to verify their data. Furthermore, since the zodiacal position of a heavenly body at any given time is only repeated once in many thousands of years, astrologers have no access to the repeatability of those events that would be required to verify their knowledge. Furthermore, humans simply do not have sufficient knowledge about the heavenly bodies.
The final cause for error has to do with human free will: as we have seen above, our intellect and choice “have the power to move us contrary to that which is determined by the heavenly bodies” (Wars, II.2, p. 34). Although he admits that on occasion human choice is able to contravene the celestial bodies, nevertheless this intervention is rare, and true contingency is a rare state of affairs indeed in Gersonides’ ontology. Gersonides presents an argument to show that human choice guided by reason can subvert the celestial bodies despite their general ordering of our lives. The heavenly bodies can order human affairs either by virtue of their difference of position in the heavens, or from the difference of the bodies among themselves. Astral bodies, however, will affect different individuals in different ways; they can also affect an individual differently at different times; and finally, two or more bodies can affect a single individual, resulting in multiple influences that can have contrary effects, echoing the scholastic phrase, “sapiens dominabitur astris [the wise man will be ruled by the stars]”. Gersonides notes that humans can contravene these effects: God has provided humans with “the intellectual capacity (sekhel ba’al takhlit) that enables us both to act contrary to what has been ordered by the heavenly bodies and to correct, as far as possible, the [astrally ordained] misfortunes that befall us” (Wars, II.2, p. 35). Nevertheless, he assures us that whatever happens by chance is “determined and ordered according to this type of determinateness and order” (Wars, II.2, p. 34). Outdoing even Plato’s hierarchical structuring in Republic IV, Gersonides argues that the ultimate perfection and ordering of society is due to astrological influence.
The commensurability of the motion of heavenly bodies raises an additional concern, having to do with the uniqueness of individual beings and the doctrine of eternal return. Gersonides’ immediate 13th century predecessors Shem-Tov ibn Falaquera and Judah ben Solomon ha-Cohen discussed this issue against the backdrop of Aristotle’s Gen. Animalia. In Gen. Animalia, Aristotle had established a connection between the life spans and gestations periods of animals and the revolutions of the sun and moon (Gen. Anim., IV.10, 777b17–778a10). Thus the revolutions of the sun measure not only time but also produce the alternating periods of growth and decay. Eschatological predictions are thus tied to the cyclicity of the heavenly bodies. Gersonides did not [to our knowledge] indulge in eschatological and millennial predictions. In fact, Gersonides wrote only one astrological text that has survived, a prognostication based on the conjunction of Saturn and Jupiter to take place in March 1345. Gersonides himself died in 1344, a year before the event in question. As Goldstein has demonstrated, this conjunction was predicted already by Ibn Ezra, and repeated by Abraham Bar Hiyya in his Megillat ha-Megalleh where the conjunction was associated with a date of messianic significance that would supposedly take effect in 1358 (Goldstein 1990, p. 3). The conjunction was codified by Levi ben Abraham ben Hayyim in his encyclopedia Livyat Hen, indicating an awareness in the Jewish community of the messianic significance of this conjunction. According to North, Ibn Ezra was the earliest scholar to record one of the seven methods for the setting up of the astrological houses; Gersonides then computed the astrological houses for the prognostication of 1345 according to Ibn Ezra’s method. (See North 1986, p. 25.) Goldstein suggests that as the date 1345 approached, the Papal court might have become interested as well in the conjunction. We do know that Gersonides’ text was translated into Latin with the aid of his brother shortly after Gersonides’ death in 1344.
In his prognostication, Gersonides predicts that there will be “extraordinary evil with many wars, visions and miraculous signs;” “Diseases and death, and the evil will endure for a long time;” “the absence of good, pleasure and happiness for most of the inhabited world;” “the spilling of much blood and increasing enmity, jealousy, strife, famine, various diseases, drought and dearth” (Goldstein 1990). The Black Death, which arrived in Europe in 1347, was thus provided with numerous astrological credentials. The official statement of the medical faculty of the University of Paris, presented to the king in 1348, reported on the conjunction of Saturn and Jupiter in the house of Aquarius on 20 March 1345, which was seen to spread “death and disaster”. It is not hard to see how the conjunction of 1345 came to be associated with the Black Death.
6. Ethical Views
Gersonides is not known for his ethical views; as we have seen, most of his philosophical writings engage matters in the natural sciences. In his biblical commentaries, however, Gersonides focuses on a number of ethical issues. To take one example, Gersonides’ commentary on Songs of Songs is imbued with an extended discussion of human felicity. In this work, he claims that because of their inherent weakness and epistemological imperfections, most human beings are incapable of achieving felicity: “only very few individuals can acquire even a large measure of it.” (Gersonides, Songs of Songs, 6) For these masses, the Torah and its commandments function as the best guide to moral perfection. But if immortality is predicated on intellectual knowledge, and if philosophers such as Maimonides and Gersonides have argued that many individuals are psycho-physically incapable of embarking on such a rigorous and philosophical course of study, does it follow that not all humans can achieve intellectual perfection: is the road the same, and open, to all? And is there only one road to ultimate felicity, or are there many routes?
Horwitz claims that this theme is apparent in Gersonides’ biblical commentaries: “a central role of Ralbag’s biblical commentaries is the desire to help his readers attain eternal intellectual felicity through knowledge of the truth.” (Horwitz 2006, p. 124) Nowhere is this emphasis seen more clearly than in Gersonides’ commentary to Song of Songs. Ostensibly the Song of Songs describes the love affair and desires of a shepherd for a maiden. Generations of commentators saw in the work an allegory of the relation between God and the people Israel. Gersonides, however, provides a philosophical reading of the work that incorporates two sets of subsidiary dialogues, first between the human material intellect and the Active Intellect, and second between the faculties of the soul and the material intellect. Gersonides spells out the import of these discussions in his introduction to the work. He first lays down the premise that “man’s ultimate felicity resides in cognizing and knowing God to the extent that is possible for him.” (Song of Songs, 5) Such knowledge is achieved through observation of the state of existing things in the natural universe, that is, through the beings that God has created and caused. Knowledge of God, therefore, is predicated on knowledge of the natural order.
Gersonides then unpacks the various levels of enlightenment that he finds in Song of Songs, moving from mathematics, to physics, astronomy and finally metaphysics. In this way, Gersonides emphasizes the natural sciences, in particular physics, as a propadeutic to metaphysics. Gersonides is clear that the science of physics builds upon moral knowledge derived from Scripture: “this science is impossible for one who is not strongly settled on the true views from the perspective of Torah and speculation.” (Gersonides Song of Songs, 11). Gersonides then unpacks the various allegories and symbolic representations in the work, all of which point to the goal of ultimate felicity as the union with God via the Active Intellect.
Gersonides’ philosophical ideas went against the grain of traditional Jewish thought; he also challenged scholastic thought. Glasner suggests that unlike his Christian peers who studied and taught at a university, Gersonides’ academic profile as rooted in applied mathematics and astronomy allowed him to leave metaphysics behind. He offered a serious critique of Aristotle’s theory of motion, thus freeing himself as well from “the grip of Aristotelian physics, and even laid down a basis for an alternative understanding of motion” (Glasner 2015, p. 106). Gersonides reflects the following characteristics: first, his writings demonstrate a fundamental interplay and harmony between astrological and theological beliefs. It is clear that the appeal of astrology lay in the fact that it offered useful information, while it looked and operated like a science. Even the critics of astrology had to agree that the heavens exerted a real influence upon terrestrial events. The complexity of the rules of astrology and internal disagreement among its followers served to increase the respect accorded to the science. Failures did not cause the astrologer to lose faith, just as failures among modern physicists do not lead to loss of faith in science. Gersonides believed that life on earth had a meaning, and that terrestrial events had an order. Astrology was a means of ascertaining that meaning. Gersonides’ views on prophecy, providence, free-will and evil reflected ingredients of this philosophical determinism. Whereas his commentaries occupied a central place in Jewish theology, his philosophical work was rejected. Jewish philosophers such as Hasdai Crescas and Isaac Abrabanel felt obliged to subject his works to lengthy criticism. Only in recent years has Gersonides received his rightful place in the history of philosophy. As scholars have rediscovered his thought and have made his corpus available to a modern audience, Gersonides is once again appreciated as an insightful, ruthlessly consistent philosopher.
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