Notes to Happiness

1. This article focuses on the standard division between descriptive and evaluative senses of ‘happiness’ (see also Feldman 2010, Sumner 1996). But that distinction may be challenged, or there might be evaluative elements in the “psychological” sense of ‘happiness’ even if it is not equivalent to well-being. For example, some argue that pleasure is itself partly an evaluative kind (e.g., Goldstein 1989). Phillips et al. have argued that the folk concept of happiness is be a mix of psychological and evaluative, drawing on a series of studies (Phillips, Misenheimer, et al. 2011; Phillips et al. 2017).

2. This claim holds only as a rough generalization, with some exceptions. Chekola 2007 and Murphy 2001, for instance, appear to use ‘happiness’ as a descriptive term for a life that is successful from the agent’s point of view. While there are other senses of ‘happiness’ and cognates, this article discusses only the main philosophically significant uses of ‘happiness’ and cognates; on other senses, see Davis 1981b, Goldstein 1973, Suikkanen 2011 and Thomas 1968. Readers should note that many philosophical works do not clearly distinguish the psychological and well-being notions, and it is not always clear how a given author employs the term. In some cases ‘happiness’ takes neither the psychological nor well-being meaning, and so it may be unclear how the discussion relates to broader philosophical debates such as those covered in this article. A further wrinkle is that there is a growing body of non-Western and cross-cultural work on happiness, and it is plausible that the philosophical landscape depicted in this article will need revision if it is to accommodate the diversity of human thinking about (or not thinking about, as the case may be) happiness and well-being. See, for example, a 2019 special issue on “Cross-Cultural Studies of Well-Being” assembled by Flanagan, Letourneau and Zhao, including Flanagan et al. 2019, Euler 2019 and Zhang 2019 among others; also, Joshanloo 2013, Joshanloo and Weijers 2019, Purcell 2014, and Samson 2019. The largest body of non-Western scholarship on happiness, usually in something like the well-being sense, engages with Asian philosophy and religion; e.g., Fraser 2013, Ho et al. 2014, Joshanloo 2014, Kim 2020, Luo 2018, Wong 2013, and Zhang 2019.

3. Possible examples of theories grounded in failures properly to distinguish these projects include Smart and Hare’s accounts, on which happiness is basically about one’s mental states; but it is also partly evaluative, in that (for example) we cannot properly call someone happy if we find her desires, pleasures, circumstances, etc. to be repulsive or otherwise undesirable (Hare 1963, Smart 1973; see also Nozick 1989). It is not clear what the point of such a concept would be, or what of substance—rather than merely linguistic usage—is at issue between such theories and other accounts of ‘happiness.’ While the main philosophical issues relate to matters of substance, it may sometimes be useful to pursue a linguistic approach focused on the meaning of “happiness.” For example, in a textbook surveying philosophical theories of happiness it might be desirable to cover the full range of philosophical work under that rubric, leaving it open whether the literature on ‘happiness’ concerns one, two, or more subject matters. A risk of that approach is that some commentators stipulate that their theories are not in competition with much of the literature on “happiness,” so that it would be misleading to suggest that, for example, Aristotle (in English translation) and Sumner disagree about the nature of happiness. Any apparent disagreement is purely verbal.

4. For some recent examples of articles on the well-being sense, see Angier 2015, Capuccino 2013, Cashen 2012, Kristjánsson 2010, 2012, 2018, and Vitrano 2010. Most historical work on “happiness,” at least in pre-modern philosophy, employs the well-being sense. Most empirical researchers employ the term in the psychological sense; for an apparent exception, see Seligman 2002, though he has lately shifted focus away from the term ‘happiness’ (Seligman 2011). For reviews of the philosophical literature, see Badhwar 2015, Den Uyl and Machan 1983, and the chapters in Section III of David et al. 2015. Accessible introductory texts include Mulnix and Mulnix 2015a. Recent anthologies of the philosophical literature include Cahn and Vitrano 2008 and Mulnix and Mulnix 2015b. Bortolotti 2009 and Snow and Trivigno 2014 are edited collections of new papers. An accessible collection of papers by philosophers and other researchers can be found in the Spring 2004 issue of Daedalus. An influential discussion of different happiness concepts, focusing mainly on the well-being notion, is Kraut 1979.

5. See, e.g., Blackson 2009; Brandt 1959, Brandt 1979, 1989, 1992; Campbell 1973; Carson 1978a, 1978b, 1979, 1981; Davis 1981b, 1981a; Ebenstein 1991; Feldman 2010; Griffin 1979, 1986; Kazez 2007; Mayerfeld 1996, 1999; Morris 2011; Sen 1987a; Sprigge 1987, 1991; Wilson 1968; Zamuner 2013. For a recent extended defense of hedonism about happiness, see Feldman 2010. Among psychologists, see e.g. Parducci 1995 and Kahneman 1999.

6. Variants of the life satisfaction view appear to include Barrow 1980, 1991, Benditt 1974, 1978, Brülde 2007, Buss 2004, Campbell 1973, Goldman 2016, 2019, Montague 1967, Mulligan 2016, Nozick 1989, Rescher 1972, 1980, Skidelsky 2017, Suikkanen 2011, Sumner 1996, 2000, Telfer 1980, and Von Wright 1963. While Goldman and Mulligan characterize happiness as an emotion, the relevant emotion appears to constitute an attitude of life satisfaction. Those making life satisfaction central or identical to well-being, or “happiness” in the well-being sense, appear to include (in addition to some of the aforementioned authors) Almeder 2000, Kekes 1982, 1988, 1992, McFall 1989, Meynell 1969, Scruton 1975, Tatarkiewicz 1976, Thomas 1968, Tiberius 2008, Tiberius and Plakias 2010, Vitrano 2010. Empirical researchers often identify life satisfaction and happiness—notably, Veenhoven 1984, 1997.

7. Emotional state theories seem to have become the most common view in the last decade or so. Authors who appear to endorse some form of this approach include Badhwar 2014, Becker 2012, Besser-Jones 2013, Haybron 2005, 2008b, Kauppinen 2013, Klausen 2015, 2019, de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2014, May 2015, Raibley 2011, Rodogno 2016, Rossi 2018, Rossi and Tappolet 2016, Sizer 2010, Tiberius 2018, Višak 2015, and possibly Bok 2010b. A prominent contribution from the lay literature is Ricard 2006. For discussions of particular emotions and moods in the context of happiness or well-being, see Griswold 1996 on tranquility and Roberts 2019 on joy. Because hedonistic and emotional state theories have seldom been distinguished, some ostensibly “hedonistic” approaches to happiness might more accurately be characterized as emotional state views. Among empirical researchers, for instance, affect-based approaches to happiness are typically described as hedonistic, yet normally focus on moods and emotions rather than (e.g.) sensory pleasures and pains.

8. The moniker “affect-based” is problematic given that some variants of hedonism conceive of pleasure in non-affective terms, for instance as an attitude of liking or being pleased, where this attitude need not involve affect (e.g., Feldman 2004, 2010). It is possible that such theories, which bear similarities to the life satisfaction view, should be distinguished from more familiar varieties of hedonism.

9. On the significance of life satisfaction for well-being research, see Alexandrova 2005, 2008, Tiberius and Plakias 2010.

10. See Alexandrova 2005, 2008, Tiberius 2006, Tiberius and Plakias 2010, Suikkanen 2011.

11. For recent discussions of measurement issues, see, e.g., Adler 2019, Alexandrova 2017, Alexandrova and Haybron 2016, Angner 2008, 2009, 2010, 2011, 2013, de Boer 2014, Cohen Kaminitz forthcoming, Fleurbaey and Blanchet 2013, Hausman 2010, Haybron 2016, OECD 2013, White 2013, Skidelsky 2014, Stiglitz et al. 2009, van der Deijl 2016a, 2016b, 2017, Wodak 2019, Wren-Lewis 2014.

12. See, e.g., Krueger, Kahneman, et al. 2009.

13. See, e.g., Haybron 2007, Schwitzgebel and Hurlburt 2007, Schwitzgebel 2008, 2011, Goldstein 1981, 2002.

14. Good examples can be found in the Gallup studies discussed in section 3.3 (Kahneman and Deaton 2010; Diener, Ng, et al. 2010). These studies roughly assess both life satisfaction and emotional state, using a suite of inquiries about particular types of affect to get at the latter. Compare the World Values Survey, which uses a “happiness” question and a “life satisfaction” question (e.g., Inglehart, Foa, et al. 2008). Straightforwardly hedonistic measures of subjective well-being are less common, one sign being whether physical pain is assessed, but seem to figure most prominently in time-use studies.

15. For example, Ryff 1989, Waterman 1993, Ryan and Deci 2001, Keyes 2002, Seligman 2002, Seligman 2011. Two excellent collections of papers on eudaimonic psychology, including both empirical and philosophical contributions, are Vittersø 2016 and Waterman 2013.

16. For scholarly reviews of this literature, see David et al. 2013, Diener et al. 2018a, 2018b. A more extensive list of suggested readings to get started on various aspects of the literature on happiness and well-being is maintained on the webpages of the Happiness and Well-Being Project (see the link in the Other Internet Resources). Philosophical engagement with empirical research on happiness has picked up considerably in recent years, monographs including, e.g., Alexandrova 2017, Badhwar 2014, Besser 2014, Bishop 2015, Bok 2010b, Feldman 2010, Flanagan 2007, Kenny and Kenny 2006, Sumner 1996, Tiberius 2008, 2014, Wren-Lewis 2019. There has also been some collaborative work on happiness between philosophers and empirical researchers; for instance, Ahuvia et al. 2015, Intelisano et al. 2019, Oishi et al., and other teams funded by the Happiness and Well-Being Project (again, see Other Internet Resources). In experimental philosophy, recent studies include Phillips et al. 2011, 2014, 2017, Robbins et al. 2018, as well as the experience machine studies cited below.

17. For reviews of this literature, see Frederick and Loewenstein 1999, Lucas 2008, Luhmann and Intelisano 2018.

18. See, e.g., Diener, Lucas, et al. 2006, Lucas, Clark, et al. 2004a, 2004b, Lucas 2008, Diener 2008, Lyubomirsky, Sheldon, et al. 2005, Easterlin 2003, Easterlin 2005, Inglehart and Klingemann 2000, Inglehart, Foa, et al. 2008, Headey 2007, 2008, Luhmann and Intelisano 2018.

19. Heritability figures must be read with considerable caution: among other things, they reflect only the amount of variation within the studied population that can be explained by genes, roughly speaking. If your subjects live in relatively homogeneous environments, heritability findings will increase. Since twin studies tend not to include twins separated and placed in radically different environments—say, contemporary Manhattan versus San Bushmen, or 19th century versus contemporary Dutchmen—they often overstate the heritability of traits relative to the full spectrum of human societies, and correspondingly understate the role of environment. For philosophical discussion, see Bishop 2015, Sosis 2012, 2014.

20. E.g., Biswas-Diener, Vittersø, et al. 2005, Biswas-Diener 2018, Graham 2009, Diener and Suh 2000, Inglehart and Klingemann 2000, Inglehart, Foa, et al. 2008. For a striking informal account of a hunter-gatherer society, the Pirahã, see Everett 2009. What these findings show about well-being depends on the importance of happiness for it (see section 4). Note that high happiness can coexist with low longevity, which is clearly important on most views of well-being. For this reason, happiness measures may be unable to tell the whole story about well-being even if we accept a mental state view of well-being. For an effort rectify this limitation within happiness research, see Veenhoven 2005.

21. For useful surveys and lists, see Myers and Diener 1995, Argyle 1999, 2002, Layard 2005, Bok 2010a, Diener et al. 2018, Jebb et al. 2020, and the annual World Happiness Reports starting with Helliwell et al. 2012. Philosophical discussions of the causes and correlates of happiness include, e.g., Ahuvia et al. 2015, Andreou 2010, Brülde 2014, Haybron 2013a, Lauinger 2015, Morris 2015, Setiya 2014, Tiberius 2017, Wren-Lewis 2019.

22. On the last, see, e.g., Kellert and Wilson 1995, Frumkin 2001, Haybron 2011, Capaldi et al. 2015, Lumber et al. 2017, Bosch and Bird 2018, Houlden et al. 2018.

23. Importantly, this study and the Stevenson and Wolfers study use log income instead of raw income, which substantially accounts for the stronger income-life satisfaction correlations than those found in earlier research. While neither metric is unambiguously superior, log income has the advantage of tracking proportional differences in income: a major question, for instance, is the impact of economic growth on happiness. For this purpose, the impact of, say, a five percent gain in income is more relevant than that of a $500 increase, which might represent a large gain for some, small for others.

24. For recent discussion of these and other doubts about the value of happiness, see Belliotti 2004, 2013.

25. Recent years have seen lively debate about the experience machine case. Some examples include Bramble 2016, Hawkins 2016, Kraut 2018, Lin 2015, Stevenson 2018, and Weijers 2011. Empirical studies of lay intuitions include De Brigard 2010, Hindricks and Douven 2018, Weijers 2014.

26. See, e.g., Elster 1983, Millgram 2000, Nussbaum 2000, Sen 1987b, 2009, van der Deijl 2017b, Mitchell 2018.

27. The consensus ends, however, on the question of what virtue entails. Indeed, skeptics about (conventional) morality such as Nietzsche might hold that virtue—acting well—entails immorality, at least relative to conventional standards of morality (see also, e.g., the discussion of “Gaugin” in Williams 1981, and “Admirable Immorality” in Slote 1983). This is one reason to frame the view broadly, in terms of virtue, rather than morality. Hurka’s excellent, accessible discussion of the good life may seem to reject the priority of virtue, but his treatment of virtue as a “lesser” good concerns its contribution to the sum of intrinsic value in a life, not the importance of doing the right thing (Hurka 2010).

28. Besides authentic happiness theories, there have been a number of other recent proposals to incorporate happiness as one among other constituents of well-being, e.g., Bishop 2012, 2015, Fletcher 2013, Jayawickreme and Pawelski 2013, MacLeod 2015, Raibley 2012, 2013, Rodogno 2016, Rossi and Tappolet 2016. Badhwar 2014 notably incorporates an emotional state conception of happiness in an Aristotelian account of well-being as “happiness in an objectively worthwhile life.”

29. Other authors who have expressed doubts about the unity of well-being include Griffin 2000, 2007, Raz 1986, 2004, Scanlon 1999, Alexandrova 2017.

30. Recent philosophical discussions of norms governing the proper pursuit of happiness include Badhwar 2008, 2014, Beck and Stroop 2014, Haybron 2013b, Kahane 2012, Spahn 2015, Tiberius 2008, Walker 2011.

31. A sampling of other recent philosophical work on human limitations in the pursuit of happiness includes Angner 2016, Besser 2013, Billon 2016, Paul 2014. A comprehensive review of the empirical literature in this area is Haybron 2008b.

32. While most policy discussion embeds happiness metrics such as life satisfaction or emotional well-being in a broader approach that considers other outcomes as well, there is significant support for a narrower focus on happiness, notably in Layard 2005 and Clark et al. 2018. Good sources on the policy debate include the World Happiness Reports published annually since Helliwell et al. 2012, annual reports from the Global Happiness Council from 2018 onward, resources available through the OECD, Stiglitz et al. 2009, Stiglitz et al. 2019, Diener et al. 2009, Adler and Fleurbaey 2015. Philosophical discussions include, among others, Adler 2019, Alexandrova 2018, Angner 2009, Austin 2015, Bagaric and McConvill 2005, Becker 2012, Bok 2010a, Fleurbaey and Blanchet 2013, Hausman 2010, Haybron and Alexandrova 2013, Haybron and Tiberius 2015, Hersch 2015, 2020, Kenny and Kenny 2006, Metz 2014, Moller 2011, Nussbaum 2010, Singh and Alexandrova forthcoming, Sugden 2008, Trout and Buttar 2000, van der Rijt 2015, White 2013, Wren-Lewis 2013, and other sources noted below.

33. See, e.g., Trout 2005, Loewenstein and Haisley 2008, Thaler and Sunstein 2008, Trout 2009.

34. E.g., Ross and Nisbett 1991, Haidt 2001, Doris 2002, Doris 2009, Doris 2015, Christakis, Fowler, et al. 2009, Haybron 2014.

35. For worries about even this sort of paternalism, see Hausman and Welch 2009.

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