There are roughly two philosophical literatures on “happiness,” each corresponding to a different sense of the term. One uses ‘happiness’ as a value term, roughly synonymous with well-being or flourishing. The other body of work uses the word as a purely descriptive psychological term, akin to ‘depression’ or ‘tranquility’. An important project in the philosophy of happiness is simply getting clear on what various writers are talking about: what are the important meanings of the term and how do they connect? While the “well-being” sense of happiness receives significant attention in the contemporary literature on well-being, the psychological notion is undergoing a revival as a major focus of philosophical inquiry, following on recent developments in the science of happiness. This entry focuses on the psychological sense of happiness (for the well-being notion, see the entry on well-being). The main accounts of happiness in this sense are hedonism, the life satisfaction theory, and the emotional state theory. Leaving verbal questions behind, we find that happiness in the psychological sense has always been an important concern of philosophers. Yet the significance of happiness for a good life has been hotly disputed in recent decades. Further questions of contemporary interest concern the relation between the philosophy and science of happiness, as well as the role of happiness in social and political decision-making.
- 1. The meanings of ‘happiness’
- 2. Theories of happiness
- 3. The science of happiness
- 4. The importance of happiness
- 5. The pursuit and promotion of happiness
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What is happiness? This question has no straightforward answer, because the meaning of the question itself is unclear. What exactly is being asked? Perhaps you want to know what the word ‘happiness’ means. In that case your inquiry is linguistic. Chances are you had something more interesting in mind: perhaps you want to know about the thing, happiness, itself. Is it pleasure, a life of prosperity, something else? Yet we can’t answer that question until we have some notion of what we mean by the word.
Philosophers who write about “happiness” typically take their subject matter to be either of two things, each corresponding to a different sense of the term:
- A state of mind
- A life that goes well for the person leading it
In the first case our concern is simply a psychological matter. Just as inquiry about pleasure or depression fundamentally concerns questions of psychology, inquiry about happiness in this sense—call it the (long-term) “psychological sense”—is fundamentally the study of certain mental states. What is this state of mind we call happiness? Typical answers to this question include life satisfaction, pleasure, or a positive emotional condition.
Having answered that question, a further question arises: how valuable is this mental state? Since ‘happiness’ in this sense is just a psychological term, you could intelligibly say that happiness isn’t valuable at all. Perhaps you are a high-achieving intellectual who thinks that only ignoramuses can be happy. On this sort of view, happy people are to be pitied, not envied. The present article will center on happiness in the psychological sense.
In the second case, our subject matter is a kind of value, namely what philosophers nowadays tend to call prudential value—or, more commonly, well-being, welfare, utility or flourishing. (For further discussion, see the entry on well-being. Whether these terms are really equivalent remains a matter of dispute, but this article will usually treat them as interchangeable.) “Happiness” in this sense concerns what benefits a person, is good for her, makes her better off, serves her interests, or is desirable for her for her sake. To be high in well-being is to be faring well, doing well, fortunate, or in an enviable condition. Ill-being, or doing badly, may call for sympathy or pity, whereas we envy or rejoice in the good fortune of others, and feel gratitude for our own. Being good for someone differs from simply being good, period: perhaps it is always good, period, for you to be honest; yet it may not always be good for you, as when it entails self-sacrifice. Not coincidentally, the word ‘happiness’ derives from the term for good fortune, or “good hap,” and indeed the terms used to translate it in other languages often have similar roots. In this sense of the term—call it the “well-being sense”—happiness refers to a life of well-being or flourishing: a life that goes well for you.
Importantly, to ascribe happiness in the well-being sense is to make a value judgment: namely, that the person has whatever it is that benefits a person. If you and I and have different values, then we may well differ about which lives we consider happy. I might think Genghis Khan had a happy life, because I think what matters for well-being is getting what you want; while you deny this because you think a life of evildoing, however “successful,” is sad and impoverished.
Theories of well-being—and hence of “happiness” in the well-being sense—come in three basic flavors, according to the best-known taxonomy (Parfit 1984): hedonism, desire theories, and objective list theories. Whereas hedonists identify well-being roughly with experiences of pleasure, desire theorists equate it with the satisfaction of one’s desires—actually getting what you want, versus merely having certain experiences. Both hedonism and desire theories are in some sense subjectivist, since they ground well-being in the individual’s subjective states. Objective list theorists, by contrast, think some things benefit us independently of our attitudes or feelings: there are objective prudential goods. Aristotelians are the best-known example: they take well-being (eudaimonia) to consist in a life of virtuous activity—or more broadly, the fulfillment of our human capacities. A passive but contented couch potato may be getting what he wants, and he may enjoy it. But he would not, on Aristotelian and other objective list theories, count as doing well, or leading a happy life.
Now we can sharpen the initial question somewhat: when you ask what happiness is, are you asking what sort of life benefits a person? If so, then your question concerns matters of value, namely what is good for people—the sort of thing that ethical theorists are trained to address. Alternatively, perhaps you simply want to know about the nature of a certain state of mind—happiness in the psychological sense. In this case, some sort of psychological inquiry will be needed, either philosophical or scientific. (Laypersons often have neither sort of question in mind, but are really asking about the sources of happiness. Thus it might be claimed, say, that “happiness is being with good friends.” This is not a view about the nature or definition of happiness, but rather a theory about the sorts of things that tend to make us happy. It leaves unanswered, or takes for granted, the question of just what happiness is, such that friends are a good source of it.)
In short, philosophical “theories of happiness” can be about either of at least two different things: well-being, or a state of mind. Accordingly, there are essentially two bodies of philosophical literature about “happiness” and two sets of debates about its nature, though writers often fail to distinguish them. Such failures have generated much confusion, sometimes yielding bogus disagreements that prove to be merely verbal. For instance, some psychologists identify “happiness” with attitudes of life satisfaction while remaining neutral on questions of value, or whether Bentham, Mill, Aristotle, or any other thinker about the good life was correct. Such researchers employ the term in the psychological sense. Yet it is sometimes objected against such claims that life satisfaction cannot suffice for “happiness” because other things, like achievement or knowledge, matter for human well-being. The objectors are confused: their opponents have made no claims about well-being at all, and the two “sides,” as it were, are simply using ‘happiness’ to talk about different things. One might just as sensibly object to an economist’s tract on “banks” that it has nothing to say about rivers and streams.
Which use of ‘happiness’ corresponds to the true meaning of the term in contemporary English? Arguably, both. The well-being usage clearly dominates in the historical literature through at least the early modern era, for instance in translations of the ancient Greeks’ ‘eudaimonia’ or the Latin ‘beatitudo’, though this translation has long been a source of controversy. Jefferson’s famous reference to “the pursuit of happiness” probably employed the well-being sense. Even later writers such as Mill may have used the term in its well-being sense, though it is often difficult to tell since well-being itself is often taken to consist in mental states like pleasure. In ordinary usage, the abstract noun ‘happiness’ often invites a well-being reading. And the locution ‘happy life’ may not naturally take a psychological interpretation, for the simple reason that lives aren’t normally regarded as psychological entities.
Contrast this with the very different meaning that seems to attach to talk of “being happy.” Here it is much less clear that we are talking about a property of a person’s life; it seems rather to be a property of the person herself. To be happy, it seems, is just to be in a certain sort of psychological state or condition. Similarly when we say that so-and-so “is happy” (as opposed to saying that he is leading a happy life). This psychological usage, arguably, predominates in the current vernacular. Researchers engaged in the self-described “science of happiness” usually do not take themselves to be making value judgments when they proclaim individuals in their studies to be happy. Nor, when asserting that a life satisfaction study shows Utahans to be happier than New Yorkers, are they committing themselves to the tendentious claim that Utahans are better off. (If they are, then the psychology journals that are publishing this research may need to revise their peer-review protocols to include ethicists among their referees.) And the many recent popular books on happiness, as well as innumerable media accounts of research on happiness, nearly all appear to take it for granted that they are talking about nothing more than a psychological condition.
Henceforth ‘happiness’ will be used in the long-term psychological sense, unless otherwise specified. Note, however, that a number of important books and other works on “happiness” in recent decades have employed the well-being sense of the term. Books of this sort appear to include Almeder 2000, Annas 1993, 2011, Bloomfield 2014, Cahn and Vitrano 2015, Kenny and Kenny 2006, McMahon 2005, McPherson 2020, Noddings 2003, Russell 2013, White 2006, and Vitrano 2014, though again it is not always clear how a given author uses the term. For discussion of the well-being notion, see the entry on well-being.
Philosophers have most commonly distinguished two accounts of happiness: hedonism, and the life satisfaction theory. Hedonists identify happiness with the individual’s balance of pleasant over unpleasant experience, in the same way that welfare hedonists do. The difference is that the hedonist about happiness need not accept the stronger doctrine of welfare hedonism; this emerges clearly in arguments against the classical Utilitarian focus on happiness as the aim of social choice. Such arguments tend to grant the identification of happiness with pleasure, but challenge the idea that this should be our primary or sole concern, and often as well the idea that happiness is all that matters for well-being.
Life satisfaction theories identify happiness with having a favorable attitude toward one’s life as a whole. This basic schema can be filled out in a variety of ways, but typically involves some sort of global judgment: an endorsement or affirmation of one’s life as a whole. This judgment may be more or less explicit, and may involve or accompany some form of affect. It may also involve or accompany some aggregate of judgments about particular items or domains within one’s life.
A third theory, the emotional state view, departs from hedonism in a different way: instead of identifying happiness with pleasant experience, it identifies happiness with an agent’s emotional condition as a whole, of what is often called “emotional well-being.” This includes nonexperiential aspects of emotions and moods (or perhaps just moods), and excludes pleasures that don’t directly involve the individual’s emotional state. It might also include a person’s propensity for experiencing various moods, which can vary over time, though several authors have argued against this suggestion (e.g., Hill 2007, Klausen 2015, Rossi 2018). Happiness on such a view is more nearly the opposite of depression or anxiety—a broad psychological condition—whereas hedonistic happiness is simply opposed to unpleasantness. For example, a deeply distressed individual might distract herself enough with constant activity to maintain a mostly pleasant existence—broken only by tearful breakdowns during the odd quiet moment—thus perhaps counting as happy on a hedonistic but not emotional state view. The states involved in happiness, on an emotional state view, can range widely, far more so that the ordinary notion of mood or emotion. On one proposal, happiness involves three broad categories of affective state, including “endorsement” states like joy versus sadness, “engagement” states like flow or a sense of vitality, and “attunement” states like tranquility, emotional expansiveness versus compression, and confidence. Given the departures from commonsensical notions of being in a “good mood,” happiness is characterized in this proposal as “psychic affirmation,” or “psychic flourishing” in pronounced forms.
A fourth family of views, hybrid theories, attempts an irenic solution to our diverse intuitions about happiness: identify happiness with both life satisfaction and pleasure or emotional state, perhaps along with other states such as domain satisfactions. The most obvious candidate here is subjective well-being, which is typically defined as a compound of life satisfaction, domain satisfactions, and positive and negative affect. (Researchers often seem to identify happiness with subjective well-being, sometimes with life satisfaction, and perhaps most commonly with emotional or hedonic state.) The chief appeal of hybrid theories is their inclusiveness: all the components of subjective well-being seem important, and there is probably no component of subjective well-being that does not at times get included in “happiness” in ordinary usage.
How do we determine which theory is correct? Traditional philosophical methods of conceptual or linguistic analysis can give us some guidance, indicating that some accounts offer a better fit with the ordinary concept of happiness. Thus it has been argued that hedonism is false to the concept of happiness as we know it; the intuitions taken to support hedonism point instead to an emotional state view (Haybron 2001). And some have argued that life satisfaction is compatible with profoundly negative emotional states like depression—a suffering artist might not value emotional matters much, and wholeheartedly affirm her life (Carson 1981, Davis 1981b, Haybron 2005, Feldman 2010). Yet it might seem counterintuitive to deem such a person happy. At the same time, people do sometimes use ‘happiness’ to denote states of life satisfaction: life satisfaction theories do seem faithful to some ordinary uses of ‘happiness’. The trouble is that HAPPINESS appears to be a “mongrel concept,” as Ned Block (1995) called the concept of consciousness: the ordinary notion is something of a mess. We use the term to denote different things in different contexts, and often have no clear notion of what we are referring to. This suggests that accounts of happiness must be somewhat revisionary, and that we must assess theories on grounds other than simple fidelity to the lay concept of happiness—“descriptive adequacy,” in Sumner’s (1996) terms. One candidate is practical utility: which conception of happiness best answers to our interests in the notion? We talk about happiness because we care about it. The question is why we care about it, and which psychological states within the extension of the ordinary term make the most sense of this concern. Even if there is no simple answer to the question what happiness is, it may well turn out that our interests in happiness cluster so strongly around a particular psychological kind that happiness can best, or most profitably, be understood in terms of that type of state (Haybron 2003). Alternatively, we may choose to distinguish different varieties of happiness. It will be less important how we use the word, however, than that we be clear about the nature and significance of the phenomena that interest us.
The debate over theories of happiness falls along a couple of lines. The most interesting questions concern the choice between life satisfaction and affect-based views like hedonism and the emotional state theory. Proponents of life satisfaction see two major advantages to their account. First, life satisfaction is holistic, ranging over the whole of one’s life, or the totality of one’s life over a certain period of time. It reflects not just the aggregate of moments in one’s life, but also the global quality of one’s life taken as a whole (but see Raibley 2010). And we seem to care not just about the total quantity of good in our lives, but about its distribution—a happy ending, say, counts for more than a happy middle (Slote 1982, Velleman 1991). Second, life satisfaction seems more closely linked to our priorities than affect is, as the suffering artist case illustrates. While a focus on affect makes sense insofar as we care about such matters, most people care about other things as well, and how their lives are going relative to their priorities may not be fully mirrored in their affective states. Life satisfaction theories thus seem to fit more closely with liberal ideals of individual sovereignty, on which how well my life is going for me is for me to decide. My satisfaction with my life seems to embody that judgment. Of course a theory of happiness need not capture everything that matters for well-being; the point is that a life satisfaction view might explain why we should care so much about happiness, and so enjoy substantive as well as intuitive support.
But several objections have been raised against life satisfaction views. The most common complaint has already been noted, namely that a person could apparently be satisfied with her life even while leading a highly unpleasant or emotionally distressed existence, and it can seem counterintuitive to regard such a person as happy (see section 2.2). Some life satisfaction theorists deny that such cases are possible (Benditt 1978), but it could also be argued that such possibilities are part and parcel of life satisfaction’s appeal: some people may not get much pleasure out of life because they don’t care particularly about affective matters, and a life satisfaction theory allows that they can, in their own fashion, be happy.
Two other objections are more substantive, raising questions about whether life satisfaction has the right sort of importance. One concern is whether people often enough have well-grounded attitudes of life satisfaction or dissatisfaction. Evaluating one’s life as a whole can be a complicated business, and there is some question whether people typically have well-defined attitudes toward their lives that accurately reflect how well their lives measure up relative to their priorities. Some research, for instance, suggests that life satisfaction reports tend to reflect judgments made on the spot, drawing on whatever information comes readily to mind, with substantial influences by transient contextual factors like the weather, finding a dime, etc. (Schwarz and Strack 1999). Debate persists over whether this work undermines the significance of life satisfaction judgments, but it does raise a question whether life satisfaction attitudes tend to be well-enough grounded to have the kind of importance that people normally ascribe to happiness.
The third objection is somewhat intricate, so it will require some explaining. The claim is that a wide range of life satisfaction attitudes might be consistent with individuals’ perceptions of how well their lives are going relative to what they care about, raising doubts about the importance of life satisfaction (Haybron 2016). You might reasonably be satisfied when getting very little of what you want, or dissatisfied when getting most of what you want. One reason for this is that people tend to have many incommensurable values, leaving it open how to add them up. Looking at the various ups and downs of your life, it may be arbitrary whether to rate your life a four out of ten, or a seven. A second reason is that life satisfaction attitudes are not merely assessments of subjective success or personal welfare: they involve assessments of whether one’s life is good enough—satisfactory. Yet people’s values may radically underdetermine where they should set the bar for a “good enough” life, again rendering the judgment somewhat arbitrary. Given your values, you might reasonably be satisfied with a two, or require a nine to be satisfied. While it may seem important how well people see their lives going relative to what they care about, it is not obviously so important whether people see their lives going well enough that they are willing to judge them satisfactory.
If life satisfaction attitudes are substantially arbitrary relative to subjective success, then people might reasonably base those attitudes on other factors, such as ethical ideals (e.g., valuing gratitude or noncomplacency) or pragmatic concerns (e.g., comforting oneself). Shifts in perspective might also reasonably alter life satisfaction attitudes. After the funeral, you might be highly satisfied with your life, whereas the high school reunion leaves you dissatisfied; yet neither judgment need be mistaken, or less authoritative.
As a result, life satisfaction attitudes may be poor indicators of well-being, even from the individual’s own point of view. That people in a given country register high levels of life satisfaction may reflect nothing more than that they set the bar extremely low; they might be satisfied with anything short of pure agony. Another country’s citizens might be dissatisfied with their lives, but only because they set the bar much higher. Relative to what they care about, people in the dissatisfied nation could be better off than those in the satisfied nation. To take another example, a cancer patient might be more satisfied with his life than he was before the diagnosis, for he now looks at his life from a different perspective and emphasizes different virtues like fortitude and gratitude as opposed to (say) humility and non-complacency. Yet he need not think himself better off at all: he might believe himself worse off than he was when he was less satisfied. Neither judgment need seem to him or us to be mistaken: it’s just that he now looks at his life differently. Indeed, he might think he’s doing badly, even as he is satisfied with his life: he endorses it, warts and all, and is grateful just have his not-so-good life rather than some of the much worse alternatives.
For present purposes, the worry is that life satisfaction may not have the kind of significance happiness is normally thought to have. This may pose a difficulty for the identification of life satisfaction with happiness: for people frequently seem to use happiness as a proxy for well-being, a reasonably concrete and value-free stand-in that facilitates quick-and-dirty assessments of welfare. Given the discovery that someone is happy, we might infer that he is doing well; if we learn that someone is unhappy, we may conclude that she is doing poorly. Such inferences are defeasible: if we later find that the happy Ned’s wife and friends secretly hate him, we need not decide that he isn’t happy after all; we simply withdraw the conclusion that he is doing well. So long as happiness tracks well-being well enough in most cases, this sort of practice is perfectly respectable. But if we identify happiness with life satisfaction, then we may have a problem: maybe Sally is satisfied only because she values being grateful for the good things in life. This sort of case may not be merely a theoretical possibility: perhaps the very high rates of self-reported life satisfaction in the United States and many other places substantially reflects a broad acceptance of norms of gratitude and a general tendency to emphasize the positives, or perhaps a sense that not to endorse your life amounts to a lack of self-regard. It is not implausible that most people, even those enduring great hardship, can readily find grounds for satisfaction with their lives. Life may have to be pretty hard for a person to be incapable of affirming it.
Despite these concerns there is significant intuitive appeal in the idea that to be happy is to be satisfied with one’s life. Perhaps a different way of conceiving life satisfaction, for instance dispensing with the global judgment and aggregating particular satisfactions and dissatisfactions, would lessen the force of these objections. Alternatively, it is possible that idealized or qualified forms of life satisfaction would mitigate these concerns for some purposes, such as a theory of well-being.
A second set of issues concerns the differences between the two affect-based views, hedonism and emotional state. The appeal of hedonism is fairly obvious: the pleasantness of our experience is plainly a matter of great significance; many have claimed it to be the only thing that matters. What, by contrast, motivates the emotional state account, which bears obvious similarities to hedonism yet excludes many pleasures from happiness? The question of motivation appears to be the chief worry facing the emotional state theory: what’s to be gained by focusing on emotional state rather than pleasure?
One argument for taking such a view is intuitive: some find it implausible to think that psychologically superficial pleasures invariably make a difference in how happy one is—the typical pleasure of eating a cracker, say, or even the intense pleasure of an orgasm that nonetheless fails to move one, as can happen with meaningless sexual activity. The intuitive distinction seems akin to distinctions made by some ancient philosophers; consider, for instance, the following passage from Epictetus’s Discourses:
‘I have a headache.’ Well, do not say ‘Alas!’ ‘I have an earache.’ Do not say ‘Alas!’ And I am not saying that it is not permissible to groan, only do not groan in the centre of your being. (Discourses, 1.18.19, emphasis added).
The Stoics did not expect us never to feel unpleasant sensations, which would plainly be impossible; rather, the idea was not to let such things get to us, to impact our emotional conditions.
Why should anyone care to press such a distinction in characterizing happiness? For most people, the hedonic difference between happiness on an emotional state versus a hedonistic view is probably minimal. But while little will be lost, what will be gained? One possibility is that the more “central” affects involving our emotional conditions may bear a special relation to the person or the self, whereas more “peripheral” affects, like the pleasantness of eating a cracker, might pertain to the subpersonal aspects of our psychologies. Since well-being is commonly linked to ideas of self-fulfillment, this sort of distinction might signal a difference in the importance of these states. Another reason to focus on emotional condition rather than experience alone may be the greater psychological depth of the former: its impact on our mental lives, physiology, and behavior is arguably deeper and more pervasive. This enhances the explanatory and predictive significance of happiness, and more importantly its desirability: happiness on this view is not merely pleasant, but a major source of pleasure and other good outcomes (Fredrickson 2004, Lyubomirsky, King et al. 2005). Compare health on this score: while many think it matters chiefly or entirely because of its connection with pleasure, there are few skeptics about the importance of health. As well, emotional state views may capture the idea that happiness concerns the individual’s psychological orientation or disposition: to be happy, on an emotional state theory, is not just to be subjected to a certain sequence of experiences, but for one’s very being to manifest a favorable orientation toward the conditions of one’s life—a kind of psychic affirmation of one’s life. This reflects a point of similarity with life satisfaction views of happiness: contra hedonism, both views take happiness to be substantially dispositional, involving some sort of favorable orientation toward one’s life. But life satisfaction views tend to emphasize reflective or rational endorsement, whereas emotional state views emphasize the verdicts of our emotional natures.
While hedonism and emotional state theories are major contenders in the contemporary literature, all affect-based theories confront the worries, noted earlier, that motivate life satisfaction views—notably, their looser connection with people’s priorities, as well as their limited ability to reflect the quality of people’s lives taken as a whole.
Given the limitations of narrower theories of happiness, a hybrid account such as a subjective well-being theory may seem an attractive solution. This strategy has not been fully explored in the philosophical literature, though Sumner’s “life satisfaction” theory may best be classified as a hybrid (1996; see also Martin 2012). In any event, a hybrid approach draws objections of its own. If we arrive at a hybrid theory by this route, it could seem like either the marriage of two unpromising accounts, or of a promising account with an unpromising one. Such a union may not yield wholesome results. Second, people have different intuitions about what counts as happiness, so that no theory can accommodate all of them. Any theory that tries to thus risks pleasing no one. A third concern is that the various components of any hybrid are liable to matter for quite different reasons, so that happiness, thus understood, might fail to answer to any coherent set of concerns. Ascriptions of happiness could be relatively uninformative if they cast their net too widely.
With the explosive rise of empirical research on happiness, a central question is how far, and how, happiness might be measured. There seems to be no in-principle barrier to the idea of measuring, at least roughly, how happy people are. Investigators may never enjoy the precision of the “hedonimeter” once envisaged by Edgeworth to show just how happy a person is (Edgeworth 1881). Indeed, such a device might be impossible even in principle, since happiness might involve multiple dimensions that either cannot be precisely quantified or summed together. If so, it could still be feasible to develop approximate measures of happiness, or at least its various dimensions. Similarly, depression may not admit of precise quantification in a single number, yet many useful if imprecise measures of depression exist. In the case of happiness, it is plausible that even current measures provide information about how anxious, cheerful, satisfied, etc. people are, and thus tell us something about their happiness. Even the simplest self-report measures used in the literature have been found to correlate well with many intuitively relevant variables, such as friends’ reports, smiling, physiological measures, health, longevity, and so forth (Pavot 2008).
Importantly, most scientific research needs only to discern patterns across large numbers of individuals—to take an easy case, determining whether widows tend to be less happy than newlyweds—and this is compatible with substantial unreliability in assessing individual happiness. Similarly, an inaccurate thermometer might be a poor guide to the temperature, but readings from many such thermometers could correlate fairly well with actual temperatures—telling us, for instance, that Minnesota is colder than Florida.
This point reveals an important caveat: measures of happiness could correlate well with how happy people are, thus telling us which groups of people tend to be happier, while being completely wrong about absolute levels of happiness. Self-reports of happiness, for instance, might correctly indicate that unemployed people are considerably less happy than those with jobs. But every one of those reports could be wrong, say if everyone is unhappy yet claims to be happy, or vice-versa, so long as the unemployed report lower happiness than the employed. Similarly, bad thermometers may show that Minnesota is colder than Florida without giving the correct temperature.
Two morals emerge from these reflections. First, self-report measures of happiness could be reliable guides to relative happiness, though telling us little about how happy, in absolute terms, people are. We may know who is happier, that is, but not whether people are in fact happy. Second, even comparisons of relative happiness will be inaccurate if the groups being compared systematically bias their reports in different ways. This worry is particularly acute for cross-cultural comparisons of happiness, where differing norms about happiness may undermine the comparability of self-reports. The French might report lower happiness than Americans, for instance, not because their lives are less satisfying or pleasant, but because they tend to put a less positive spin on things. For this reason it may be useful to employ instruments, including narrower questions or physiological measures, that are less prone to cultural biasing.
The discussion thus far has assumed that people can be wrong about how happy they are. Is this plausible? Some have argued that (sincerely) self-reported happiness cannot, even in principle, be mistaken. If you think you’re happy, goes a common sentiment, then you are happy. This claim is not plausible on a hedonistic or emotional state view of happiness, since those theories take judgments of happiness to encompass not just how one is feeling at the moment but also past states, and memories of those can obviously be spurious. Further, it has been argued that even judgments of how one feels at the present moment may often be mistaken, particularly regarding moods like anxiety.
The idea that sincere self-reports of happiness are incorrigible can only be correct, it seems, given a quite specific conception of happiness—a kind of life satisfaction theory of happiness on which people count as satisfied with their lives so long as they are disposed to judge explicitly that they are satisfied with their lives on the whole. Also assumed here is that self-reports of happiness are in fact wholly grounded in life satisfaction judgments like these—that is, that people take questions about “happiness” to be questions about life satisfaction. Given these assumptions, we can plausibly conclude that self-reports of happiness are incorrigible. One question is whether happiness, thus conceived, is very important. As well, it is unlikely that respondents invariably interpret happiness questions as being about life satisfaction. At any rate, even life satisfaction theorists might balk at this variant of the account, since life satisfaction is sometimes taken to involve, not just explicit global judgments of life satisfaction, but also our responses to the particular things or domains we care about. Some will hesitate to deem satisfied people who hate many of the important things in their lives, however satisfied they claim to be with their lives as a whole.
In a similar vein, the common practice of measuring happiness simply by asking people to report explicitly on how “happy” they are is sometimes defended on the grounds that it lets people decide for themselves what happiness is. The reasoning again seems to presuppose, controversially, that self-reports of happiness employ a life satisfaction view of happiness, the idea being that whether you are satisfied (“happy”) will depend on what you care about. Alternatively, the point might be literally to leave it up to the respondent to decide whether ‘happy’ means hedonic state, emotional state, life satisfaction, or something else. Thus one respondent’s “I’m happy” might mean “my experience is generally pleasant,” while another’s might mean “I am satisfied with my life as a whole.” It is not clear, however, that asking ambiguous questions of this sort is a useful enterprise, since different respondents will in effect be answering different questions.
To measure happiness through self-reports, then, it may be wiser to employ terms other than ‘happiness’ and its cognates—terms whose meaning is relatively well-known and fixed. In other words, researchers should decide in advance what they want to measure—be it life satisfaction, hedonic state, emotional state, or something else—and then ask questions that refer unambiguously to those states. This stratagem may be all the more necessary in cross-cultural work, where finding suitable translations of ‘happy’ can be daunting—particularly when the English meaning of the term remains a matter of contention (Wierzbicka 2004).
This entry focuses on subjective well-being studies, since that work is standardly deemed “happiness” research. But psychological research on well-being can take other forms, notably in the “eudaimonic”—commonly opposed to “hedonic”—literature, which assesses a broader range of indicators taken to represent objective human needs, such as meaning, personal growth, relatedness, autonomy, competence, etc. (The assimilation of subjective well-being to the “hedonic” realm may be misleading, since life satisfaction seems primarily to be a non-hedonic value, as noted earlier.) Other well-being instruments may not clearly fall under either the “happiness” or eudaimonic rubrics, for instance extending subjective well-being measures by adding questions about the extent to which activities are seen as meaningful or worthwhile (White and Dolan 2009). An important question going forward is how far well-being research needs to incorporate indicators beyond subjective well-being.
The scientific literature on happiness has grown to proportions far too large for this article to do more than briefly touch on a few highlights. Here is a sampling of oft-cited claims:
- Most people are happy
- People adapt to most changes, tending to return over time to their happiness “set point”
- People are prone to make serious mistakes in assessing and pursuing happiness
- Material prosperity has a surprisingly modest impact on happiness
The first claim, that most people are happy, appears to be a consensus position among subjective well-being researchers (for a seminal argument, see Diener and Diener 1996). The contention reflects three lines of evidence: most people, in most places, report being happy; most people report being satisfied with their lives; and most people experience more positive affect than negative. On any of the major theories of happiness, then, the evidence seems to show that most people are, indeed, happy. Yet this conclusion might be resisted, on a couple of grounds. First, life satisfaction theorists might question whether self-reports of life satisfaction suffice to establish that people are in fact satisfied with their lives. Perhaps self-reports can be mistaken, say if the individual believes herself satisfied yet shows many signs of dissatisfaction in her behavior, for instance complaining about or striving to change important things in her life. Second, defenders of affect-based theories—hedonistic and emotional state views—might reject the notion that a bare majority of positive affect suffices for happiness. While the traditional view among hedonists has indeed been that happiness requires no more than a >1:1 ratio of positive to negative affect, this contention has received little defense and has been disputed in the recent literature. Some investigators have claimed that “flourishing” requires greater than a 3:1 ratio of positive to negative affect, as this ratio might represent a threshold for broadly favorable psychological functioning (e.g., Larsen and Prizmic 2008). While the evidence for any specific ratio is highly controversial, if anything like this proportion were adopted as the threshold for happiness, on a hedonistic or emotional state theory, then some of the evidence taken to show that people are happy could in fact show the opposite. In any event, the empirical claim relies heavily on nontrivial philosophical views about the nature of happiness, illustrating one way in which philosophical work on happiness can inform scientific research.
The second claim, regarding adaptation and set points, reflects well-known findings that many major life events, like being disabled in an accident or winning the lottery, appear strongly to impact happiness only for a relatively brief period, after which individuals may return to a level of happiness not very different from before. As well, twin studies have found that subjective well-being is substantially heritable, with .50 being a commonly accepted figure. Consequently many researchers have posited that each individual has a characteristic “set point” level of happiness, toward which he tends to gravitate over time. Such claims have caused some consternation over whether the pursuit and promotion of happiness are largely futile enterprises (Lykken and Tellegen 1996; Millgram 2000). However, the dominant view now seems to be that the early claims about extreme adaptation and set points were exaggerated: while adaptation is a very real phenomenon, many factors—including disability—can have substantial, and lasting, effects on how happy people are. This point was already apparent from the literature on correlates and causes of happiness, discussed below: if things like relationships and engaging work are important for happiness, then happiness is probably not simply a matter of personality or temperament. As well, the large cross-national differences in measured happiness are unlikely to be entirely an artifact of personality variables. Note that even highly heritable traits can be strongly susceptible to improvement. Better living conditions have raised the stature of men in the Netherlands by eight inches—going from short (five foot four) to tall (over six feet)—in the last 150 years (Fogel 2005). Yet height is considered much more heritable than happiness, with typical heritability estimates ranging from .60 to over .90 (e.g., Silventoinen, Sammalisto et al. 2003).
The question of mistakes will be taken up in section 5.2. But the last claim—that material prosperity has relatively modest impacts on happiness—has lately become the subject of heated debate. For some time the standard view among subjective well-being researchers was that, beyond a low threshold where basic needs are met, economic gains have only a small impact on happiness levels. According to the well-known “Easterlin Paradox,” for instance, wealthier people do tend to be happier within nations, but richer nations are little happier than less prosperous counterparts, and—most strikingly—economic growth has virtually no impact (Easterlin 1974). In the U.S., for example, measured happiness has not increased significantly since at least 1947, despite massive increases in wealth and income. In short, once you’re out of poverty, absolute levels of wealth and income make little difference in how happy people are.
Against these claims, some authors have argued that absolute income has a large impact on happiness across the income spectrum (e.g., Stevenson and Wolfers 2008). The question continues to be much debated, but in 2010 a pair of large-scale studies using Gallup data sets, including improved measures of life satisfaction and affect, suggested that both sides may be partly right (Kahneman and Deaton 2010; Diener, Ng et al. 2010). Surveying large numbers of Americans in one case, and what is claimed to be the first globally representative sample of humanity in the other, these studies found that income does indeed correlate substantially (.44 in the global sample), at all levels, with life satisfaction—strictly speaking, a “life evaluation” measure that asks respondents to rate their lives without saying whether they are satisfied. Yet the correlation of household income with the affect measures is far weaker: globally, .17 for positive affect, –.09 for negative affect; and in the United States, essentially zero above $75,000 (though quite strong at low income levels). For more recent discussions of empirical work, see Jebb et al. 2018 along with relevant chapters in Diener et al. 2018 and the annual World Happiness Reports from 2012 onward (Helliwell et al. 2012). Research on the complex money-happiness relationship resists simple characterization, but a crude summary is that the connection tends to be positive and substantial, strong at lower income levels while modest to weak or even negative at higher incomes, and stronger and less prone to satiation for life evaluation than emotional well-being metrics. But again, these are very rough generalizations that gloss over a variety of important factors and admit of many exceptions across both individuals and societies.
In short, the relationship between money and happiness may depend on which theory of happiness we accept: on a life satisfaction view, the relationship may be strong; whereas affect-based views may yield a much weaker connection, again above some modest threshold. Here, again, philosophical views about the nature and significance of happiness may play an important role in understanding empirical results and their practical upshot. Economic growth, for instance, has long been a top priority for governments, and findings about its impact on human well-being may have substantial implications for policy.
It is important to note that studies of this nature focus on generic trends, not specific cases, and there is no dispute that significant exceptions exist—notably, populations that enjoy high levels of happiness amid low levels of material prosperity. Among others, a number of Latin American countries, Maasai herders, Inughuit hunter-gatherers, and Amish communities have registered highly positive results in subjective well-being studies, sometimes higher than those in many affluent nations, and numerous informal accounts accord with the data. Such “positive outliers” suggest that some societies can support high levels of happiness with extremely modest material holdings. The importance of money for happiness may depend strongly on what kind of society one inhabits. An interesting question, particularly in light of common environmental concerns, is how far the lessons of such societies can, or should, be transferred to other social forms, where material attainment and happiness are presently more tightly coupled. Perhaps some degree of decoupling of happiness and money would be desirable.
So the role of money in happiness appears, at this juncture, to be a mixed bag, depending heavily on how we conceive of happiness and what range of societies we are considering. What (else), then, does matter most for happiness? There is no definitive list of the main sources of happiness in the literature, partly because it is not clear how to divide them up. But the following items seem generally to be accepted as among the chief correlates of happiness: supportive relationships, engagement in interesting and challenging activities, material and physical security, a sense of meaning or purpose, a positive outlook, and autonomy or control. Significant correlates may also include—among many others—religion, good governance, trust, helping others, values (e.g., having non-materialistic values), achieving goals, not being unemployed, and connection with the natural environment.
An illustrative study of the correlates of happiness from a global perspective is the Gallup World Poll study noted earlier (Diener, Ng et al. 2010; see also Jebb et al. 2020). In that study, the life satisfaction measure was more strongly related to material prosperity, as noted above: household income, along with possession of luxury conveniences and satisfaction with standard of living. The affect measures, by contrast, correlated most strongly with what the authors call “psychosocial prosperity”: whether people reported being treated with respect in the last day, having family and friends to count on, learning something new, doing what they do best, and choosing how their time was spent.
What these results show depends partly on the reliability of the measures. One possible source of error is that this study might exaggerate the relationship between life satisfaction and material attainments through the use of a “ladder” scale for life evaluation, ladders being associated with material aspirations. Errors might also arise through salience biases whereby material concerns might be more easily recalled than other important values, such as whether one has succeeded in having children; or through differences in positivity biases across income levels (perhaps wealthier people tend to be more “positive-responding” than poorer individuals). Another question is whether the affect measures adequately track the various dimensions of people’s emotional lives. However, the results are roughly consonant with other research, so they are unlikely to be entirely an artifact of the instruments used in this study. A further point of uncertainty is the causal story behind the correlations—whether the correlates, like psychosocial prosperity, cause happiness; whether happiness causes them; whether other factors cause both; or, as is likely, some combination of the three.
Such concerns duly noted, the research plausibly suggests that, on average, material progress has some tendency to help people to better get what they want in life, as found in the life satisfaction measures, while relationships and engaging activities are more important for people’s emotional lives. What this means for happiness depends on which view of happiness is correct.
Were you to survey public attitudes about the value of happiness, at least in liberal Western democracies, you would likely find considerable support for the proposition that happiness is all that really matters for human well-being. Many philosophers over the ages have likewise endorsed such a view, typically assuming a hedonistic account of happiness. (A few, like Almeder 2000, have identified well-being with happiness understood as life satisfaction.)
Most philosophers, however, have rejected hedonistic and other mental state accounts of well-being, and with them the idea that happiness could suffice for well-being. (See the entry on well-being.) Objections to mental state theories of well-being tend to cluster around two sets of concerns. First, it is widely believed that the non-mental conditions of our lives matter for well-being: whether our families really love us, whether our putative achievements are genuine, whether the things we care about actually obtain. The most influential objection of this sort is Robert Nozick’s experience machine case, wherein we are asked to imagine a virtual reality device that can perfectly simulate any reality for its user, who will think the experience is genuine (Nozick 1974). Would you plug in to such a machine for life? Most people would not, and the case is widely taken to vitiate mental state theories of well-being. Beyond having positive mental states, it seems to matter both that our lives go well and that our state of mind is appropriately related to how things are.
A second set of objections concerns various ways in which a happy person might nonetheless seem intuitively to be leading an impoverished or stunted life. The most influential of these worries involves adaptation, where individuals facing oppressive circumstances scale back their expectations and find contentment in “small mercies,” as Sen put it. Even a slave might come to internalize the values of his oppressors and be happy, and this strikes most as an unenviable life indeed. Related worries involve people with diminished capacities (blindness, Down Syndrome), or choosing to lead narrow and cramped or simpleminded lives (e.g., counting blades of grass). Worries about impoverished lives are a prime motivator of Aristotelian theories of well-being, which emphasize the full and proper exercise of our human capacities.
In the face of these and other objections most commentators have concluded that neither happiness nor any other mental state can suffice for well-being. Philosophical interest in happiness has consequently flagged, since its theoretical importance becomes unclear if it does not play a starring role in our account of the good.
Even as happiness might fail to suffice for well-being, well-being itself may be only one component of a good life, and not the most important one at that. Here ‘good life’ means a life that is good all things considered, taking account of all the values that matter in life, whether they benefit the individual or not. Kant, for example, considered both morality and well-being to be important but distinct elements of a good life. Yet morality should be our first priority, never to be sacrificed for personal happiness.
In fact there is a broad consensus, or near-consensus, among ethical theorists on a doctrine we might call the priority of virtue: broadly and crudely speaking, the demands of virtue or morality trump other values in life. We ought above all to act and live well, or at least not badly or wrongly. This view need not take the strong form of insisting that we must always act as virtuously as possible, or that moral reasons always take precedence. But it does mean, at least, that when being happy requires acting badly, one’s happiness must be sacrificed. If it would be wrong to leave your family, in which you are unhappy, then you must remain unhappy, or find more acceptable ways to seek happiness.
The mainstream views in all three of the major approaches to ethical theory—consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics—agree on some form of the priority of virtue. Where these views chiefly differ is not on the importance of being good, but on whether being good necessarily benefits us. Virtue ethicists tend to answer in the affirmative, the other two schools in the negative. Building virtue into well-being, as Aristotelians do, may seem to yield a more demanding ethics, and in some ways it does. Yet many deontologists and consequentialists—notably Kant—advocate sterner, more starkly moralistic visions of the good life than Aristotle would ever have dreamt of (e.g., Singer 1972).
Happiness, in short, is believed by most philosophers to be insufficient for well-being, and still less important for the good life. These points may seem to vitiate any substantial role for happiness in ethical thought. However, well-being itself is still regarded as a central concept in ethical thought, denoting one of the chief elements of a good life even if not the sole element. And there are reasons for thinking happiness important, both practically and theoretically, despite the worries noted above.
Even if happiness does not suffice for well-being—a point that not all philosophers would accept—it might still rate a privileged spot in theories of well-being. This could happen in either of two ways.
First, happiness could be a major component of a theory of well-being. Objective list theories of well-being sometimes include happiness or related mental states such as enjoyment among the fundamental constituents of well-being. A more ambitious proposal, originated by L.W. Sumner, identifies well-being with authentic happiness—happiness that is authentic in the sense of being both informed and autonomous (Sumner 1996). The root idea is that well-being involves being happy, where one’s happiness is a response of one’s own (autonomous), to a life that genuinely is one’s own (informed). The authenticity constraint is meant to address both experience machine-type worries and “happy slave” objections relating to adaptation, where happiness may be non-autonomous, depending on manipulation or the uncritical acceptance of oppressive values. Since these have been the most influential objections to mental state accounts of well-being, Sumner’s approach promises to considerably strengthen the position of happiness-centered approaches to well-being, and several philosophers have developed variants or close relations of the authentic happiness theory (Brülde 2007, Haybron 2008a, Tiberius and Plakias 2010, Višak 2015). The approach remains fairly new, however, so its long-term prospects remain unclear.
A second strategy forsakes the project of giving a unitary theory of well-being, recognizing instead a family of two or more kinds of prudential value. Happiness could be central to, or even exhaustive of, one of those values. Shelly Kagan, for instance, has suggested that welfare hedonism could be correct as a theory of how well a person is doing, but not of how well a person’s life is going, which should perhaps be regarded as a distinct value (Kagan 1992, 1994). In short, we might distinguish narrow and wide well-being concepts. An experience machine user might be doing well in the narrow sense, but not the wide—she is doing well, though her life is quite sad. Happiness might, then, suffice for well-being, but only in the narrow sense. Others have made similar points, but uptake has been limited, perhaps because distinguishing multiple concepts of prudential value makes the already difficult job of giving a theory of well-being much harder, as Kagan pointedly observes. An interesting possibility is that the locution ‘happy life’, and the corresponding well-being sense of happiness, actually refers to a specific variety of well-being—perhaps well-being in the wide sense just suggested, or well-being taken as an ideal state, an ultimate goal of deliberation. This might explain the continued use of ‘happiness’ for the well-being notion in the philosophical literature, rather than the more standard ‘wellbeing.’
The preceding section discussed ways that happiness might figure prominently even in non-mental state theories of well-being. The question there concerned the role of happiness in theories of well-being. This is a different question from how important happiness is for well-being itself. Even a theory of well-being that includes no mention at all of happiness can allow that happiness is nonetheless a major component or contributor to well-being, because of its relation to the things that ultimately constitute well-being. If you hold a desire theory of well-being, for instance, you will very likely allow that, for most people, happiness is a central aspect of well-being, since most people very much desire to be happy. Indeed, some desire theorists have argued that the account actually yields a form of hedonism, on the grounds that people ultimately desire nothing else but happiness or pleasure (Sidgwick 1907 , Brandt 1979, 1989).
Happiness may be thought important even on theories normally believed to take a dismissive view of it. Aristotelians identify well-being with virtuous activity, yet Aristotle plainly takes this to be a highly pleasant condition, indeed the most pleasant kind of life there is (see, e.g., NE, Bk. I 8; Bk. VII 13). You cannot flourish, on Aristotelian terms, without being happy, and unhappiness is clearly incompatible with well-being. Even the Stoics, who notoriously regard all but a virtuous inner state as at best indifferent, would still assign happiness a kind of importance: at the very least, to be unhappy would be unvirtuous; and virtue itself arguably entails a kind of happiness, namely a pleasant state of tranquility. As well, happiness would likely be a preferred indifferent in most cases, to be chosen over unhappiness. To be sure, both Aristotelian and Stoic accounts are clear that happiness alone does not suffice for well-being, that its significance is not what common opinion takes it to be, and that some kinds of happiness can be worthless or even bad. But neither denies that happiness is somehow quite important for human well-being.
In fact it is questionable whether any major school of philosophical thought denies outright the importance of happiness, at least on one of the plausible accounts of the matter. Doubts about its significance probably owe to several factors. Some skeptics, for example, focus on relatively weak conceptions of happiness, such as the idea that it is little more than the simple emotion of feeling happy—an idea that few hedonists or emotional state theorists would accept. Or, alternatively, assuming that a concern for happiness has only to do with positive states. Yet ‘happiness’ also serves as a blanket term for a domain of concern that involves both positive and negative states, namely the kinds of mental states involved in being happy or unhappy. Just as “health” care tends to focus mainly on ill health, so might happiness researchers choose to focus much of their effort on the study and alleviation of unhappiness—depression, suffering, anxiety, and other conditions whose importance is uncontroversial. The study of happiness need be no more concerned with smiles than with frowns.
The last set of questions we will examine centers on the pursuit of happiness, both individual and collective. Most of the popular literature on happiness discusses how to make oneself happier, with little attention given to whether this is an appropriate goal, or how various means of pursuing happiness measure up from an ethical standpoint. More broadly, how if at all should one pursue happiness as part of a good life?
We saw earlier that most philosophers regard happiness as secondary to morality in a good life. The individual pursuit of happiness may be subject to nonmoral norms as well, prudence being the most obvious among them. Prudential norms need not be as plain as “don’t shoot yourself in the foot.” On Sumner’s authentic happiness view of well-being, for instance, we stand to gain little by pursuing happiness in inauthentic ways, for instance through self-deception or powerful drugs like Huxley’s soma, which guarantees happiness come what may (Huxley 1932 ). The view raises interesting questions about the benefits of less extreme pharmaceuticals, such as the therapeutic use of antidepressants; such medications can make life more pleasant, but many people worry whether they pose a threat to authenticity, perhaps undercutting their benefits. It is possible that such drugs involve prudential tradeoffs, promoting well-being in some ways while undermining it in others; whether the tradeoffs are worth it will depend on how, in a given case, the balance is struck. Another possibility is that such drugs sometimes promote authenticity, if for instance a depressive disorder prevents a person from being “himself.”
Looking to more broadly ethical, but not yet moral, norms, it may be possible to act badly without acting either immorally or imprudently. While Aristotle himself regarded acting badly as inherently imprudent, his catalogue of virtues is instructive, as many of them (wit, friendliness, etc.) are not what we normally regard as moral virtues. Some morally permissible methods of pursuing happiness may nonetheless be inappropriate because they conflict with such “ethical” virtues. They might, for instance, be undignified or imbecilic.
Outwardly virtuous conduct undertaken in the name of personal happiness might, if wrongly motivated, be incompatible with genuine virtue. One might, for instance, engage in philanthropy solely to make oneself happier, and indeed work hard at fine-tuning one’s assistance to maximize the hedonic payoff. This sort of conduct would not obviously instantiate the virtue of compassion or kindness, and indeed might be reasonably deemed contemptible. Similarly, it might be admirable, morally or otherwise, to be grateful for the good things in one’s life. Yet the virtue of gratitude might be undermined by certain kinds of gratitude intervention, whereby one tries to become happier by focusing on the things one is grateful for. If expressions of gratitude become phony or purely instrumental, the sole reason for giving thanks being to become happy—and not that one actually has something to be thankful for—then the “gratitude” might cease to be admirable, and may indeed be unvirtuous.
A different question is what means of pursuing happiness are most effective. This is fundamentally an empirical question, but there are some in-principle issues that philosophical reflection might inform. One oft-heard claim, commonly called the “paradox of hedonism,” is that the pursuit of happiness is self-defeating; to be happy, don’t pursue happiness. It is not clear how to interpret this dictum, however, so that it is both interesting and true. It is plainly imprudent to make happiness one’s focus at every moment, but doubtful that this has often been denied. Yet never considering happiness also seems an improbable strategy for becoming happier. If you are choosing among several equally worthwhile occupations, and have good evidence that some of them will make you miserable, while one of them is likely to be highly fulfilling, it would not seem imprudent to take that information into account. Yet to do so just is to pursue happiness. The so-called paradox of hedonism is perhaps best seen as a vague caution against focusing too much on making oneself happy, not a blanket dismissal of the prospects for expressly seeking happiness—and for this modest point there is good empirical evidence (Schooler, Ariely et al. 2003, Lyubomirsky 2007).
That happiness is sometimes worth seeking does not mean we will always do a good job of it (Haybron 2008b). In recent decades a massive body of empirical evidence has gathered on various ways in which people seem systematically prone to make mistakes in the pursuit of their interests, including happiness. Such tendencies have been suggested in several domains relating to the pursuit of happiness, including (with recent surveys cited):
- Assessing how happy we are, or were in the past (Haybron 2007)
- Predicting (“forecasting”) what will make us happy (Gilbert 2006)
- Choosing rationally (Kahneman and Tversky 2000, Gilovitch, Griffin et al. 2002, Hsee and Hastie 2006)
A related body of literature explores the costs and benefits of (ostensibly) making it easier to pursue happiness by increasing people’s options; it turns out that having more choices might often make people less happy, for instance by increasing the burdens of deliberation or the likelihood of regret (Schwartz 2004). Less discussed in this context, but highly relevant, is the large body of research indicating that human psychology and behavior are remarkably prone to unconscious social and other situational influences, most infamously reported in the Milgram obedience experiments (Doris 2002, 2015, Haybron 2014). Human functioning, and the pursuit of happiness, may be more profoundly social than many commentators have assumed.
Taken together, this research bears heavily on two central questions in the philosophical literature: first, the broad character of human nature (e.g., in what sense are we rational animals? How should we conceive of human autonomy?); second, the philosophical ideals of the good society and good government.
Just a decade ago the idea of happiness policy was something of a novelty. While it remains on the fringes in some locales, notably the United States, in much of the world there has been a surge of interest in making happiness an explicit target of policy consideration. Attention has largely shifted, however, to a broader focus on well-being to reflect not just happiness but also other welfare concerns of citizens, and dozens of governments now incorporate well-being metrics in their national statistics.
Let’s consider the rationale for policies aimed at promoting well-being. In political thought, the modern liberal tradition has tended to assume an optimistic view of human nature and the individual’s capacities for prudent choice. Partly for this reason, the preservation and expansion of individual freedoms, including people’s options, is widely taken to be a central goal, if not the goal, of legitimate governments. People should be freed to seek the good life as they see it, and beyond that the state should, by and large, stay out of the well-being-promotion business.
This vision of the good society rests on empirical assumptions that have been the subject of considerable debate. If it turns out that people systematically and predictably err in the pursuit of their interests, then it may be possible for governments to devise policies that correct for such mistakes. Of course, government intervention can introduce other sorts of mistakes, and there is some debate about whether such measures are likely to do more harm than good (e.g., Glaeser 2006).
But even if governments cannot effectively counteract human imprudence, it may still be that people fare better in social forms that influence or even constrain choices in ways that make serious mistakes less likely. (Food culture and its impact on health may be an instructive example here.) The idea that people tend to fare best when their lives are substantially constrained or guided by their social and physical context has recently been dubbed contextualism; the contrary view, that people do best when their lives are, as much as possible, determined by the individuals themselves, is individualism (Haybron 2008b). Recent contextualists include communitarians and many perfectionists, though contextualism is not a political doctrine and is compatible with liberalism and even libertarian political morality. Contextualism about the promotion of well-being is related to recent work in moral psychology that emphasizes the social character of human agency, such as situationism and social intuitionism.
Quite apart from matters of efficacy, there are moral questions about the state promotion of happiness, which has been a major subject of debate, both because of the literature on mistakes and research suggesting that the traditional focus of state efforts to promote well-being, economic growth, has a surprisingly modest impact on happiness. One concern is paternalism: does happiness-based policy infringe too much on personal liberty? Some fear a politics that may too closely approximate Huxley’s Brave New World, where the state ensures a drug-induced happiness for all (Huxley 1932 ). Extant policy suggestions, however, have been more modest. Efforts to steer choice, for instance in favor of retirement savings, may be paternalistic, but advocates argue that such policies can be sufficiently light-handed that no one should object to them, in some cases even going so far as to deem it “libertarian paternalism” (Thaler and Sunstein 2008). The idea is that gentle “nudges,” like setting default options on hiring forms to setting aside money for retirement, interfere only trivially with choice, imposing little or no cost for those who wish to choose differently, and would very likely be welcomed by most of those targeted.
Also relatively light-handed, and perhaps not paternalistic at all, are state efforts to promote happiness directly through social policy, for instance by prioritizing unemployment over economic growth on the grounds that the former has a larger impact on happiness. Other policies might include trying to reduce commute times, or making walkable neighborhoods and green space a priority in urban planning, again on happiness grounds. Some may deem such measures paternalistic insofar as they trade freedom (in the form of economic prosperity) for a substantive good, happiness, that people value unevenly, though it has also been argued that refusing to take citizens’ values like happiness into consideration in policy deliberation on their behalf can amount to paternalism (Haybron and Alexandrova 2013).
A related sort of objection to happiness-based policy argues that happiness, or even well-being, is simply the wrong object of policy, which ought instead to focus on the promotion of resources or capabilities (Rawls 1971, Nussbaum 2000, Quong 2011, Sen 2009). Several reasons have been cited for this sort of view, one being that policies aimed at promoting happiness or well-being violate commonly accepted requirements of “liberal neutrality,” according to which policy must be neutral among conceptions of the good. According to this constraint, governments must not promote any view of the good life, and happiness-based policy might be argued to flout it. Worries about paternalism also surface here, the idea being that states should only focus on affording people the option to be happy or whatever, leaving the actual achievement of well-being up to the autonomous individual. As we just saw, however, it is not clear how far happiness policy initiatives actually infringe on personal liberty or autonomy. A further worry is that, happiness isn’t really, or primarily, what matters for human well-being (Nussbaum 2008).
But a major motivation for thinking happiness the wrong object of policy is that neither happiness nor well-being are the appropriate focus of a theory of justice. What justice requires of society, on this view, is not that it make us happy; we do not have a right to be happy. Rather, justice demands only that each has sufficient opportunity (in the form of resources or capabilities, say) to achieve a good life, or that each gets a fair share of the benefits of social cooperation. However plausible such points may be, it is not clear how far they apply to many proposals for happiness-based policy, save the strongest claims that happiness should be the sole aim of policy: many policy decisions are not primarily concerned with questions of social justice, nor with constitutional fundamentals, the focus of some theories of justice. Happiness could be a poor candidate for the “currency” of justice, yet still remain a major policy concern. Indeed, the chief target of happiness policy advocates has been, not theories of justice, but governments’ overwhelming emphasis on promoting GDP and other indices of economic growth. This is not, in the main, a debate about justice, and as of yet the philosophical literature has not extensively engaged with it.
However, the push for happiness-based policy is a recent development. In coming years, such questions will likely receive considerably more attention in the philosophical literature.
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For helpful comments, many thanks are due to Anna Alexandrova, Robert Biswas-Diener, Thomas Carson, Irwin Goldstein, Richard Lucas, Jason Raibley, Eric Schwitzgebel, Stephen Schueller, Adam Shriver, Edward Zalta, and an anonymous referee for the SEP. Portions of Section 2 are adapted from Haybron 2008, “Philosophy and the Science of Subjective Well-Being,” in Eid and Larsen, The Science of Subjective Well-Being, and used with kind permission of Guilford Press.