Notes to Thomas Hill Green

1. Further details about Green’s life can be found in Nettleship 1888 and in Richter 1964.

2. Bradley divided the text into books, chapters, and sections, supplied minor notes (e.g., explaining references and providing translations), and constructed a very useful analytical table of contents. Green left no indication about the contents of this projected addition to the Prolegomena, though it may have included a further discussion of Kant’s ethics, apparently advertised at PE §156.

3. This seriousness of spiritual purpose is portrayed in M.A. Ward’s Robert Elsmere (1888). Elsmere’s inspirational mentor Professor Grey is clearly modeled on Green, and there are echoes of Green’s outlook in Elsmere’s spiritual crisis and development.

4. In his memoir Nettleship mentions Fichte’s influence on Green (1888: xxv, cxxv). Much of Fichte’s idealist reaction to Kant can be found in Fichte’s Science of Knowledge. A useful discussion of Fichte’s idealism and his relation to Kant is Neuhouser 1990.

5. Green’s lectures on Kant’s ethics predate the publication of Sidgwick’s criticism of Kant, and Green does not acknowledge any informal influence by Sidgwick, so it seems reasonable to assume that Green came to his recognition of this worry about Kantian freedom prior to and independently of Sidgwick.

6. Though Sidgwick and Green are correct that the Groundwork conception of positive freedom is in terms of conformity to practical reason, rather than the capacity for conformity, one passage in the Metaphysics of Morals identifies positive freedom with the capacity for practical reason (6: 214). This is additional evidence for Green’s view about the best statement of the Kantian conception of freedom.

7. For a helpful discussion of Hegel’s conception of freedom, see Neuhouser 2000.

8. For a useful discussion of Rousseau that stresses the connection between the general will and the common good, see Cohen 2010.

9. See the lay sermons in Works III and the theological essays in Works V.

10. It is significant that despite scattered references to Hegel in some of Green’s early lectures, there is no analysis of Hegel’s thought in Green’s mature writings comparable to his “Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant” (Works II), his discussion of Kantian themes in Book I of the Prolegomena, or his discussion of Greek ethics in Book III of the Prolegomena. A reasonable conclusion, supported by the reminiscences of Sidgwick and Caird (in Green’s papers at Balliol College), is that, while Green was influenced by Hegelian ideas early in his career, he became increasingly critical of Hegelianism and increasingly intent on developing his own views by engagement with other traditions.

Copyright © 2021 by
David Brink <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free