Thomas Hill Green
Thomas Hill Green (1836–82) is widely regarded as the founding and most influential figure in the tradition of British idealism that flourished in England, especially Oxford, and Scotland, especially Glasgow and Edinburgh, in the second half of the nineteenth century and early in the twentieth century (see, e.g., Mander 2011). Green’s idealism was systematic, embracing metaphysics and epistemology, ethical theory, political philosophy, and philosophy of history and religion. In metaphysics and epistemology, Green reflected the influence of Immanuel Kant, criticizing the British empiricist legacy of John Locke and David Hume. Green argued that empirical knowledge is the workmanship of the human mind, that reality depends on thought and cannot transcend it, and that the possibility of objectivity requires the existence of a single corporate or divine consciousness of which individual minds are proper parts. The only defensible form of idealism, Green thought, is absolute idealism, in which all aspects of reality are operations of a single consciousness. In ethics, Green embraced a form of perfectionism that identifies the human good with self-realization and the perfection of our nature as moral persons and agents. But self-realization must reflect the way in which individuals participate in associations and communities and, as a result, must reflect the demand that individuals pursue a common good. In articulating this conception of perfectionism, Green sees himself as synthesizing the best elements in two different ethical traditions—Greek eudaimonism and Kantian rationalism. Green’s perfectionist ethics influence his politics. He provides the philosophical foundations for a new progressive form of liberalism that transcends the laissez-faire liberalism characteristic of some strands in nineteenth century British liberalism. The state has a duty to promote the common good, and individual rights are constrained by the common good. This gives the state not just negative duties to refrain from interfering with the freedoms and opportunities of its citizens but also positive duties to provide resources and opportunities for individual self-realization. The ethical and political demand for self-realization, Green thinks, is freedom, properly understood. He believes that moral and political progress in history consists in the gradual and increasingly more adequate realization of the values of perfection, the common good, and freedom. Because Green identifies God with the metaphysical, ethical, and political principles in human nature, he sees God as immanent in the progressive developments in human history.
- 1. Green’s Life, Works, and Influence
- 2. Idealist Metaphysics and Epistemology
- 3. Idealist Ethics
- 4. Idealist Politics
- 5. Idealist Religion and History
- 6. Idealist Metaphysics and Ethics
- 7. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Green’s Life, Works, and Influence
Green was born in Birkin, Yorkshire, April 7, 1836. His mother died when he was very young, and he was educated by his father, Valentine Green, until he attended Rugby School in 1850. Green entered Balliol College, Oxford University, in 1855, where he was taught by Benjamin Jowett and Charles Parker. Under Jowett’s mentorship, Green was introduced to both classical Greek and eighteenth and nineteenth century German philosophy and earned a First in Greats.
Green remained at Oxford after receiving his degree. He was appointed as a Lecturer in Ancient and Modern History at Balliol in 1860 and was elected Whyte’s Professor of Moral Philosophy at Oxford in 1877, a position he held until his death in 1882. Green was among those responsible for reforming the philosophical curriculum to include modern as well as ancient sources. His influence on undergraduates was considerable—inspiring many students by his intellectual, moral, and spiritual seriousness.
Green became active in Liberal Party politics in the mid-1860s. In 1876 he was elected to the Oxford town council; he was the first don to serve as a representative of the citizens rather than the University of Oxford. His principal policy reforms concerned land reform, labor regulation, education, and temperance. He supported the Irish Land Act of 1881, which sought to secure property rights of peasant farmers in Ireland. In education, he argued that primary education should be compulsory and state-financed. He served as an assistant commissioner on the Taunton Commission on Secondary Education in 1865–66, arguing for significant reforms in education to equalize opportunity for higher education. He was a member of the Oxford School board and played a part in the foundation of the Oxford School for Boys. He was an important factor in the university extension movement, he sought to open university education to women, and he advocated the use of scholarships and other subsidies to make a university education available to the working classes.
Green was married in 1871 to Charlotte Symonds. The Greens had no children. Never a man of robust health, Green fell ill with sepsis in 1882 and died on March 15, just a few days before his forty-sixth birthday.
Green published a fairly small number of articles, reviews, and pamphlets during his lifetime. He wrote the influential critical commentary on Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature, which was part of The Philosophical Works of David Hume, that he and T.H. Grose edited and published in 1874. In addition, he wrote a three-part article “Can There Be a Natural Science of Man?” published in Mind in 1882, the year he died. These two works reflect metaphysical and epistemological themes that were incorporated into Book I of Green’s Prolegomena to Ethics, published posthumously in 1883. In addition, Green’s “Lecture on Liberal Legislation and the Freedom of Contract” was published in 1881 (Works III). Green’s other main philosophical works were published posthumously. This includes Green’s most important work, the Prolegomena to Ethics. The Prolegomena was substantially completed prior to Green’s death, except for 20–30 pages which he had hoped to add. At Green’s instructions, A.C. Bradley oversaw the Prolegomena’s publication in 1883. Other important posthumous publications include his essay “On the Different Senses of ‘Freedom’ as Applied to Will and to the Moral Progress of Man,” his Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant, and his Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation (all in Works II).
Green’s metaphysical, ethical, and political views were influential, especially in Britain (Nettleship 1888; Richter 1964). Because Green’s most important work was published posthumously, his direct influence on others results largely from his teaching, public lectures, and political activities. Though Green sometimes despaired of his ability to present idealist principles in a clear and rigorous fashion, he nonetheless inspired many students and peers by his intellectual, moral, and spiritual seriousness (Works V 444–48, 485). His metaphysical and ethical views were sympathetically received and developed in Britain by Bernard Bosanquet, A.C. Bradley, F.H. Bradley, Edward Caird, R.B. Haldane, J.S. Mackenzie, J.H. Muirhead, R.L. Nettleship, Hastings Rashdall, D.G. Ritchie, Arnold Toynbee, and William Wallace.
Green’s political influence was also significant. Beyond the specific economic, political, and educational reforms for which Green advocated, he had an important impact on the direction of the Liberal Party in Britain. His egalitarian concern with human perfection, especially his insistence that laws and institutions serve the common good, provided an intellectual foundation for the development of a new form of liberalism that required the state not simply to forbear from interfering in the liberties and opportunities of its citizens but also to provide various positive conditions and resources on which citizens may draw in pursuing better lives. Despite significant differences among them, a number of influential figures in the New Liberalism can claim to be heirs of Green’s political philosophy, including Bosanquet, Ritchie, and L.T. Hobhouse.
2. Idealist Metaphysics and Epistemology
The most systematic presentation of Green’s idealist metaphysics and epistemology occurs in the first book of the Prolegomena. Green introduces his metaphysical and epistemological inquiries in response to a naturalistic approach to ethical theory that he thinks is prominent in British moral philosophy. He associates ethical naturalism with hedonism and focuses on the utilitarian tradition, especially John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick (PE §2). Green associates naturalism with a kind of empiricism that attempts to construct knowledge on the basis of the senses, uncorrupted by the understanding. But Green thinks that there can be no empirical knowledge without operations of the understanding and concludes that a purely naturalistic or empirical science of morals is impossible (PE §8; cf. Works II 83–85).
Green has four main aims in the first book of the Prolegomena. (1) He wants to reject the empiricist view that knowledge can be analyzed into two separable components—the deliverances of the senses and the operations of the understanding—in which what is given by nature is real and the contributions of the understanding are not (PE §§9–10, 20, 70). By contrast, Green argues, even the simplest experience involves operations of the understanding and relations to other elements of a self-conscious mind. (2) The attack on empiricism is supposed to support the idealist claim that nature is the product of the understanding (PE §20). Green’s attack on empiricism is clearly indebted to Kant’s claims in the Critique of Pure Reason, especially Kant’s account of the synthetic unity of apperception in the Transcendental Analytic. But, in defending idealism, Green argues that Kant did not carry his idealist principles to their logical conclusion (PE §41); he rejects the Kantian dualism of appearances and things-in-themselves (PE §§11, 30–41). (3) In order for the idealist to distinguish between appearance and reality, it is necessary to posit an “eternal” and “unalterable” system of relations in a self-conscious corporate agent that includes the finite systems of relations contained in the self-conscious minds of individual persons (PE §§13, 26, 69). (4) Though much of the first book of the Prolegomena is concerned with the role of self-consciousness in apparently discrete episodes of experience, Green is also concerned with the role of self-consciousness in knowledge. Knowledge requires more than acting on appearances; it involves assenting to true appearances for good reasons. This requires the ability to distance oneself from appearances and to assess the evidence for appearances, especially their congruence with other elements of consciousness. This sort of epistemic responsibility requires self-consciousness.
2.1 Empiricism and Skepticism
Green is concerned with a form of empiricism that he finds in commonsense, as well as philosophical, thought (PE §20). Though Green believes that Locke’s Essay was largely responsible for making empiricism philosophically influential, he thinks that only Hume adheres to empiricist principles consistently (Works I 1–5, 132) and that, as a result, the full metaphysical and epistemological difficulties with empiricism become clear only in Hume’s work, especially the Treatise. The empiricist program on which Green focuses sees all knowledge as resting on the deliverances of the senses. On this view, knowledge is built up from a foundation of simple discrete sensory experiences. In this sort of experience, the mind is supposed to play a purely passive role. The mind can then play an active role by performing various operations on these simple experiences, such as combining simple experiences to form complex ideas, comparing simple experiences for similarity and dissimilarity, and abstracting the common elements out of distinct ideas. In this tradition, reality is associated with simple ideas delivered to the senses and contrasted with the workmanship of the understanding and relations, which are in some sense conventional or mind-dependent.
Green thinks that this empiricist program suffers rot at the foundations; he thinks that simple sensory experience that is not relational and in which the mind plays a purely passive role is impossible. All experience presupposes certain formal conceptions that the subject of experience employs—those of subject and object, substance and quality, cause and effect, spatiality, and temporality (Works I 12–13, 16–17, 40–41, 43–50).
Some sensory judgments are clearly relational, as when we perceive one event A to be the cause of another B. To say that A is the cause of B is clearly to relate one event to another. Similarly, to say that A is a brittle thing is to say that A does or would stand in relations of a certain sort to other things with which it might come into contact. This shows that such relational judgments are products of the understanding and not proper sensory judgments. Pure sensory judgments would be simple and would not reflect the operation of the understanding. Perhaps they include only reports of current experience, such as “This thing appears red”. But Green believes that even these judgments are implicitly relational—“imply sequence and degree”—and require comparison of one element of experience with another (PE §46). To judge that something is a thing or substance in which properties inhere presumably requires assigning it some diachronic stability, however limited, and this requires seeing it as persisting through some changes—as a part of some series of events and not others. And to judge something red is to predicate a property of an object, but properties or universals are, for the empiricist, ideas formed by abstraction from our ideas of simple experiences.
Green thinks that this conclusion about the relational character of experience has important implications for skepticism. If the empiricists are right that reality is given in experience untainted by the understanding, then recognition of the relational character of experience would imply skepticism (PE §§20, 25, 30).
Green himself accepts the skeptical conclusion insofar as he denies the possibility of empirical knowledge of objects independently of how they appear to us. There can be no knowledge of perceiver-independent reality. But there can be knowledge of perceiver-dependent reality. Green’s idealism implies that this is the only defensible conception of reality that allows us to avoid the skeptical conclusion. He avoids the skeptical conclusion by denying empiricist assumptions about what is real.
However, we can avoid skepticism without endorsing idealism if we abandon the claim that relations are the workmanship of the understanding, rather than given in experience. In particular, Green’s case for idealism is undermined if, as Moore and Russell will later claim, relations can be given in experience and are not the product of the understanding (see Hylton 1990: 110–112).
Green argues that the relational character of experience implies that experience depends upon the activities of a self-consciousness agent (PE §70). Rejecting Hume’s conception of the self as illusory or no more than a bundle of sensations (Treatise I.iv.6), Green argues that cognition requires a self that is independent of and prior to experience (PE §16, 32). Green thinks that experience of the world presupposes the operations of a self-conscious agent. Could the world itself be the product of a self-conscious mind?
Green recognizes that there are obstacles to this idealist conclusion that account for the plausibility of empiricist and Kantian dualisms between the world of appearances and things as they are independently of appearance. We seem to need nature, as distinct from appearances, in order to account for the source or causes of our appearances and to account for fallibility—the possibility of error—which seems to be a precondition of objectivity (PE §§13, 69). By contrast, the idealist, who denies a reality independent of appearances, seems unable to explain the source of appearances and the possibility of fallibility. This, Green thinks, is what leads Kant, who rightly insists on the relational character of experience (PE §33), to distinguish between phenomena—things as they do or can appear to us—and noumena—things as they are in themselves, independently of how they appear to us (PE §§11, 21–2, 30, 34).
But, like Kant’s idealist critic J.G. Fichte, Green thinks that this Kantian dualism is an unstable resting point between empirical realism and idealism. He believes that the consistent application of Kantian principles should lead to the rejection of things-in-themselves (PE §41). Kant’s dualism is both unacceptable and unnecessary. It is unacceptable, because it leaves cognitive success a mystery.
It leaves us without an answer to the question, how the order of relations, which the mind sets up, comes to reproduce those relations of the material world which are assumed to be of a wholly different origin and nature. (PE §34)
Indeed, Green thinks that the notion of things-in-themselves is empty, because we can have no conception of things of themselves.
Green also thinks the Kantian dualism is unnecessary. The idealist can explain error. We can never have access to things-in-themselves. But we can have access to other appearances that, in various ways, might represent a particular appearance as anomalous. Here, we check one appearance by appeal to others (PE §§12–13, 64). On this view, we can distinguish between individual appearances or clusters of experiences and reality but not between reality and the entire system of appearances entertained by a particular mind (PE §13). We avoid answering the question how our conceptions of the world come to match a world that is independent of them by identifying reality and objectivity with the way it is conceived holistically by a self-conscious mind (PE §§10, 13, 36–37, 63).
Green says that reality and the system of appearances are equally dependent on each other (PE §36) and warns against the misunderstanding of idealism that results from thinking that it reduces facts to ideas (PE §37). In the discussion of the possibility of bare sensations, he does not deny that they would be facts but insists that they would be facts that would not exist for consciousness (PE §§48–9). This suggests, not the metaphysical claim that facts are mind-dependent, but the epistemic claim that only structured experience can be the basis of knowledge. However, this epistemological claim is much less radical than the metaphysical claim. Nor is it clear how it is inconsistent with Kantian dualism; it appears to reaffirm Kant’s claim that we can only have knowledge of appearances and not to deny that there are things-in themselves. Perhaps Green’s claim is only that we are unable to say anything about things-in-themselves, even to say of them that they exist, without bringing them in relation to a conscious subject (PE §40).
But it’s not even clear that Green can distinguish himself from Kant in this way. For Green treats the subject of consciousness as noumenon, outside of space and time (PE §§51, 52, 65). The subject of consciousness is a precondition of experience but is completely distinct from any element of experience (PE §32). Because the self is not given in experience, it is, Green thinks, outside of space and time (PE §§52, 65). This dualism between elements of conscious experience that are in space and time and the selves or epistemic agents who are self-conscious and are outside of space and time resembles Kant’s own dualism between appearances and things-in-themselves.
One might question Green’s dualism and anti-naturalism. Particular episodes of conscious experience presuppose a subject of consciousness that is prior to and independent of those episodes of consciousness. However, this does not imply that the self is prior to and independent of all experience. Perhaps the self is a set or series of experiences. Green may seem to rule out this possibility, because he distinguishes between a succession of conscious states and consciousness of a succession of such states and claims that self-consciousness requires the latter, and not just the former (PE §§52, 55, 62–65). But if conscious states can take other conscious states as their objects, it is not clear why the self could not be a suitably diachronically ordered and interrelated set of conscious experiences. In any case, the need for a self that is the bearer of discrete self-conscious experiences does not preclude the self from being an object of consciousness, thought, or knowledge. Indeed, Green’s entire theoretical and practical philosophy turns crucially on the possibility of self-consciousness and its causal role in thought and action. As we will see, important aspects of Green’s views about moral responsibility presuppose that the self is not outside space and time but rather plays a fundamental causal role in responsible action.
2.3 Absolute Idealism
So far, Green’s idealism would seem to involve a plurality of local idealisms. Reality (or knowable reality) is the product of finite self-conscious minds, with the result that there would be as many realities (knowable realities) as there are finite consciousnesses. Green finds such a conception of objectivity insufficiently robust; objectivity requires a single inclusive and eternal self-consciousness (PE §§26, 67, 69; Works II 85).
We must hold then that there is a consciousness for which the relations of fact, that form the object of our gradually attained knowledge, already and eternally exist; and that the growing knowledge of the individual is a progress towards this consciousness. (PE §69)
This corporate consciousness makes Green’s version of idealism a version of absolute idealism. The consciousnesses of individuals stand to this single corporate consciousness much as stages or parts of a person’s life stand to the person.
Green’s main argument for this form of absolute idealism seems to be his concern with the possibility of error (PE §26). Just as we must make room for the possibility of local error in an individual’s conscious experience, so too we have to allow for the possibility of systematic error within an individual’s conscious experience. But just as the idealist explains the possibility of local individual error against the background of larger patterns in the individual’s experience, so too she must explain the possibility of systematic individual error against the background of some larger pattern of experience. In order to find a larger pattern of experience, we must go outside individual consciousness. But the experiences of other individuals cannot, as such, form part of a common and larger set of experiences. If the content and truth conditions of an individual’s thoughts are dependent on the relations between those thoughts and other elements of his consciousness, then individuals, as such, would have incommensurable experiences and thoughts. We can block this relativistic conclusion if there is a single trans-historical corporate mind of which particular finite minds are proper parts. For then there will be a common determinant of the content and truth conditions of the experiences and thoughts of different finite agents. Green’s view seems to be that knowledge and, hence, inquiry presuppose absolute idealism (PE §26).
Many idealist metaphysical views are responses to skeptical worries that our realist conclusions about objective reality outstrip the nature of our evidence. The idealist responds by denying that reality is objective in a way that could exceed our evidence. Green’s idealism fits this pattern. By denying that our beliefs about the world concern things in themselves, independently of the way that they do or can seem to us, Green denies the skeptic’s gap between our evidence and reality.
There are various questions one might raise about this sort of idealism. First, one might think that the idealist response concedes too much to the skeptic. Perhaps we can and should accept a gap between our evidence and the claims for which they are evidence, resisting the skeptic’s demand that evidence guarantee the truth of the propositions it supports. We can concede that our justified beliefs about the world are fallible. Second, we might note that absolute idealism cannot guarantee truth either, because it outstrips the knowledge available to individual conscious minds. The existence of a corporate consciousness is something outside the conscious grasp of any of us individually. This is especially true, given that Green thinks that the corporate consciousness lies outside of space and time. Third, Green can be read as offering a transcendental argument that empirical knowledge is possible only on the assumption that absolute idealism is true. Even if that argument were otherwise successful, it would establish absolute idealism only if empirical knowledge is possible. But if absolute idealism is the price of empirical knowledge, then one might wonder if we do indeed have empirical knowledge.
2.4 Self-Consciousness and Epistemic Responsibility
Much of the first book of the Prolegomena is concerned with the role of self-consciousness in apparently discrete episodes of experience in individual minds. But Green is also concerned with the role of self-consciousness in knowledge. For the most part, non-rational animals accept the way things appear to them—their doxastic impulses. If they reason, they select instrumental means to the satisfaction of their desires, but they do not reason about whether things are as they appear. They lack the capacity to distance themselves from their appearances, to assess the credentials of their doxastic impulses, and to assent to appearances for good reasons. Brutes may often have true appearances, but they are not epistemically responsible with respect to their appearances. On the assumption that knowledge requires something like epistemic responsibility, and not just true belief, Green argues that knowledge requires self-consciousness, inasmuch as epistemic responsibility presupposes self-consciousness. For epistemic responsibility requires a cognizer to be able to pose the question of whether she should assent to an appearance and to assess the reasons for assent by relating this appearance to other elements of her consciousness. Indeed, any extended piece of reasoning requires consciousness of different appearances as parts of a single system. For instance, I recognize and trust the results of previous deliberations as premises in my present deliberations. This requires a self that is conscious of and synthesizes a set of appearances. On this view, knowledge presupposes epistemic responsibility which presupposes self-consciousness (PE §§84, 120, 125). This link between knowledge and self-consciousness via epistemic responsibility is arguably the most important metaphysical claim for understanding Green’s ethical argument in the rest of the Prolegomena.
3. Idealist Ethics
The remaining three books of the Prolegomena concern issues in moral psychology and ethical theory. Green criticizes forms of ethical naturalism that attempt to ground morality in a science of desire and pleasure. In particular, he targets those in the utilitarian tradition who defend hedonism. He rejects the hedonist conception of motivation, arguing that moral agents have capacities for practical reason that allow them to distinguish between the intensity and authority of their desires, to deliberate about their desires, and to regulate their action in accordance with their deliberations. Agents needn’t act on their strongest desires; they can and should act on the basis of a judgment about what it is best for them to do. This, Green claims, is to act on a conception of one’s own overall good. Here, Green aligns himself with the Greek eudaimonist tradition, which he interprets in terms of self-realization. Because Green derives the demand for self-realization from an understanding of agency itself, he regards its demands as categorical, rather than hypothetical, imperatives. Self-realization for Green requires self-consciousness, which requires proper cognizance of others. In this way, he agrees with those Greeks, such as Aristotle, who claim that the proper conception of the agent’s own good requires a concern with the good of others, especially the common good. However, Green thinks that the Greeks had too narrow a conception of the common good. It is only with Christianity and enlightenment philosophical views, especially Kantian and utilitarian traditions in ethics, Green thinks, that we have recognition of the universal scope of the common good. This leads Green to claim that full self-realization can take place only when each rational agent regards all other rational agents as ends in themselves on whom his own happiness depends. In such a state, there can be no conflict or competition among the interests of different rational agents. Green links self-realization and freedom; freedom is best understood in terms of self-determination and self-realization. Because Green thinks that self-realization aims at the common good, he thinks that freedom also aims at the common good. Green concludes that moral progress consists in the gradual realization of this sort of freedom, which requires the progressive realization of the common good.
3.1 Self-Consciousness and Practical Responsibility
In Book II Green picks up the theme from Book I about the role of self-consciousness in epistemic responsibility and explicitly makes the parallel argument about the role of self-consciousness in practical and moral personality. Responsibility neither is threatened by determinism nor requires indeterminism; it requires self-consciousness (PE §§87, 90, 106, 109–110). Moral responsibility requires capacities for practical deliberation, and practical deliberation requires self-consciousness. Non-responsible agents, such as brutes and small children, appear to act on their strongest desires or, if they deliberate, to deliberate only about the instrumental means to the satisfaction of their desires (PE §§86, 92, 96, 122, 125). By contrast, responsible agents must be able to distinguish between the intensity and authority of their desires, to deliberate about the appropriateness of their desires and aims, and to regulate their actions in accord with these deliberations (PE §§85–86, 92, 96, 103, 107, 220). Responsibility requires moral personality. Here, Green shows the influence of Butler, Reid, and Kant (see, e.g., Irwin 1984).
Green considers the apparent threat to responsibility resulting from the claim that agents necessarily act on their strongest desires (PE §§103–106, 139–42). He thinks that the threat is specious, because it rests on an ambiguity. Some desires are stronger because more intense, but desires can also be stronger when they are endorsed after deliberation. The action of non-rational animals is just the vector sum of the intensity of their desires; they do act on their strongest desires, in this first sense. But responsible agents—who have moral personality and can distinguish between the strength and authority of desire and act on these judgments—need not act on their strongest desire in this first sense. Instead, they can be moved by the strongest desire after deliberation. It’s only by failing to distinguish these two different kinds of strength, Green thinks, that one could see a threat to responsibility here.
Green makes clear that the sort of moral personality that is required by responsibility is a capacity to recognize and be guided by reasons. This is clear from his defense of Kant’s conception of freedom against criticisms. As we have seen, Green does not think that freedom and responsibility require Kant’s doctrine of transcendental freedom. But Green is sympathetic with Kant’s claims about positive freedom and autonomy in the Groundwork. There, Kant identifies positive freedom or autonomy with a will determined by practical reason and the moral law (4: 447). Sidgwick criticizes this conception of freedom in his essay “The Kantian Conception of Free-Will,” reprinted in the Appendix to The Methods of Ethics, for being unable to show how someone might be free and responsible for making the wrong choices, as well as the right ones (Methods 511–16). The possibility of freely chosen wrongdoing shows that Kant’s conception of positive freedom, as conformity with practical reason, cannot be freedom of the kind required by moral responsibility. In his lectures on Kant’s ethics, Green recognizes the same problem for Kantian freedom that Sidgwick does (Works II 107). But Green thinks that this is a case where the essentials of the Kantian view can be defended, even if this requires amending Kant. Kant’s considered view, Green thinks, contrasts two kinds of positive freedom—(a) the capacity to conform to practical reason and (b) the exercise of this capacity. Freedom as responsibility requires (a), not (b) (Works II 136). On this capacitarian reading of moral personality and responsibility, the person who has the capacity to conform to practical reason and the moral law but fails to exercise it is just as responsible as the person who has the capacity and does exercise it (Works II 107–08, 119, 136).
Green thinks that the process of forming and acting on a conception of what it is best for me on the whole to do is for me to form and act from a conception of my own overall good (PE §§91–92, 96, 128).
A man, we will suppose, is acted on at once by an impulse to revenge an affront, by a bodily want, by a call of duty, and by fear of certain results incidental to his avenging the affront or obeying the call of duty. We will suppose further that each passion … suggests a different line of action. So long as he is undecided how to act, all are, in a way, external to him. He presents them to himself as influences by which he is consciously affected but which are not he, and with none of which he yet identifies himself …. So long as this state of things continues, no moral effect ensues. It ensues when the man’s relation to these influences is altered by his identifying himself with one of them, by his taking the object of one of the tendencies as for the time his good. This is to will, and is in itself moral action …. (PE §146)
To identify reflectively with a desire is to will it and to act from motive and character, rather than mere desire (PE §153).
However, we might wonder why Green assumes that in acting on some conception of an overall good I am thereby acting on a conception of my own good.
It is superfluous to add, good to himself, for anything conceived of as good in such a way that the agent acts for the sake of it, must be conceived as his own good, though he may conceive it as his own good only on account of his interest in others, and in spite of any suffering on his own part incidental to its attainment. (PE §92)
This may seem to confuse the ownership of the conception of the good (whose conception it is) with its content (whether it is a conception of my good or simply of what is good). I may act on my conception of the good, but that does not make it a conception of my own good.
However, Green may think that the transition from ownership to content is legitimate. He may think that when one adopts an end as good and structures one’s plans, emotions, and desires around it that one thereby makes that end one’s own and makes it part of one’s personal good such that the value of the end and one’s success in achieving it determine in part the quality of one’s life. If I choose to become a parent, then the constitutive aims of being a good parent, including the success of my children, become part of my good such that the well-being of my children directly affects my own happiness or personal good.
3.2 Self-Realization and Normative Perfectionism
Green develops his ideas about the personal good in Book III of the Prolegomena. There he criticizes hedonism and develops his own perfectionist claims. Hedonism can be a psychological doctrine or an evaluative doctrine about the personal good. Green’s discussion of hedonism focuses on the utilitarian tradition, especially the views of Mill and Sidgwick. Green thinks that Mill combines psychological and evaluative hedonism, though that is disputable (Brink 2013: chs. 2–3). Sidgwick clearly distinguishes the two forms of hedonism, rejecting psychological hedonism and defending evaluative hedonism. Since Sidgwick explicitly accepts evaluative hedonism while rejecting psychological hedonism, Green must argue differently against Sidgwick.
Green agrees with Butler that psychological egoism (hedonism) is implausible but thinks that people mistakenly accept it because they mistake the pleasure that can be expected to attend the satisfaction of desires for the object of desire. Because the pleasure is consequential on the satisfaction of desire, the object of desire cannot be that pleasure. This point is relevant, Green thinks, to Mill’s alleged evaluative hedonism (PE §§162–69). Green notes that in Mill’s higher pleasures doctrine and in the proof that Mill seems to assign intrinsic value to objective pleasures, that is, to activities and pursuits that exercise our higher capacities. Green thinks that these claims about the superior value of such activities are anti-hedonistic, but he thinks that Mill fails to see this only because he focuses on the (subjective) pleasure that is expected from engaging in such activities. But this confuses, Green thinks, what we value and a by-product of what we value.
Green focuses on Mill’s explanation of the preferences of competent judges for modes of existence that employ their higher faculties. Higher pleasures are those things (e.g., activities) that a competent judge would prefer, even if they produced less pleasure in her than the lower pleasures would (Mill Utilitarianism II 5 in Works X 211). But why should competent judges prefer activities that they often find less pleasurable unless they believe that these activities are more valuable? Mill explains the fact that competent judges prefer activities that exercise their rational capacities by appeal to their sense of dignity (Utilitarianism II 5 in Works X 212). Green thinks that the dignity passage undermines hedonism (PE §164–66, 171). In claiming that it is the dignity of a life in which the higher capacities are exercised and the competent judge’s sense of her own dignity that explains her preference for those activities, Mill implies that her preferences reflect judgments about the value that these activities have independently of their being the object of desire or the source of pleasure. We take pleasure in these activities because we recognize their value; they are not valuable, because they are pleasurable.
Green not only criticizes the evaluative hedonism he finds in Mill; he also rejects evaluative hedonism outright. One argument he makes is that evaluative hedonism is actually inconsistent with psychological hedonism. Evaluative hedonism says that our ultimate aim ought to be to maximize net pleasure or to seek the largest sum of pleasures, whereas psychological hedonism claims that pleasurable experience is the ultimate object of desire. But a sum of pleasures is not itself a pleasure, and so, according to psychological hedonism, we could not act on the requirements of evaluative hedonism (PE §221). This may be a problem for someone who combines both evaluative and psychological hedonisms. However, this is not a problem for an evaluative hedonist such as Sidgwick who eschews psychological hedonism (PE §§222, 334, 351). Green must offer some other argument against the person who thinks a self-conscious agent would identify his personal good with pleasure. Green’s real disagreement with Sidgwick concerns whether the only things reflectively desirable for an agent are her own states of consciousness. Green recognizes “ideal goods” for an agent that involve her own activities and her relations to other members of her community (PE §§159–61, 357; cf. Methods 113–15).
Green argues not only against hedonism but also for self-realization. He suggests that it is the very capacities that make moral responsibility possible in the first place that determine the proper end of deliberation (PE §176). Responsible action involves self-consciousness and is expressive of the self. The self is not to be identified with any desire or any series or set of desires; moral personality consists in the ability to subject appetites and desires to a process of deliberative endorsement and to form new desires as the result of such deliberations. So the self essentially includes deliberative capacities, and if responsible action expresses the self, it must exercise these deliberative capacities. This explains why Green thinks that the proper aim of deliberation is a life of activities that embody rational or deliberative control of thought and action (PE §§175, 180, 199, 234, 238–39, 247, 283).
One can ask about any conception of the good why one should care about the good, so conceived. Why should the good, so conceived, be normative? Green’s defense of self-realization makes the content of the good consist in the exercise of the very same capacities that make one a rational agent, subject to reasons for action, in the first place. This promises to explain why a rational agent should care about the good conceived in terms of self-realization.
This justification of self-realization also explains why Green treats the imperative of self-realization as a categorical imperative. Like Kant, Green seeks an account of the agent’s duties that is grounded in her agency and does not depend upon contingent and variable inclinations. The goal of self-realization, Green thinks, meets this demand.
At the same time, because it [self-realization] is the fulfilment of himself, of that which he has in him to be, it will excite an interest in him like no other interest, different in kind from any of his desires and aversions except such as are derived from it. It will be an interest as in an object conceived to be of unconditional value; one of which the value does not depend on any desire that the individual may at any time feel for it or for anything else, or on any pleasure that … he may experience….[T]he desire for the object will be founded on a conception of its desirableness as a fulfilment of the capabilities of which a man is conscious in being conscious of himself. … [Self-realization] will express itself in [the] imposition … of rules requiring something to be done irrespectively of any inclination to do it, irrespectively of any desired end to which it is a means, other than this end, which is desired because conceived as absolutely desirable. (PE §193)
Because the demands of self-realization depend only on those very deliberative capacities that make one a responsible agent, they are categorical imperatives.
Green recognizes that his conception of the good in terms of self-realization and perfection is abstract and perhaps vague in comparison with the apparent definiteness of the hedonist’s conception of the good (PE §193). Nonetheless, his conception of the good in terms of self-realization or the exercise of deliberative capacities is not empty.
3.3 Self-Realization and the Common Good
In particular, Green links self-realization and a common good. He believes that full self-realization can take place only in a community of ends (PE §§183–84, 190–91, 199, 232) in which each person cares about others for their own sakes (PE §§199–200) and aims at a common good (PE §202, 236). But why? At one point, Green suggests that this concern for others, at least for those within one’s immediate circle, is given or natural.
Now the self of which a man thus forecasts the fulfilment, is not an abstract or empty self. It is a self already affected in the most primitive forms of human life by manifold interests, among which are interests in other persons. These are not merely interests dependent on other persons for the means to their gratification, but interests in the good of those other persons, interests which cannot be satisfied without the consciousness that those other persons are satisfied. The man cannot contemplate himself as in a better state, or on the way to the best, without contemplating others, not merely as a means to that better state, but as sharing it with him. (PE §199)
Green might simply be invoking this familiar concern that one has for one’s intimate associates. If I do care about the welfare of my associates, and these desires survive deliberative endorsement, then, according to Green, I make their welfare part of my own personal good (PE §§91–92). But this may make an agent’s interest in others dependent on her contingent desires. To explain how the demands of the common good are categorical imperatives, we need to explain how pursuit of a common good is an ingredient in self-realization.
Green claims that a rational agent’s interest in others is rooted in her search for a “permanent” good (PE §§223, 229–32, 234). Moral personality requires impulse control and the abilities to distinguish myself from my appetites and to frame the question what it would be best for me—a temporally extended agent—on the whole to do. This will involve endorsing some goals as good and as worth making short-term sacrifices or investments for. This is to value goals and projects in which I am involved that have some degree of permanence. Green seems to think that the right sort of association with others extends this permanence in a natural way—indeed, that it provides a kind of counter-balance to mortality or surrogate for immortality.
That determination of an animal organism by a self-conscious principle, which makes a man and is presupposed by the interest in permanent good, carries with it a certain appropriation by the man to himself of the beings with whom he is connected by natural ties, so that they become to him as himself and in providing for himself he provides for them. Projecting himself into the future as a permanent subject of possible well-being or ill-being—and he must so project himself in seeking for a permanent good—he associates his kindred with himself. It is this association that neutralises the effect which the anticipation of death must otherwise have on the demand for a permanent good. (PE §231)
Self-realization involves a kind of quest for intrapersonal permanence. In the intrapersonal case, I preserve myself when the actions and intentional states of a future self depend in the right way on the actions and intentional states of my present and past selves. But interpersonal association involves deliberative connections between associates, in which the intentional states and actions of each depend on those of the other. This might explain why Green thinks self-realization aims at interpersonal permanence as well. I more fully realize my capacities in association with others, and this association gives me reason to treat the good of my associates as part of my own good.
In linking moral virtue with pursuit of a common good, Green accepts Aristotle’s claims about the importance of the fine (kalon) and the common good to an agent’s own eudaimonia or happiness (Irwin 1992, 2009: §§1242–1244). Though Green sees the Aristotelian roots of his own perfectionism, he does not accept Aristotle’s account of the scope of the common good. Whereas Aristotle’s politics recognize significant restrictions on the scope of the common good excluding slaves and women (Politics II 4–7, 12–13), Green thinks its scope should be universal (PE §§205–17, 249, 253, 271, 285).
The idea of a society of free and law-abiding persons, each his own master yet each his brother’s keeper, was first definitely formed among the Greeks, and its formation was the condition of all subsequent progress in the direction described; but with them … it was limited in its application to select groups of men surrounded by populations of aliens and slaves. In its universality, as capable of application to the whole human race, an attempt has first been made to act upon it in modern Christendom. (PE §271)
Green’s own conception of the common good is universal; full self-realization and the securing of a really permanent good occurs only when each person respects the claims made by other members of a maximally inclusive community of ends (PE §§214, 216, 244, 332). In this respect, Green’s belief that eudaimonism can and should support cosmopolitan concern for others is perhaps closer to the Stoic than the Aristotelian conception of the common good (see Brink 2018).
Green associates this cosmopolitan conception of the common good with Enlightenment ethical conceptions, in particular, Kantianism and utilitarianism. He regards the philosophical and political influence of utilitarian and Kantian conceptions of impartiality as progressive influences (PE §§213–14). According to the utilitarian conception, everyone should count for one and no one for more than one (PE §213). According to the Humanity formula of Kant’s Categorical Imperative, one must treat humanity, whether in your own person or in others, always as an end in itself and never merely as a means (PE §214). Though Green thinks both utilitarian and Kantian conceptions of impartiality are right to insist on the wide scope of the common good, Green accepts the distributed concern with each moral person that he associates with Kant’s Humanity formula of the Categorical Imperative (PE §§215, 217).
Green thinks that we each have reason to promote this sort of cosmopolitan conception of the common good. But he goes further, claiming that the common good involves no conflict between the good of the agent and the good of others (PE §244).
Because Green thinks that self-realization aims at the common good, a noncompetitive conception of the common good is a substantive and controversial commitment. We may wonder if there are any genuinely noncompetitive goods, such that one person can’t enjoy them unless all others do. And even if there are genuinely noncompetitive goods, we might doubt that the personal good would be exhausted by such a common good. If we think of the personal good as that which an individual has reason to want in itself for her own sake, it seems plausible that the personal good and the good of others will overlap but not coincide perfectly.
3.4 Self-Realization and Freedom
Freedom is not a concept that looms large in Green’s perfectionism in the Prolegomena. However, Green focuses on freedom in the posthumously published essay “On the Different Senses of ‘Freedom’ as Applied to Will and the Moral Progress of Man” (Works II), where he defends a tripartite conception of freedom.
- Juridical Freedom
- Moral Freedom
- Real or Perfect Freedom
Juridical freedom is the absence of compulsion or restraint by others. This is freedom as non-interference prized by Locke and other liberals. Moral freedom is the sort of freedom required for responsibility, which is manifested in both praiseworthy and blameworthy conduct. Moral freedom, Green believes, requires the capacity for reasons-responsiveness. This is the kind of freedom he proposes as a response to the problem Sidgwick identifies for Kant. Real or perfect freedom exists insofar as an agent exercises her moral freedom properly, pursuing her own personal good and its constitutive commitment to the common good. This sort of freedom just is self-realization or the perfection of one’s agency.
Though each form of freedom is valuable, both juridical and moral freedom are subordinate to real and perfect freedom (Works II 308–09). Real freedom is the regulative ideal of agency and cannot be achieved without juridical and moral freedom, but neither are sufficient to produce real freedom (Works II 324). Green ends up endorsing a version of the Hegelian view that freedom is a matter of degree, and moral progress can be understood as the progressively more perfect realization of real freedom (Works II 324–30).
In “Two Concepts of Liberty” Isaiah Berlin famously distinguishes between negative and positive liberty and criticizes various conceptions of positive freedom, including Green’s (1958: 132–33, 141–54). Negative liberty, for Berlin, is focused exclusively on the absence of external compulsion by other individuals or the state. By contrast, positive freedom involves self-determination in which the rational part of one’s soul is controlling. The rational self is the true self, and the true self is realized in the perfection of one’s rational nature (1958: 131–34, 141–53). Berlin thinks that positive freedom is pernicious, because true freedom is negative freedom and because positive freedoms smuggle other alleged moral goods in under the guise of freedom, leading us to ignore the costs to freedom that pursuit of these goods involves.
But Berlin’s criticisms misunderstand Green’s claims about freedom. For Green, negative liberty as noninterference is embodied in juridical freedom, and juridical freedom is an important and legitimate part of freedom. But juridical freedom does not exhaust freedom for Green, as it does for Berlin. He puts the point this way in “Liberal Legislation”
Thus, though of course there can be no freedom among men who act not willingly but under compulsion, yet on the other hand the mere removal of compulsion , the mere enabling a man to do as he likes, is in itself no contribution to true freedom. (Works III 371)
Green also recognizes moral freedom and real or perfect freedom. Moral freedom is the capacity for reasons-responsive conduct, and real or perfect freedom is the proper exercise of this capacity, resulting in self-realization and its commitment to the common good. These forms of freedom involve positive freedom.
Green believes that juridical freedom, moral freedom, and real or perfect freedom all involve aspects of self-determination (“Freedom,” Works II 315–16). Both juridical freedom and moral freedom are essential to responsibility. Responsibility depends on an agent’s normative capacities and her opportunity to exercise them free from undue interference with others. We can see this because significant impairment of either the agent’s capacities or her opportunities is excusing. Whereas juridical freedom depends on the agent’s opportunities, moral freedom depends on her capacities. If so, then self-determination as responsibility requires both juridical and moral freedoms.
If self-determination involves determination by my rational self, then it requires self-realization and real freedom. Here, we should remember Green’s Kantian claim that rational nature provides not only the ground of duty but also its content. Moral personality and freedom involve a will that has reasons-responsive capacities. But then self-determination should be expressed in activities that reflect and realize these rational capacities (PE §§175, 180, 199, 234, 238–39, 247, 283). Full or complete self-determination requires not just the capacity to be guided by reasons but this aretaic sense of self-determination. On Green’s view, this kind of self-determination and self-realization involve a constitutive commitment to a cosmopolitan concern for the common good.
4. Idealist Politics
Green’s political philosophy is expressed in his posthumously published Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation and his 1881 essay “Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract”. His perfectionist ethics influence his politics. He provides the philosophical foundations for a new progressive form of liberalism that transcends the laissez-faire liberalism characteristic of some strands in nineteenth century British liberalism (Nicholson 1990). The state has a duty to promote the common good, and individual rights are constrained by the common good. This gives the state not just negative duties to refrain from interfering with the freedoms of its citizens but also positive duties to provide resources and opportunities for individual self-realization.
4.1 Rights and the Common Good
Green’s Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation discuss a number of issues in political philosophy and jurisprudence, including the adequacy of social contract justifications of the nature and limits of state authority, the nature of rights, the right to private property, and the justification of punishment. Most relevant to understanding Green’s distinctive perfectionist conception of liberalism is his conception of rights.
Green’s focus on political obligation concerns the nature and limits of the state’s enforceable demands on its citizens (LPPO §§1, 12). Social contract theory seeks to anchor political obligation in agreement, whether actual or hypothetical. Green discusses the social contract theories of Spinoza, Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau. Though critical of social contract theory in general, he is especially critical of Hobbes and expresses sympathy with important elements in Locke and Rousseau.
Green’s criticisms of social contract theory reflect his conception of rights. According to Green, rights are claims that individuals possess to those powers that are socially recognizable as contributing to a common good (LPPO §§25–26, 113–115, 138, 143). In particular, Green thinks that my rights against others to certain normative powers are conditional on my recognition that others possess rights to these same powers against me (LPPO §138). Green rejects the idea of natural rights as rights prior to society but accepts the idea of natural rights as prior to and independent of the positive rights established by political association (LPPO §§9, 16, 30).
This conception of rights leads Green to be skeptical of attempts to explain how rights might emerge from a pre-social state of nature. Hobbes is Green’s primary target here, because Hobbes views the state of nature as an anti-social condition involving the war of all against all (Leviathan XIII 8–9) and claims that individual rights, or at least individual rights to anything other than non-interference, are possible only when individuals agree to leave the state of nature and transfer powers to a sovereign (Leviathan XIII 10, 13; XIV 1; XV 3). Green is skeptical in two ways. First, he doesn’t see how agreement could establish political obligation if there are no moral duties in the state of nature (LPPO §46). If the sovereign is necessary to make promises binding, then we can’t explain how the sovereign could himself arise out of binding pre-political compact. Second, Green’s conception of rights leads him to deny the Hobbesian claim that rights and duties depend on the existence of the sovereign. Rights depend on the common good, and there are facts about the common good prior to political association and positive right.
Green’s criticisms of Hobbes apply less clearly to Locke and Rousseau. Locke’s state of nature, though pre-political, is not anti-social, and Locke recognizes duties and rights in the state of nature (Treatises II.ii.6; II.i.14; II.iii.16–21; II.vi.57). For Locke, the transition from the state of nature to civil government is to facilitate the more reliable and efficient protection of natural rights, the protection of property, and the promotion of the public good, all of which are moral demands within the state of nature (Treatises II.vii.85; cf. LPPO §§55–58).
Green has even more in common with Rousseau. Rousseau sees the problem of political obligation as one of reconciling political association and its constraints with individual autonomy. The state of nature is a pre-political state but one in which individuals are socially interdependent. The problem is to
Find a form of association which defends and protects with all common force the person and goods of each associate, and by means of which each one, while uniting with all, nevertheless obeys only himself and remains as free as before. (Social Contract I.vi.4)
The solution to this problem is for individuals to submit to constraints embodied in forms of association and institutions that are regulated by the general will (SC I.vi.9; II.i.1). The general will is distinct from the will of all (SC I.vi.7; II.iii2) and concerns the common good—those basic interests of moral persons that must be respected and protected for all (SC II.iii.1–2; II.iv.5; II.xi.1–2). Green agrees with Rousseau that the general will, understood as the common good, is a source of rights and that these rights are conditional on a kind of mutual recognition among members of society.
Green disagrees with those strands in social contract theory that see consent to live in political society as the source of rights. He thinks that rights are grounded in the common good and mutual recognition and so predate any social contract. In assessing Green’s criticisms of social contract theory, one must assess Green’s own conception of rights. Are rights grounded in the common good, and do rights require social recognition in some way?
It seems we do need to ground rights in some way. Grounding them in the common good seems promising, though we won’t know what rights this conception supports without knowing more about the content of the common good. Insofar as the common good is one in which people partake equally insofar as they are moral persons, this conception seems likely to support a conception of equal rights to those conditions necessary for developing and exercising moral powers of persons as agents. These claims about the content of the common good are reflected in Green’s brand of perfectionist liberalism.
Must such rights be socially recognized? Even if social recognition allows Green to distinguish natural and legal right, we might wonder if he can distinguish between natural rights and duties and rights and duties recognized by positive morality (see, e.g., Ross 1930: 50–52). The social recognition thesis may seem to preclude making sense of minority rights or unrecognized rights. Green addresses this issue and makes two replies, which clarify the social recognition thesis (LPPO §§137–147). First, he does not claim that particular rights need to be the object of social recognition. It is rather that rights must be contributory to a common good that is the object of mutual recognition. My claim to respect and rights are conditioned on my recognition that others have the same claim to respect and rights, because we are equally moral persons (LPPO §§138; cf. Hinton 2001). Still, this claim might suggest that individuals lack rights if others do not recognize them as equal moral persons, and this might seem to imply a form of moral conventionalism or parochialism, which would be at odds with Green’s own cosmopolitanism. For this reason, it is important that Green insists that the sort of social recognition that rights require is potential, rather than actual, recognition.
The condition of its [a right’s] being so claimable is that its exercise should be contributory to some social good which the public conscience is capable of appreciating, not necessarily one which in the existing prevalence of private interest can obtain due acknowledgement, but still one of which men in their actions and language show themselves to be aware. (LPPO §143)
In this way, Green recognizes that slaves have natural rights to freedom that are violated, even in societies in which slavery is socially condoned (LPPO §140). Provided that others are capable of recognizing someone’s common humanity, their failure to do so is no obstacle to the recognition of the rights of others.
4.2 Progressive Liberalism
Like Mill, Green is committed to liberal essentials—a largely secular state, democratic political institutions in which the franchise is widespread, private property rights, market economies, equal opportunity, and a variety of personal and civic liberties. Also like Mill, Green is a perfectionist liberal, who thinks that the justification of liberal essentials is grounded in a conception of the common good that understands the good of each in terms of self-realization.
Green’s perfectionist liberalism was influential in the formation of a New Liberalism in late 19th century Britain (e.g., Richter 1964; Nicholson 1990; Brink 2003: §XXIV). The Old Liberalism was concerned with negative liberty and sought to undo state restrictions on liberties and opportunities and was expressed in the repeal of the Corn Laws, opposition to religious persecution, and several electoral reforms that extended the scope of the franchise to include the rural and urban poor. By contrast, the New Liberalism thought that the defense of liberty and opportunity had to be supplemented by social and economic reforms in labor, health, and education to address the effects of social and economic inequality (e.g., Freeden 1978; Nicholson 1990: ch. 5; Simhony and Weinstein 2001). Green was viewed by many as an important intellectual source for the New Liberals. He supported
- regulation of labor contracts to limit workplace hours and factory conditions (Works II 515; III 365–69, 373),
- measures to provide greater opportunities for agricultural workers to own land (Works II 515, 532–34; III 377–82),
- public health and safety regulations (Works II 515; III 373–74),
- education reforms, improving access to elementary, secondary, and higher education, regardless of socioeconomic status (Works II 515; III 369, 387–476; V 285–86, 326–28), and
- the improvement of educational and economic opportunities for women (PE §267; Works V 326–28).
Green’s liberalism is a perfectionist liberalism in which the state aims to promote the self-realization of its citizens, and this gives the state a number of positive duties in relation to its citizens. But the importance of autonomy to self-realization means that the state’s positive role is restricted to enabling its citizens to perfect themselves.
[I]t is the business of the state, not indeed directly to promote moral goodness, for that, from the very nature of moral goodness, it cannot do, but to maintain the conditions without which a free exercise of the human faculties is impossible. (“Liberal Legislation,” Works III 374)
Green’s claim here bears comparison with Kant’s insistence in the Metaphysics of Morals on a self/other asymmetry in which we must aim at our own perfection but at the happiness, rather than the perfection, of others. In explaining this asymmetry, Kant writes:
So too, it is a contradiction for me to make another’s perfection my end and consider myself under an obligation to promote this. For the perfection of another human being, as a person, consists just in this: that he himself is able to set his end in accordance with his own conception of duty; and it is self-contradictory to require that I do (make it my duty to do) something that only the other himself can do. (6: 386)
Green makes sense of Kant’s admonitions against aiming at the perfection of another by interpreting them as constraints on how we aim at the perfection of others (Brink 2019: 12–15). Given the role of one’s own agency in one’s perfection, I can’t perfect others any more than I can win competitive races for them. But just as I can help another to win a race by training with her, discussing strategy, and sharing nutritional tips, so too I can help others perfect themselves by helping them develop their normative competence and deliberating with them, identifying options, discussing the comparative merits of these options, and providing them with opportunities to exercise their normative powers. I can help others perfect themselves, just not in ways that bypass their agency. In this way, the state can and should promote the self-realization of its citizens by enabling, rather than coercing, them.
Though the Old Liberals see themselves as the advocates of freedom, Green thinks that the New Liberals have a claim to beings liberals in the fullest sense, because only a mix of negative and positive reforms can enable the perfection and self-realization of its citizens and, hence, true freedom.
5. Idealist Religion and History
Green had profoundly moralized conceptions of religion and history. Both conceptions were influenced by his idealist metaphysics and ethics.
Green was a deeply religious person, but his conception of Christianity was unorthodox and animated by moral and humanistic principles. He was raised in the Evangelical faith by his father, an Evangelical minister. At Balliol, his religious sensibility was shaped in part by Jowett, who sought to present fundamental Christian principles in a contemporary and rational idiom, free of superstition, ritual, and dogma. Jowett’s example shaped Green’s developing conception of a form of Christianity that admits of rational philosophical reconstruction, that denies the literal significance to miracles or other supernatural events described in the Bible, and that finds Christianity’s best expression in social and political service in pursuit of a common good.
Green’s own conception of God is ambivalent. On the one hand, he identifies the eternal self-consciousness of absolute idealism with God. Green thinks that self-conscious minds are conditions of conscious experience and not themselves part of conscious experience, with the result that they are outside of space and time. What is true of individual minds is true of the corporate mind that Green thinks makes objectivity possible. This would make God a transcendent reality. On the other hand, Green has strong reason to regard God as immanent in the world. Self-consciousness expresses itself in the will, which is the cause of action. If so, self-consciousness cannot be outside of space and time. Moreover, Green saw God as immanent in individuals and in history. The higher principle of practical reason within each person that regulates his desires and makes him a moral agent is a divine principle, the common good is the proper object of the divine principle in humanity, and its progressive realization in human laws and institutions is how God manifests himself to the world (Works III 223–27). One cannot separate Green’s unorthodox form of Christianity from his idealist philosophy and his ethical demand that individuals subordinate their lower selves to the pursuit of a higher, common good.
As we have seen, Green treats perfection, freedom, and the common good as regulative ideals at which we aim, which humanity better approximates over time. This is illustrated in the gradual expansion of the scope of the common good to include persons previously excluded from full moral personality, such as slaves, women, and workers (PE Book III, esp. §§205–206, 271, 285). It is also illustrated in our progressively more adequate conception of the conditions of self-realization and the demands on government to promote the perfection of its citizens. Like Hegel, Green has a progressive view of history, which he sees as the progressively more adequate realization of the demands of perfection, the common good, and true freedom (PE §§172–76; “Freedom,” Works II 330; LPPO §6).
6. Idealist Metaphysics and Ethics
Now that we have surveyed Green’s metaphysics and ethics, it’s worth asking how they are related. One question is whether Green’s ethics is dependent on his metaphysics and, if so, in what ways. Another question is about the priority, if any, between individual and collective levels of self-consciousness and value.
Is Green’s perfectionist ethical theory dependent on his idealist metaphysics? If so, his perfectionism is hostage to his idealism, and doubts about his metaphysics may threaten his perfectionism. The Prolegomena to Ethics is Green’s most systematic work, and its structure might suggest that his perfectionist ethics of self-realization developed in Books II-IV rest on the idealist metaphysics defended in Book I. Certainly, many interpreters have accepted this kind of interdependence of Green’s metaphysics and ethics (e.g., Nicholson 2006, Armour 2006, and Mander 2006). However, several of Green’s writings in practical philosophy—notably, the essay “Liberal Legislation” and his Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation—are not preceded by elaborate metaphysical discussions or arguments for absolute idealism. Moreover, even if we look at the Prolegomena, much of the argument against hedonism and in favor of perfectionism and the common good are intelligible and assessable without recourse to doctrines of absolute idealism. It’s true that self-consciousness plays a crucial role in both epistemic and practical agency. If idealism meant nothing more than the importance of self-consciousness to knowledge and moral personality, that might provide a kind of unity to Green’s metaphysics and ethics. It would represent the crucial idealist metaphysical claim as a comparatively modest and plausible one. But those claims about the importance of self-consciousness do not require any specifically idealist metaphysical claims that reality is limited to what is or can be an object of consciousness. Indeed, we have seen that there is a tension between Green’s moral psychology and his idealist metaphysics. Green thinks that responsibility consists in capacities for self-conscious reflection and assessment of one’s desires and options and that self-realization or perfection consists in the proper exercise of these reasons-responsive capacities. Green’s perfectionist ethics require that self-conscious minds play this causal role in the will and action, and that is inconsistent with the assumption in Green’s idealist metaphysics that self-conscious minds lie outside of space and time (Irwin 2009: §1235).
Another question about Green’s metaphysics and ethics is the relation between individual and collective levels of analysis. Consider the priority of individual and corporate consciousness in Green’s metaphysics. It is clear that the individual is prior in order of discovery. We begin by trying to understand an individual’s conscious experience and knowledge. This leads Green to embrace local idealism, understood as the claim that reality or knowable reality cannot concern things as they are in themselves, independently of how they do or can appear to individual thinkers. Indeed, discussion of an individual’s experience and knowledge occupies the bulk of Book I of the Prolegomena. Green then invokes the supposition that there is a single corporate consciousness of which individual consciousnesses are proper parts to avoid an incommensurable plurality of individual-specific realities and to explain the possibility of objectivity. On one reading, individual idealism remains primary, not just in the order of discovery but also in the order of explanation and justification. Green thinks inquiry supports individual idealism, and absolute idealism is a kind of philosophical speculation about how one might try to ground objectivity for individual consciousness. On another reading, Green might think that though individual idealism is prior in the order of discovery to absolute idealism, reflection about the possibility of objectivity shows that absolute idealism is prior in order of explanation or justification. On this view, corporate or eternal consciousness is the only substance and individual consciousness are accidents of this substance.
There are also interesting issues about the individual and collective levels of analysis in Green’s ethics. On the one hand, there is a tendency to read the British idealists as anti-individualists, which might seem to apply to Green (e.g., Berlin 1958, Quinton 1971). After all, there is the reading of his ethics on which it depends not just on his idealism but also on his absolute idealism. Moreover, Green’s claims about the importance of individuals seeking a permanent good that transcends their individual limitations and about the regulation of each person’s good by a noncompetitive common good might seem to support this anti-individualist reading.
On the other hand, there are a number of reasons to resist this anti-individualist reading of Green. First, as we have seen, it may not be necessary or desirable to see Green’s perfectionist ethics as resting on his idealist metaphysics, much less his absolute idealism. Second, Green’s claims about the importance of a permanent good and the common good may be defensible from individualist premises. Book II of the Prolegomena begins with a focus on individual practical agency and the personal good, much as Book I begins with a focus on individual epistemic agency and knowledge. Green argues that individuals have reason to see their own interests extended by participation in larger projects in community with others, and this, he claims, gives them reason to seek a common good.
We can identify two different ways of linking the personal good and the common good. One way is from the outside-in, arguing that the common good is explanatorily prior to the personal good and that the good of individuals is just whatever is contributory to the good of some collective, whether that be God, humanity, or some more local community. Another way is from the inside-out, arguing that the personal good is more complete when it includes the right sort of association with others and includes the pursuit of a common good. Framed this way, there’s a strong case to be made for the inside-out reading of Green’s ethics. As we’ve seen, the structure of the argument in Books II–III of the Prolegomena has this inside-out character. This interpretation is reinforced by claims Green makes in his “Freedom” essay. Recall that Green identifies true freedom with determination by practical reason and perfect self-realization. He distinguishes between Christian (Pauline) and Kantian conceptions of freedom, on the one hand, and a Hegelian conception, on the other hand (Works II 312–15). The principal difference seems to be in whom freedom is realized. Green thinks that the Christian and Kantian see the individual as the locus of freedom, whereas Hegel treats the state as the locus of freedom. In this debate, Green sides with the Christian and Kantian.
On the other hand, it would seem that we cannot significantly speak of freedom except with reference to individual persons; that only in them can freedom be realised; that therefore the realisation of freedom in the state can only mean the attainment of freedom by individuals through influences which the state (in the wide sense spoken of) supplies—“freedom” here, as before, meaning not mere self-determination which renders us responsible, but determination by reasons, “autonomy of the will”…. (Works II 314)
Here, Green makes explicit that he understands the link between the personal good, freedom, and the common good from the inside-out.
This fits with a common observation about the traditions and individuals who influenced Green. Perhaps the strongest influences are the Greeks, especially Aristotle, Kant, and Hegel. It is not uncommon for readers to emphasize the Hegelian dimensions of Green. But despite Green’s sympathy with some Hegelian commitments—idealism, a progressive view of history, and the importance of freedom—his version of these commitments and the ways he defends them show fairly little direct influence by Hegel. Moreover, many of the most important elements of Green’s perfectionism—especially the ethics of self-realization, its grounding in rational agency, and its concern with the common good—are traceable to the influence of Aristotle and Kant. It is perhaps not unreasonable to follow Sidgwick who regards Green principally as a Kantian (Lectures 3; Irwin 2009: §1234) or, even better, Green’s student D.G. Ritchie who suggests that it is perhaps best to say that Green “… corrected Kant by Aristotle and Aristotle by Kant” (1891: 139–140).
7. Concluding Remarks
Green was perhaps the most important figure within the tradition of British idealism. But the significance of his idealism extends beyond that tradition. His defenses of idealist metaphysics and epistemology and absolute idealism make interesting contributions to an idealist tradition that includes Berkeley, Kant, Fichte, Hegel, and Bradley, among others. His idealist approach to ethics embraces a perfectionist theory of self-realization committed to rich conceptions of freedom and the common good that aims to synthesize the best elements in Greek eudaimonism and Kantian rationalism. Though perfectionism is an underappreciated tradition, Green makes enduring contributions to that tradition. Green’s perfectionism leads him to develop a progressive conception of liberalism that was influential in British politics in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries and that bears comparison with contemporary conceptions of liberalism.
The references are divided into primary sources, including both Green’s writings and other relevant historical texts, and secondary sources. The division between other primary historical sources and secondary sources is sometimes somewhat arbitrary. Primary sources are cited using short titles or abbreviations, as indicated, and secondary sources are cited by year of publication.
A. Primary Sources
A.1 Green’s Writings
This is a list of Green’s principal published and unpublished philosophical writings on which the present entry draws.
- Works of T.H. Green, 3 vols., Richard Lewis Nettleship (ed.), London: Longmans, Green, and Co., 1885–1888. Nettleship’s edition contains Green’s main philosophical publications (except the Prolegomena to Ethics), miscellaneous lectures, and Nettleship’s memoir of Green.
- [Works] Collected Works of T.H. Green, 5 vols., Peter P. Nicholson (ed.), Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1997. Cited as Works. The first three volumes of Nicholson’s edition reprint Nettleship’s edition, the fourth volume contains the 1883 edition of the Prolegomena to Ethics, and the fifth volume contains additional unpublished essays, lectures, and selected correspondence.
- 1874–75, The Philosophical Works of David Hume, 4 vols., T.H. Green and T.H. Grose (eds), London: Longmans, Green, and Co. Green wrote the introductions to Hume’s Treatise in the first and second volumes. Green’s introductions to the Treatise are reprinted in Works I, 1–371, and its main themes are incorporated into Book I of Green’s Prolegomena to Ethics.
- 1881, “Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract”. Originally published in 1881 and in Works III, 365–386. Cited as “Liberal Legislation.”
- 1882, “Can There Be a Natural Science of Man?” Mind, original series, 7(25): 1–29, 7(26): 161–185, 7(27): 321–348. This three-part article appeared in the year of Green’s death and was incorporated into Book I of the Prolegomena. [doi:10.1093/mind/os-VII.25.1, doi:10.1093/mind/os-VII.26.161, doi:10.1093/mind/os-VII.27.321]
- [PE] 1883, Prolegomena to Ethics, A.C. Bradley (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press. Cited as Prolegomena or PE. The Prolegomena was published posthumously in 1883. A.C. Bradley edited Green’s unfinished manuscript and supplied a useful analytical table of contents. The Prolegomena was out of print for many years. It is reprinted in Works IV. A recent edition is T.H. Green, Prolegomena to Ethics, edited by D. Brink, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2003, which follows Bradley’s 1883 edition and contains a substantial introduction.
- Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant. Published posthumously in Works II, 1–155, and cited as Lectures on Kant. There are two lectures, one on Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and one on Kant’s Metaphysics of Ethics.]
- “On the Different Senses of ‘Freedom’ as Applied to Will and the Moral Progress of Man”. Published posthumously in Works II, 308–333, and cited as “Freedom.”
- [LPPO] Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation. Published posthumously in Works II, 335–553, and cited as LPPO by section number.
More comprehensive bibliographies of Green’s published and unpublished writings can be found in Works V; Thomas 1987; and Tyler 2018.
A.2 Other Primary Sources
- Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, T. Irwin (trans.), third edition, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2019.
- –––, Politics, in The Revised Oxford Translation of the Complete Works of Aristotle, 2 vols., J. Barnes (ed.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1984.
- Bradley, F.H., 1876, Ethical Studies, Oxford: Clarendon Press. Second edition, revised, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1927.
- –––, 1893, Appearance and Reality, London: George Allen and Unwin.
- –––, 1914, Essays on Truth and Reality, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Butler, Joseph, 1726, Fifteen Sermons Preached at Rolls Chapel, London: J. and J. Knapton. Collected in Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel and, A Dissertation Upon the Nature of Virtue, Walter Robert Matthews (ed.), G. Bell, 1914. Reprinted 1953.
- Fichte, Johann Gottlieb, 1794, Grundlage der gesammten Wissenschaftslehre, Leipzig. Translated as The Science of Knowledge, P. Heath and J. Lachs (eds/trans), New York: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
- Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, 1807, Phänomenologie des Geistes, Bamburg and Würzburg: Goebbardt. Translated as Phenomenology of Spirit, A. V. Miller (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
- –––, 1821, Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts, Berlin. Translated as Hegel’s Philosophy of Right, Thomas Malcolm Knox (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1952.
- Hobbes, Thomas, 1651, Leviathan, London. Reprinted, E. Curley (ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1994. Cited by chapter and paragraph number.
- Hume, David, 1739–40, A Treatise of Human Nature, 3 volumes, London. Reprinted, P.H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978. Cited as Treatise, by book, part, and section number.
- Kant, Immanuel, 1781/1787, Kritik der reinen Vernunft, Riga. Translated as Critique of Pure Reason, N.K. Smith, New York: Macmillan, 1963. Citations to A/B editions.
- –––, 1785, Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, Riga. Translated as Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals in his Practical Philosophy, 37–108. Cited as Groundwork, by volume (4) and page number in the Prussian Academy edition.
- –––, 1788, Kritik der praktischen Vernunft), Riga. Translated as Critique of Practical Reason in his Practical Philosophy, 133–272. Cited by volume (5) and page number in the Prussian Academy edition.
- –––, 1797, Die Metaphysik der Sitten, Königsberg. Translated as The Metaphysics of Morals in his Practical Philosophy, 353–604. Cited by volume (6) and page number in the Prussian Academy edition.
- –––, 1996, Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (ed./trans.), New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511813306
- Locke, John, 1689, Two Treatises of Government, London. Reprinted, Peter Laslett (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1968. Cited as Treatises, and by treatise, chapter, and section number.
- –––, 1690, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, London. Reprinted, P.H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979. Cited as Essay, by book, chapter, and section number.
- Mill, John Stuart, The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, 33 volumes, John M. Robson (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1963–91.
- –––, 1859, On Liberty, London: John W. Parker & Son. Reprinted in Collected Works XVIII.
- –––, 1861, Utilitarianism, London: Parker, Son, and Bourn. Reprinted in Collected Works X. Cited by chapter and paragraph number and by page number in Collected Works.
- –––, 1861, Considerations on Representative Government, London: Parker, Son, and Bourn. Reprinted in Collected Works XIX.
- Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1762, Du contrat social; ou Principes du droit politique, Amsterdam: Marc Michel Rey. Translated as On the Social Contract in Jean-Jacques Rousseau, The Basic Political Writings, ed. D. Cress, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987. Cited as Social Contract or SC and by book, chapter, and paragraph number.
- Sidgwick, Henry, 1874 , The Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan. Seventh edition, London: Macmillan, 1907. Cited as Methods; page numbers from the 1907 edition.
- –––, 1888, “The Kantian Conception of Free Will,” Mind, original series, 13(51): 405–412. Reprinted as an appendix to the 1907 edition of Methods. doi:10.1093/mind/os-XIII.51.405
- –––, 1901, “The Philosophy of T. H. Green,” Mind, 10(1): 18–29. doi:10.1093/mind/X.1.18
- –––, 1902, Lectures on the Ethics of T.H. Green, Mr. Herbert Spencer, and J. Martineau, London: Macmillan. Cited as Lectures.
B. Secondary Sources
- Armour, Leslie, 2006, “Green’s Idealism and the Metaphysics of Ethics,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 160–186. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0007
- Berlin, Isaiah, 1958, “Two Concepts of Liberty,” inaugural lecture, Oxford, 31 October, 1958, Oxford: Clarendon Press; reprinted in Isaiah Berlin, Four Essays on Liberty, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1969, 118–172.
- Bosanquet, Bernard, 1899, The Philosophical Theory of the State, London: Macmillan; fouth edition, London: Macmillan, 1923.
- Brink, David O., 1997, “Self-Love and Altruism,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 14(1): 122–157. doi:10.1017/S0265052500001709
- –––, 2003, Perfectionism and the Common Good: Themes in the Philosophy of T. H. Green, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0199266409.001.0001
- –––, 2006, “Self‐Realization and the Common Good: Themes in T. H. Green,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 17–46. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0002
- –––, 2013, Mill’s Progressive Principles, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199672141.001.0001
- –––, 2018, “Eudaimonism and Cosmopolitan Concern,” in Virtue, Happiness, and Knowledge: Themes from the Work of Gail Fine and Terence Irwin, David O. Brink, Susan Sauvé Meyer, and Christopher Shields (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, ch. 15, 270–292.
- –––, 2019, “Normative Perfectionism and the Kantian Tradition,” Philosopher’s Imprint, 19: art. 45. [Brink 2019 available online]
- Cohen, Joshua, 2010, Rousseau: A Free Community of Equals, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199581498.001.0001
- Dimova-Cookson, Maria, 2001, T.H. Green’s Moral and Political Philosophy: A Phenomenological Perspective, London: Palgrave.
- Dimova-Cookson, Maria and William J. Mander (eds.), 2006, T. H. Green: Ethics, Metaphysics, and Political Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.001.0001
- Freeden, Michael, 1978, The New Liberalism: An Ideology of Social Reform, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198229612.001.0001
- Gaus, Gerald F., 2006, “The Rights Recognition Thesis: Defending and Extending Green,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 209–235. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0009
- Hinton, Timothy, 2001, “The Perfectionist Liberalism of T.H. Green,” Social Theory and Practice, 27(3): 473–499. doi:10.5840/soctheorpract20012736
- Hobhouse, L.T., 1911, Liberalism, London: Henry Holt.
- –––, 1918, The Metaphysical Theory of the State: A Criticism, London: Allen & Unwin.
- Hurka, Thomas, 1993, Perfectionism, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0195101162.001.0001
- Hylton, Peter, 1990, Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/019824018X.001.0001
- Irwin, Terence H., 1984, “Morality and Personality: Kant and Green,” in Self and Nature in Kant’s Philosophy, Allen W. Wood (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 31–56.
- –––, 1992, “Eminent Victorians and Greek Ethics: Sidgwick, Green, and Aristotle,” in Essays on Henry Sidgwick, Bart Schultz (ed.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 279–310. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172363.012
- –––, 2006, “Green’s Criticism of the British Moralists,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 106–136. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0005
- –––, 2009, The Development of Ethics (Volume 3: From Kant to Rawls), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Mander, William J., 2006, “In Defence of the Eternal Consciousness,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 187–206. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0008
- –––, 2011, British Idealism: A History, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199559299.001.0001
- ––– (ed.), 2014, The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199594474.001.0001
- –––, 2016, Idealist Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198748892.001.0001
- Martin, Rex, 2001, “T. H. Green on Individual Rights and the Common Good,” in Simhony and Weinstein 2001: 49–68. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511558337.003
- Nettleship, Richard Lewis, 1885, “Memoir of T.H. Green,” in Works III, xi-clxi.
- Neuhouser, Frederick, 1990, Fichte’s Theory of Subjectivity, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511624827
- –––, 2000, Foundations of Hegel’s Social Theory: Actualizing Freedom, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Nicholson, Peter, 1990, The Political Philosophy of the British Idealists, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2006, “Green’s ‘Eternal Consciousness’,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 139–159. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0006
- Quinton, Anthony M., 1971. “Absolute Idealism,” Dawes Hicks Lecture on Philosophy, read 27 October 1971, Proceedings of the British Academy, 57: 303–329.
- Richter, Melvin, 1964, The Politics of Conscience: T.H. Green and His Age, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Ritchie, D.G., 1891, The Principles of State Interference: Four Essays on the Political Philosophy of Mr. Herbert Spencer, J.S. Mill, and T.H. Green, London: Swan Sonnenschein.
- Ross, W.D., 1930, The Right and the Good, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Simhony, Avital, 2001, “T. H. Green’s Complex Common Good: Between Liberalism and Communitarianism,” in Simhony and Weinstein 2001: 69–91. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511558337.004
- Simhony, Avital and David Weinstein (eds.), 2001, The New Liberalism: Reconciling Liberty and Community, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511558337
- Skorupski, John, 2006, “Green and the Idealist Conception of a Person’s Good,” in Dimova-Cookson and Mander 2006: 47–75. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271665.003.0003
- –––, 2021, Being and Freedom: On Late Modern Ethics in Europe, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198716761.001.0001
- Thomas, Geoffrey, 1987, The Moral Philosophy of T.H. Green, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Tyler, Colin, 2010, The Metaphysics of Self-Realisation and Freedom: Part 1 of The Liberal Socialism of Thomas Hill Green, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2018, Bibliography of Thomas Hill Green (1836–1882), Working Paper Series: Number 3, Centre for Idealism and the New Liberalism [Tyler 2018 available online].
- Ward, Mary Augusta [Mrs. Humphry], 1888, Robert Elsmere, London: Macmillan.
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Other Internet Resources
- Tyler, Colin, “Thomas Hill Green,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2021/entries/green/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Centre for Idealism and the New Liberalism, University of Hull.
- Green’s Grave and Memorial Information at St. Sepulchre’s Cemetery, Oxford.