Supplement to Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorems

Supplement: The Diagonalization Lemma

The proof of the Diagonalization Lemma centers on the operation of substitution (of a numeral for a variable in a formula): If a formula with one free variable, \(A(x)\), and a number \(\boldsymbol{n}\) are given, the operation of constructing the formula where the numeral for \(\boldsymbol{n}\) has been substituted for the (free occurrences of the) variable \(x\), that is, \(A(\underline{n})\), is purely mechanical. So is the analogous arithmetical operation which produces, given the Gödel number of a formula (with one free variable) \(\ulcorner A(x)\urcorner\) and of a number \(\boldsymbol{n}\), the Gödel number of the formula in which the numeral \(\underline{n}\) has been substituted for the variable in the original formula, that is, \(\ulcorner A(\underline{n})\urcorner\). The latter operation can be expressed in the language of arithmetic. Note, in particular, that nothing prevents \(\boldsymbol{n}\) from being the Gödel number of \(A(x)\) itself, that is, \(\ulcorner A(x)\urcorner\) (in the usual coding schemes, though, \(\boldsymbol{n}\) cannot be \(\ulcorner A(\underline{n})\urcorner)\). This operation of substitution is applied here again and again.

Let us refer to the arithmetized substitution function as \(\textit{substn}(\ulcorner A(x)\urcorner , \boldsymbol{n}) = \ulcorner A(\underline{n})\urcorner\), and let \(S(x, y, z)\) be a formula which strongly represents this operation, as a relation, in the language of our theory \(F\). In other words, \(S\) is true of \(x, y\), and \(z\), if and only if:

\[ x = \ulcorner A(x)\urcorner , y = \boldsymbol{n}, \text{ and } z = \ulcorner A(\underline{n})\urcorner. \]

Again, nothing prevents us from considering \(\textit{substn}(\ulcorner A(x)\urcorner , \ulcorner A(x)\urcorner)\), or, analogously, \(S(x, x, y)\).

Given any formula \(A(x)\), we can now construct another formula \(\exists y[A(y) \wedge S(x, x, y)\)] with one free variable \(x\). Let us abbreviate it as \(B(x)\).

This formula has a Gödel number, say, \(\boldsymbol{k} = \ulcorner B(x)\urcorner\). By substituting the numeral \(\underline{k}\) denoting it for \(x\) in \(B(x)\), we get \(B(\underline{k})\); let us call this sentence \(D\). Looking back the chain definitions, we see that:

\[ D := B(\underline{k}) := \exists y[A(y) \wedge S(\underline{k}, \underline{k}, y)]. \]

If \(\boldsymbol{m} = \ulcorner B(\underline{k})\urcorner\), then \(\textit{substn}(\boldsymbol{k}, \boldsymbol{k}) = \boldsymbol{m}\), and (assuming \(F\) contains a sufficient amount of arithmetic; \(F\) can then also prove that the result of the arithmetized substitution function is unique)

\[ F \vdash \forall y[S(\underline{k},\underline{k}, y) \leftrightarrow y = \underline{m}] \]

As \(\boldsymbol{k}\) was the Gödel number of the formula \(B(x)\) and \(\boldsymbol{m}\) is the Gödel number of the sentence which results when \(\underline{k}\) is substituted for \(x\) in \(B(x)\), i.e., \(\boldsymbol{m} = \ulcorner B(\underline{k})\urcorner\), we can write this as:

\[ F \vdash \forall y[S(\underline{k},\underline{k}, y) \leftrightarrow y = \ulcorner B(\underline{k})\urcorner] \]

By a little logic, we have

\[\begin{align} F &\vdash D \leftrightarrow \exists y[A(y) \wedge y = \ulcorner B(\underline{k})\urcorner], \text{ and from this } \\ F &\vdash D \leftrightarrow A(\ulcorner B(\underline{k})\urcorner), \text{ i.e.,} \\ F &\vdash D \leftrightarrow A(\ulcorner D\urcorner). \end{align}\]

This completes the proof.

For the relations of the Gödelian Diagonalization Lemma to Cantor’s method of diagonalization in set theory, see Gaifman 2006.

Copyright © 2020 by
Panu Raatikainen <>

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