Hegel's Dialectics

First published Fri Jun 3, 2016

“Dialectics” is a term used to describe a method of philosophical argument that involves some sort of contradictory process between opposing sides. In what is perhaps the most classic version of “dialectics”, the ancient Greek philosopher, Plato (see entry on Plato), for instance, presented his philosophical argument as a back-and-forth dialogue or debate, generally between the character of Socrates, on one side, and some person or group of people to whom Socrates was talking (his interlocutors), on the other. In the course of the dialogues, Socrates’ interlocutors propose definitions of philosophical concepts or express views that Socrates challenges or opposes. The back-and-forth debate between opposing sides produces a kind of linear progression or evolution in philosophical views or positions: as the dialogues go along, Socrates’ interlocutors change or refine their views in response to Socrates’ challenges and come to adopt more sophisticated views. The back-and-forth dialectic between Socrates and his interlocutors thus becomes Plato’s way of arguing against the earlier, less sophisticated views or positions and for the more sophisticated ones later.

“Hegel’s dialectics” refers to the particular dialectical method of argument employed by the 19th Century German philosopher, G.W.F. Hegel (see entry on Hegel), which, like other “dialectical” methods, relies on a contradictory process between opposing sides. Whereas Plato’s “opposing sides” were people (Socrates and his interlocutors), however, what the “opposing sides” are in Hegel’s work depends on the subject matter he discusses. In his work on logic, for instance, the “opposing sides” are different definitions of logical concepts that are opposed to one another. In the Phenomenology of Spirit, which presents Hegel’s epistemology or philosophy of knowledge, the “opposing sides” are different definitions of consciousness and of the object that consciousness is aware of or claims to know. As in Plato’s dialogues, a contradictory process between “opposing sides” in Hegel’s dialectics leads to a linear evolution or development from less sophisticated definitions or views to more sophisticated ones later. The dialectical process thus constitutes Hegel’s method for arguing against the earlier, less sophisticated definitions or views and for the more sophisticated ones later. Hegel regarded this dialectical method or “speculative mode of cognition” (PR §10) as the hallmark of his philosophy, and used the same method in the Phenomenology of Spirit [PhG], as well as in all of the mature works he published later—the entire Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences (including, as its first part, the “Lesser Logic” or the Encyclopaedia Logic [EL]), the Science of Logic [SL], and the Philosophy of Right [PR].

Note that, although Hegel acknowledged that his dialectical method was part of a philosophical tradition stretching back to Plato, he criticized Plato’s version of dialectics. He argued that Plato’s dialectics deals only with limited philosophical claims and is unable to get beyond skepticism or nothingness (SL-M 55–6; SL-dG 34–5; PR, Remark to §31). According to the logic of a traditional reductio ad absurdum argument, if the premises of an argument lead to a contradiction, we must conclude that the premises are false—which leaves us with no premises or with nothing. We must then wait around for new premises to spring up arbitrarily from somewhere else, and then see whether those new premises put us back into nothingness or emptiness once again, if they, too, lead to a contradiction. Because Hegel believed that reason necessarily generates contradictions, as we will see, he thought new premises will indeed produce further contradictions. As he puts the argument, then,

the scepticism that ends up with the bare abstraction of nothingness or emptiness cannot get any further from there, but must wait to see whether something new comes along and what it is, in order to throw it too into the same empty abyss. (PhG §79)

Hegel argues that, because Plato’s dialectics cannot get beyond arbitrariness and skepticism, it generates only approximate truths, and falls short of being a genuine science (SL-M 55–6; SL-dG 34–5; PR, Remark to §31; cf. EL Remark to §81).

1. Hegel’s description of his dialectical method

Hegel provides the most extensive, general account of his dialectical method in Part I of his Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences, which is often called the Encyclopaedia Logic [EL]. The form or presentation of logic, he says, has three sides or moments (EL §79). These sides are not parts of logic, but, rather, moments of “every logical concept”, as well as “of everything true in general” (EL Remark to §79; we will see why Hegel thought dialectics is in everything in section 4). The first moment—the moment of the understanding—is the moment of fixity, in which concepts or forms have a seemingly stable definition or determination (EL §80).

The second moment—the “dialectical” (EL §§79, 81) or “negatively rational” (EL §79) moment—is the moment of instability. In this moment, a one-sidedness or restrictedness (EL Remark to §81) in the determination from the moment of understanding comes to the fore, and the determination that was fixed in the first moment passes into its opposite (EL §81). Hegel describes this process as a process of “self-sublation” (EL §81). The English verb “to sublate” translates Hegel’s technical use of the German verb aufheben, which is a crucial concept in his dialectical method. Hegel says that aufheben has a doubled meaning: it means both to cancel (or negate) and to preserve at the same time (PhG §113; SL-M 107; SL-dG 81–2; cf. EL the Addition to §95). The moment of understanding sublates itself because its own character or nature—its one-sidedness or restrictedness—destabilizes its definition and leads it to pass into its opposite. The dialectical moment thus involves a process of self-sublation, or a process in which the determination from the moment of understanding sublates itself, or both cancels and preserves itself, as it pushes on to or passes into its opposite.

The third moment—the “speculative” or “positively rational” (EL §§79, 82) moment—grasps the unity of the opposition between the first two determinations, or is the positive result of the dissolution or transition of those determinations (EL §82 and Remark to §82). Here, Hegel rejects the traditional, reductio ad absurdum argument, which says that when the premises of an argument lead to a contradiction, then the premises must be discarded altogether, leaving nothing. As Hegel suggests in the Phenomenology, such an argument

is just the skepticism which only ever sees pure nothingness in its result and abstracts from the fact that this nothingness is specifically the nothingness of that from which it results. (PhG §79)

Although the speculative moment negates the contradiction, it is a determinate or defined nothingness because it is the result of a specific process. There is something particular about the determination in the moment of understanding—a specific weakness, or some specific aspect that was ignored in its one-sidedness or restrictedness—that leads it to fall apart in the dialectical moment. The speculative moment has a definition, determination or content because it grows out of and unifies the particular character of those earlier determinations, or is “a unity of distinct determinations” (EL §82). The speculative moment is thus “truly not empty, abstract nothing, but the negation of certain determinations” (EL §82). When the result “is taken as the result of that from which it emerges”, Hegel says, then it is “in fact, the true result; in that case it is itself a determinate nothingness, one which has a content” (PhG §79). As he also puts it, “the result is conceived as it is in truth, namely, as a determinate negation [bestimmte Negation]; a new form has thereby immediately arisen” (PhG §79). Or, as he says, “[b]ecause the result, the negation, is a determinate negation [bestimmte Negation], it has a content” (SL-dG 33; cf. SL-M 54). Hegel’s claim in both the Phenomenology and the Science of Logic that his philosophy relies on a process of “determinate negation [bestimmte Negation]” has sometimes led scholars to describe his dialectics as a method or doctrine of “determinate negation” (see entry on Hegel, section on Science of Logic; cf. Rosen 1982: 30; Stewart 1996, 2000: 41–3; Winfield 1990: 56).

There are several features of this account that Hegel thinks raise his dialectical method above the arbitrariness of Plato’s dialectics to the level of a genuine science. First, because the determinations in the moment of understanding sublate themselves, Hegel’s dialectics does not require some new idea to show up arbitrarily. Instead, the movement to new determinations is driven by the nature of the earlier determinations. Indeed, for Hegel, the movement is driven by necessity (see, e.g., EL Remarks to §§12, 42, 81, 87, 88). The nature of the determinations themselves drives or forces them to pass into their opposites. This sense of necessity—the idea that the method involves being forced from earlier moments to later ones—leads Hegel to regard his dialectics as a kind of logic. As he says in the Phenomenology, the method’s “proper exposition belongs to logic” (PhG §48). Necessity—the sense of being driven or forced to conclusions—is the hallmark of “logic” in Western philosophy.

Second, because the form or determination that arises is the result of the self-sublation of the determination from the moment of understanding, there is no need for some new idea to show up from the outside. Instead, the new determination or form is necessitated by earlier moments and hence grows out of the process itself. Unlike in Plato’s arbitrary dialectics, then—which must wait around until some other idea comes in from the outside—in Hegel’s dialectics “nothing extraneous is introduced”, as he says (SL-M 54; cf. SL-dG 33). His dialectics is driven by the nature, immanence or “inwardness” of its own content (SL-M 54; cf. SL-dG 33; cf. PR §31). As he puts it, dialectics is “the principle through which alone immanent coherence and necessity enter into the content of science” (EL Remark to §81).

Third, because later determinations “sublate” earlier determinations, the earlier determinations are not completely cancelled or negated. On the contrary, the earlier determinations are preserved in the sense that they remain in effect within the later determinations. When Being-for-itself, for instance, is introduced in the logic as the first concept of ideality or universality and is defined by embracing a set of “something-others”, Being-for-itself replaces the something-others as the new concept, but those something-others remain active within the definition of the concept of Being-for-itself. The something-others must continue to do the work of picking out individual somethings before the concept of Being-for-itself can have its own definition as the concept that gathers them up. Being-for-itself replaces the something-others, but it also preserves them, because its definition still requires them to do their work of picking out individual somethings (EL §§95–6).

The concept of “apple”, for example, as a Being-for-itself, would be defined by gathering up individual “somethings” that are the same as one another (as apples). Each individual apple can be what it is (as an apple) only in relation to an “other” that is the same “something” that it is (i.e., an apple). That is the one-sidedness or restrictedness that leads each “something” to pass into its “other” or opposite. The “somethings” are thus both “something-others”. Moreover, their defining processes lead to an endless process of passing back and forth into one another: one “something” can be what it is (as an apple) only in relation to another “something” that is the same as it is, which, in turn, can be what it is (an apple) only in relation to the other “something” that is the same as it is, and so on, back and forth, endlessly (cf. EL §95). The concept of “apple”, as a Being-for-itself, stops that endless, passing-over process by embracing or including the individual something-others (the apples) in its content. It grasps or captures their character or quality as apples. But the “something-others” must do their work of picking out and separating those individual items (the apples) before the concept of “apple”—as the Being-for-itself—can gather them up for its own definition. We can picture the concept of Being-for-itself like this:

an oval enclosing two circles, left and right; an arrow goes from the interior of each circle to the interior of the other. The oval has the statement 'Being-for-itself embraces the something-others in its content'. The circles have the statement 'the something-others'. The arrows have the statement 'the process of passing back-and-forth between the something-others'.

Figure 1

Later concepts thus replace, but also preserve, earlier concepts.

Fourth, later concepts both determine and also surpass the limits or finitude of earlier concepts. Earlier determinations sublate themselves—they pass into their others because of some weakness, one-sidedness or restrictedness in their own definitions. There are thus limitations in each of the determinations that lead them to pass into their opposites. As Hegel says, “that is what everything finite is: its own sublation” (EL Remark to §81). Later determinations define the finiteness of the earlier determinations. From the point of view of the concept of Being-for-itself, for instance, the concept of a “something-other” is limited or finite: although the something-others are supposed to be the same as one another, the character of their sameness (e.g., as apples) is captured only from above, by the higher-level, more universal concept of Being-for-itself. Being-for-itself reveals the limitations of the concept of a “something-other”. It also rises above those limitations, since it can do something that the concept of a something-other cannot do. Dialectics thus allows us to get beyond the finite to the universal. As Hegel puts it, “all genuine, nonexternal elevation above the finite is to be found in this principle [of dialectics]” (EL Remark to §81).

Fifth, because the determination in the speculative moment grasps the unity of the first two moments, Hegel’s dialectical method leads to concepts or forms that are increasingly comprehensive and universal. As Hegel puts it, the result of the dialectical process

is a new concept but one higher and richer than the preceding—richer because it negates or opposes the preceding and therefore contains it, and it contains even more than that, for it is the unity of itself and its opposite. (SL-dG 33; cf. SL-M 54)

Like Being-for-itself, later concepts are more universal because they unify or are built out of earlier determinations, and include those earlier determinations as part of their definitions. Indeed, many other concepts or determinations can also be depicted as literally surrounding earlier ones (cf. Maybee 2009: 73, 100, 112, 156, 193, 214, 221, 235, 458).

Finally, because the dialectical process leads to increasing comprehensiveness and universality, it ultimately produces a complete series, or drives “to completion” (SL-dG 33; cf. PhG §79). Dialectics drives to the “Absolute”, to use Hegel’s term, which is the last, final, and completely all-encompassing or unconditioned concept or form in the relevant subject matter under discussion (logic, phenomenology, ethics/politics and so on). The “Absolute” concept or form is unconditioned because its definition or determination contains all the other concepts or forms that were developed earlier in the dialectical process for that subject matter. Moreover, because the process develops necessarily and comprehensively through each concept, form or determination, there are no determinations that are left out of the process. There are therefore no left-over concepts or forms—concepts or forms outside of the “Absolute”—that might “condition” or define it. The “Absolute” is thus unconditioned because it contains all of the conditions in its content, and is not conditioned by anything else outside of it. This Absolute is the highest concept or form of universality for that subject matter. It is the thought or concept of the whole conceptual system for the relevant subject matter. We can picture the Absolute Idea (EL §236), for instance—which is the “Absolute” for logic—as an oval that is filled up with and surrounds numerous, embedded rings of smaller ovals and circles, which represent all of the earlier and less universal determinations from the logical development (cf. Maybee 2009: 30, 600):

Five concentric ovals; the outermost one is labeled 'The Absolute Idea'.

Figure 2

Since the “Absolute” concepts for each subject matter lead into one another, when they are taken together, they constitute Hegel’s entire philosophical system, which, as Hegel says, “presents itself therefore as a circle of circles” (EL §15). We can picture the entire system like this (cf. Maybee 2009: 29):

A circle enclosing enclosing 10 ovals. One oval is labeled 'Phenomenology', another 'Logic', and two others 'Other philosophical subject matters'. The enclosing circle is labeled: the whole philosophical system as a 'circle of circles'

Figure 3

Together, Hegel believes, these characteristics make his dialectical method genuinely scientific. As he says, “the dialectical constitutes the moving soul of scientific progression” (EL Remark to §81). He acknowledges that a description of the method can be more or less complete and detailed, but because the method or progression is driven only by the subject matter itself, this dialectical method is the “only true method” (SL-M 54; SL-dG 33).

2. Applying Hegel’s dialectical method to his arguments

So far, we have seen how Hegel describes his dialectical method, but we have yet to see how we might read this method into the arguments he offers in his works. Scholars often use the first three stages of the logic as the “textbook example” (Forster 1993: 133) to illustrate how Hegel’s dialectical method should be applied to his arguments. The logic begins with the simple and immediate concept of pure Being, which is said to illustrate the moment of the understanding. We can think of Being here as a concept of pure presence. It is not mediated by any other concept—or is not defined in relation to any other concept—and so is undetermined or has no further determination (EL §86; SL-M 82; SL-dG 59). It asserts bare presence, but what that presence is like has no further determination. Because the thought of pure Being is undetermined and so is a pure abstraction, however, it is really no different from the assertion of pure negation or the absolutely negative (EL §87). It is therefore equally a Nothing (SL-M 82; SL-dG 59). Being’s lack of determination thus leads it to sublate itself and pass into the concept of Nothing (EL §87; SL-M 82; SL-dG 59), which illustrates the dialectical moment.

But if we focus for a moment on the definitions of Being and Nothing themselves, their definitions have the same content. Indeed, both are undetermined, so they have the same kind of undefined content. The only difference between them is “something merely meant” (EL Remark to §87), namely, that Being is an undefined content, taken as or meant to be presence, while Nothing is an undefined content, taken as or meant to be absence. The third concept of the logic—which is used to illustrate the speculative moment—unifies the first two moments by capturing the positive result of—or the conclusion that we can draw from—the opposition between the first two moments. The concept of Becoming is the thought of an undefined content, taken as presence (Being) and then taken as absence (Nothing), or taken as absence (Nothing) and then taken as presence (Being). To Become is to go from Being to Nothing or from Nothing to Being, or is, as Hegel puts it, “the immediate vanishing of the one in the other” (SL-M 83; cf. SL-dG 60). The contradiction between Being and Nothing thus is not a reductio ad absurdum, or does not lead to the rejection of both concepts and hence to nothingness—as Hegel had said Plato’s dialectics does (SL-M 55–6; SL-dG 34–5)—but leads to a positive result, namely, to the introduction of a new concept—the synthesis—which unifies the two, earlier, opposed concepts.

We can also use the textbook Being-Nothing-Becoming example to illustrate Hegel’s concept of aufheben (to sublate), which, as we saw, means to cancel (or negate) and to preserve at the same time. Hegel says that the concept of Becoming sublates the concepts of Being and Nothing (SL-M 105; cf. SL-dG 80). Becoming cancels or negates Being and Nothing because it is a new concept that replaces the earlier concepts; but it also preserves Being and Nothing because it relies on those earlier concepts for its own definition. Indeed, it is the first concrete concept in the logic. Unlike Being and Nothing, which had no definition or determination as concepts themselves and so were merely abstract (SL-M 82–3; SL-dG 59–60; cf. EL Addition to §88), Becoming is a “determinate unity in which there is both Being and Nothing” (SL-M 105; cf. SL-dG 80). Becoming succeeds in having a definition or determination because it is defined by, or piggy-backs on, the concepts of Being and Nothing.

This “textbook” Being-Nothing-Becoming example is closely connected to the traditional idea that Hegel’s dialectics follows a thesis-antithesis-synthesis pattern, which, when applied to the logic, means that one concept is introduced as a “thesis” or positive concept, which then develops into a second concept that negates or is opposed to the first or is its “antithesis”, which in turn leads to a third concept, the “synthesis”, that unifies the first two (see, e.g., McTaggert 1964 [1910]: 3–4; Mure 1950: 302; Stace, 1955 [1924]: 90–3, 125–6; Kosek 1972: 243; E. Harris 1983: 93–7; Singer 1983: 77–79). Versions of this interpretation of Hegel’s dialectics continue to have currency (e.g., Forster 1993: 131; Stewart 2000: 39, 55; Fritzman 2014: 3–5). On this reading, Being is the positive moment or thesis, Nothing is the negative moment or antithesis, and Becoming is the moment of aufheben or synthesis—the concept that cancels and preserves, or unifies and combines, Being and Nothing.

We must be careful, however, not to apply this textbook example too dogmatically to the rest of Hegel’s logic or to his dialectical method more generally (for a classic criticism of the thesis-antithesis-synthesis reading of Hegel’s dialectics, see Mueller 1958). There are other places where this general pattern might describe some of the transitions from stage to stage, but there are many more places where the development does not seem to fit this pattern very well. One place where the pattern seems to hold, for instance, is where the Measure (EL §107)—as the combination of Quality and Quantity—transitions into the Measureless (EL §107), which is opposed to it, which then in turn transitions into Essence, which is the unity or combination of the two earlier sides (EL §111). This series of transitions could be said to follow the general pattern captured by the “textbook example”: Measure would be the moment of the understanding or thesis, the Measureless would be the dialectical moment or antithesis, and Essence would be the speculative moment or synthesis that unifies the two earlier moments. However, before the transition to Essence takes place, the Measureless itself is redefined as a Measure (EL §109)—undercutting a precise parallel with the textbook Being-Nothing-Becoming example, since the transition from Measure to Essence would not follow a Measure-Measureless-Essence pattern, but rather a Measure-(Measureless?)-Measure-Essence pattern.

Other sections of Hegel’s philosophy do not fit the triadic, textbook example of Being-Nothing-Becoming at all, as even interpreters who have supported the traditional reading of Hegel’s dialectics have noted. After using the Being-Nothing-Becoming example to argue that Hegel’s dialectical method consists of “triads” whose members “are called the thesis, antithesis, synthesis” (Stace 1955 [1924]: 93), W.T. Stace, for instance, goes on to warn us that Hegel does not succeed in applying this pattern throughout the philosophical system. It is hard to see, Stace says, how the middle term of some of Hegel’s triads are the opposites or antitheses of the first term, “and there are even ‘triads’ which contain four terms!” (Stace 1955 [1924]: 97). As a matter of fact, one section of Hegel’s logic—the section on Cognition—violates the thesis-antithesis-synthesis pattern because it has only two sub-divisions, rather than three. “The triad is incomplete”, Stace complains. “There is no third. Hegel here abandons the triadic method. Nor is any explanation of his having done so forthcoming” (Stace 1955 [1924]: 286; cf. McTaggart 1964 [1910]: 292).

Interpreters have offered various solutions to the complaint that Hegel’s dialectics sometimes seems to violate the triadic form. Some scholars apply the triadic form fairly loosely across several stages (e.g. Burbidge 1981: 43–5; Taylor 1975: 229–30). Others have applied Hegel’s triadic method to whole sections of his philosophy, rather than to individual stages. For G.R.G. Mure, for instance, the section on Cognition fits neatly into a triadic, thesis-antithesis-synthesis account of dialectics because the whole section is itself the antithesis of the previous section of Hegel’s logic, the section on Life (Mure 1950: 270). Mure argues that Hegel’s triadic form is easier to discern the more broadly we apply it. “The triadic form appears on many scales”, he says, “and the larger the scale we consider the more obvious it is” (Mure 1950: 302).

Scholars who interpret Hegel’s description of dialectics on a smaller scale—as an account of how to get from stage to stage—have also tried to explain why some sections seem to violate the triadic form. J.N. Findlay, for instance—who, like Stace, associates dialectics “with the triad, or with triplicity”—argues that stages can fit into that form in “more than one sense” (Findlay 1962: 66). The first sense of triplicity echoes the textbook, Being-Nothing-Becoming example. In a second sense, however, Findlay says, the dialectical moment or “contradictory breakdown” is not itself a separate stage, or “does not count as one of the stages”, but is a transition between opposed, “but complementary”, abstract stages that “are developed more or less concurrently” (Findlay 1962: 66). This second sort of triplicity could involve any number of stages: it “could readily have been expanded into a quadruplicity, a quintuplicity and so forth” (Findlay 1962: 66). Still, like Stace, he goes on to complain that many of the transitions in Hegel’s philosophy do not seem to fit the triadic pattern very well. In some triads, the second term is “the direct and obvious contrary of the first”—as in the case of Being and Nothing. In other cases, however, the opposition is, as Findlay puts it, “of a much less extreme character” (Findlay 1962: 69). In some triads, the third term obviously mediates between the first two terms. In other cases, however, he says, the third term is just one possible mediator or unity among other possible ones; and, in yet other cases, “the reconciling functions of the third member are not at all obvious” (Findlay 1962: 70).

Let us look more closely at one place where the “textbook example” of Being-Nothing-Becoming does not seem to describe the dialectical development of Hegel’s logic very well. In a later stage of the logic, the concept of Purpose goes through several iterations, from Abstract Purpose (EL §204), to Finite or Immediate Purpose (EL §205), and then through several stages of a syllogism (EL §206) to Realized Purpose (EL §210). Abstract Purpose is the thought of any kind of purposiveness, where the purpose has not been further determined or defined. It includes not just the kinds of purposes that occur in consciousness, such as needs or drives, but also the “internal purposiveness” or teleological view proposed by the ancient Greek philosopher, Aristotle (see entry on Aristotle; EL Remark to §204), according to which things in the world have essences and aim to achieve (or have the purpose of living up to) their essences. Finite Purpose is the moment in which an Abstract Purpose begins to have a determination by fixing on some particular material or content through which it will be realized (EL §205). The Finite Purpose then goes through a process in which it, as the Universality, comes to realize itself as the Purpose over the particular material or content (and hence becomes Realized Purpose) by pushing out into Particularity, then into Singularity (the syllogism U-P-S), and ultimately into ‘out-thereness,’ or into individual objects out there in the world (EL §210; cf. Maybee 2009: 466–493).

Hegel’s description of the development of Purpose does not seem to fit the textbook Being-Nothing-Becoming example or the thesis-antithesis-synthesis model. According to the example and model, Abstract Purpose would be the moment of understanding or thesis, Finite Purpose would be the dialectical moment or antithesis, and Realized Purpose would be the speculative moment or synthesis. Although Finite Purpose has a different determination from Abstract Purpose (it refines the definition of Abstract Purpose), it is hard to see how it would qualify as strictly “opposed” to or as the “antithesis” of Abstract Purpose in the way that Nothing is opposed to or is the antithesis of Being.

There is an answer, however, to the criticism that many of the determinations are not “opposites” in a strict sense. The German term that is translated as “opposite” in Hegel’s description of the moments of dialectics (EL §§81, 82)—entgegensetzen—has three root words: setzen (“to posit or set”), gegen, (“against”), and the prefix ent-, which indicates that something has entered into a new state. The verb entgegensetzen can therefore literally be translated as “to set over against”. The “engegengesetzte” into which determinations pass, then, do not need to be the strict “opposites” of the first, but can be determinations that are merely “set against” or are different from the first ones. And the prefix ent-, which suggests that the first determinations are put into a new state, can be explained by Hegel’s claim that the finite determinations from the moment of understanding sublate (cancel but also preserve) themselves (EL §81): later determinations put earlier determinations into a new state by preserving them.

At the same time, there is a technical sense in which a later determination would still be the “opposite” of the earlier determination. Since the second determination is different from the first one, it is the logical negation of the first one, or is not-the-first-determination. If the first determination is “e”, for instance, because the new determination is different from that one, the new one is “not-e” (Kosek 1972: 240). Since Finite Purpose, for instance, has a definition or determination that is different from the definition that Abstract Purpose has, it is not-Abstract-Purpose, or is the negation or opposite of Abstract Purpose in that sense. There is therefore a technical, logical sense in which the second concept or form is the “opposite” or negation of—or is “not”—the first one—though, again, it need not be the “opposite” of the first one in a strict sense.

Other problems remain, however. Because the concept of Realized Purpose is defined through a syllogistic process, it is itself the product of several stages of development (at least four, by my count, if Realized Purpose counts as a separate determination), which would seem to violate a triadic model. Moreover, the concept of Realized Purpose does not, strictly speaking, seem to be the unity or combination of Abstract Purpose and Finite Purpose. Realized Purpose is the result of (and so unifies) the syllogistic process of Finite Purpose, through which Finite Purpose focuses on and is realized in a particular material or content. Realized Purpose thus seems to be a development of Finite Purpose, rather than a unity or combination of Abstract Purpose and Finite Purpose, in the way that Becoming can be said to be the unity or combination of Being and Nothing.

These sorts of considerations have led some scholars to interpret Hegel’s dialectics in a way that is implied by a more literal reading of his claim, in the Encyclopaedia Logic, that the three “sides” of the form of logic—namely, the moment of understanding, the dialectical moment, and the speculative moment—“are moments of each [or every; jedes] logically-real, that is each [or every; jedes] concept” (EL Remark to §79; this is an alternative translation). The quotation suggests that each concept goes through all three moments of the dialectical process—a suggestion reinforced by Hegel’s claim, in the Phenomenology, that the result of the process of determinate negation is that “a new form has thereby immediately arisen” (PhG §79). According to this interpretation, the three “sides” are not three different concepts or forms that are related to one another in a triad—as the textbook Being-Nothing-Becoming example suggests—but rather different momentary sides or “determinations” in the life, so to speak, of each concept or form as it transitions to the next one. The three moments thus involve only two concepts or forms: the one that comes first, and the one that comes next (examples of philosophers who interpret Hegel’s dialectics in this second way include Maybee 2009; Rosen 2014: 122, 132; and Winfield 1990: 56).

For the concept of Being, for example, its moment of understanding is its moment of stability, in which it is asserted to be pure presence. This determination is one-sided or restricted however, because, as we saw, it ignores another aspect of Being’s definition, namely, that Being has no content or determination, which is how Being is defined in its dialectical moment. Being thus sublates itself because the one-sidedness of its moment of understanding undermines that determination and leads to the definition it has in the dialectical moment. The speculative moment draws out the implications of these moments: it asserts that Being (as pure presence) implies nothing. It is also the “unity of the determinations in their comparison [Entgegensetzung]” (EL §82; alternative translation): since it captures a process from one to the other, it includes Being’s moment of understanding (as pure presence) and dialectical moment (as nothing or undetermined), but also compares those two determinations, or sets (-setzen) them up against (-gegen) each other. It even puts Being into a new state (as the prefix ent- suggests) because the next concept, Nothing, will sublate (cancel and preserve) Being.

The concept of Nothing also has all three moments. When it is asserted to be the speculative result of the concept of Being, it has its moment of understanding or stability: it is Nothing, defined as pure absence, as the absence of determination. But Nothing’s moment of understanding is also one-sided or restricted: like Being, Nothing is also an undefined content, which is its determination in its dialectical moment. Nothing thus sublates itself: since it is an undefined content, it is not pure absence after all, but has the same presence that Being did. It is present as an undefined content. Nothing thus sublates Being: it replaces (cancels) Being, but also preserves Being insofar as it has the same definition (as an undefined content) and presence that Being had. We can picture Being and Nothing like this (the circles have dashed outlines to indicate that, as concepts, they are each undefined; cf. Maybee 2009: 51):

two circles with dashed outlines, one labeled 'Being' and one 'Nothing'.

Figure 4

In its speculative moment, then, Nothing implies presence or Being, which is the “unity of the determinations in their comparison [Entgegensetzung]” (EL §82; alternative translation), since it both includes but—as a process from one to the other—also compares the two earlier determinations of Nothing, first, as pure absence and, second, as just as much presence.

The dialectical process is driven to the next concept or form—Becoming—not by a triadic, thesis-antithesis-synthesis pattern, but by the one-sidedness of Nothing—which leads Nothing to sublate itself—and by the implications of the process so far. Since Being and Nothing have each been exhaustively analyzed as separate concepts, and since they are the only concepts in play, there is only one way for the dialectical process to move forward: whatever concept comes next will have to take account of both Being and Nothing at the same time. Moreover, the process revealed that an undefined content taken to be presence (i.e., Being) implies Nothing (or absence), and that an undefined content taken to be absence (i.e., Nothing) implies presence (i.e., Being). The next concept, then, takes Being and Nothing together and draws out those implications—namely, that Being implies Nothing, and that Nothing implies Being. It is therefore Becoming, defined as two separate processes: one in which Being becomes Nothing, and one in which Nothing becomes Being. We can picture Becoming this way (cf. Maybee 2009: 53):

Same as the previous figure except arched arrows from the Nothing circle to the Being circle and vice versa. The arrows are labeled 'Becoming'.

Figure 5

In a similar way, a one-sidedness or restrictedness in the determination of Finite Purpose together with the implications of earlier stages leads to Realized Purpose. In its moment of understanding, Finite Purpose particularizes into (or presents) its content as “something-presupposed” or as a pre-given object (EL §205). I go to a restaurant for the purpose of having dinner, for instance, and order a salad. My purpose of having dinner particularizes as a pre-given object—the salad. But this object or particularity—e.g. the salad—is “inwardly reflected” (EL §205): it has its own content—developed in earlier stages—which the definition of Finite Purpose ignores. We can picture Finite Purpose this way:

4 concentric ovals with the innermost one enclosing an oval and a circle; an arrow points inward from the outermost oval and is labeled 'Presents into or particularizes as'. The outermost oval is labeled 'Finite Purpose (the universality; e.g. 'dinner')'. The next most oval is labeled 'A pre-given object (e.g., 'salad')'. The next oval and the circle and oval in the center are labeled 'The content of the object, developed in earlier stages, that Finite Purpose is ignoring'.

Figure 6

In the dialectical moment, Finite Purpose is determined by the previously ignored content, or by that other content. The one-sidedness of Finite Purpose requires the dialectical process to continue through a series of syllogisms that determines Finite Purpose in relation to the ignored content. The first syllogism links the Finite Purpose to the first layer of content in the object: the Purpose or universality (e.g., dinner) goes through the particularity (e.g., the salad) to its content, the singularity (e.g., lettuce as a type of thing)—the syllogism U-P-S (EL §206). But the particularity (e.g., the salad) is itself a universality or purpose, “which at the same time is a syllogism within itself [in sich]” (EL Remark to §208; alternative translation), in relation to its own content. The salad is a universality/purpose that particularizes as lettuce (as a type of thing) and has its singularity in this lettuce here—a second syllogism, U-P-S. Thus, the first singularity (e.g., “lettuce” as a type of thing)—which, in this second syllogism, is the particularity or P—“judges” (EL §207) or asserts that “U is S”: it says that “lettuce” as a universality (U) or type of thing is a singularity (S), or is “this lettuce here”, for instance. This new singularity (e.g. “this lettuce here”) is itself a combination of subjectivity and objectivity (EL §207): it is an Inner or identifying concept (“lettuce”) that is in a mutually-defining relationship (the circular arrow) with an Outer or out-thereness (“this here”) as its content. In the speculative moment, Finite Purpose is determined by the whole process of development from the moment of understanding—when it is defined by particularizing into a pre-given object with a content that it ignores—to its dialectical moment—when it is also defined by the previously ignored content. We can picture the speculative moment of Finite Purpose this way:

4 concentric ovals with the innermost one enclosing an oval and a circle; arrows point inward from the outermost 3 ovals to the next one in. The outermost oval is labeled 'Finite Purpose (the universality; e.g. 'dinner')'. The nextmost oval is labeled both 'The Particularity or object (e.g., 'salad')' and 'The object (e.g., 'salad') is also a Purpose or universality with its own syllogism'. The next oval is labeled both 'The Singularity (e.g., 'lettuce' as a type)' and 'The Particularity (e.g., 'lettuce' as type)'. And the 4th oval is labeled both 'Inner' and 'The Singularity (e.g., 'this lettuce is here')'. The circle in the middle is labeled 'Outer' and the oval in the middle 'Mutually-defining relationship'. The 3 interior ovals (not including the innermost) are also labeled 'The second syllogism U-P-S'. The 3 outer ovals are also labeled 'The first syllogism U-P-S'.

Figure 7

Finite Purpose’s speculative moment leads to Realized Purpose. As soon as Finite Purpose presents all the content, there is a return process (a series of return arrows) that establishes each layer and redefines Finite Purpose as Realized Purpose. The presence of “this lettuce here” establishes the actuality of “lettuce” as a type of thing (an Actuality is a concept that captures a mutually-defining relationship between an Inner and an Outer [EL §142]), which establishes the “salad”, which establishes “dinner” as the Realized Purpose over the whole process. We can picture Realized Purpose this way:

4 concentric ovals with the innermost one enclosing an oval and a circle; arrows point inward from the outermost 3 ovals to the next one in and arrows also point in the reverse direction. The outermost oval is labeled 'Realized Purpose: the Purpose (e.g., 'dinner') is established as the Purpose or universality over the whole content'. The outward pointing arrows are labeled 'The return process established the Purpose (e.g., 'dinner') as the Purpose or universality over the whole content'. The nextmost oval is labeled 'The object and second Purpose (e.g., 'salad')'. The one next in is labeled 'The Singularity/Particularity (e.g., 'lettuce' as a type)'. The 3rd inward oval is labeled 'The second Singularity (e.g., 'this lettuce is here')'.

Figure 8

If Hegel’s account of dialectics is a general description of the life of each concept or form, then any section can include as many or as few stages as the development requires. Instead of trying to squeeze the stages into a triadic form (cf. Solomon 1983: 22)—a technique Hegel himself rejects (PhG §50; cf. section 4)—we can see the process as driven by each determination on its own account: what it succeeds in grasping (which allows it to be stable, for a moment of understanding), what it fails to grasp or capture (in its dialectical moment), and how it leads (in its speculative moment) to a new concept or form that tries to correct for the one-sidedness of the moment of understanding. This sort of process might reveal a kind of argument that, as Hegel had promised, might produce a comprehensive and exhaustive exploration of every concept, form or determination in each subject matter, as well as raise dialectics above a haphazard analysis of various philosophical views to the level of a genuine science.

3. Is Hegel’s dialectical method logical?

Worries that Hegel’s arguments fail to fit his account of dialectics have led some interpreters to conclude that his method is arbitrary or that his works have no single dialectical method at all (Findlay 1962: 93; Solomon 1983: 21). These interpreters reject the idea that there is any logical necessity to the moves from stage to stage. “[T]he important point to make here, and again and again”, Robert C. Solomon writes, for instance,

is that the transition from the first form to the second, or the transition from the first form of the Phenomenology all the way to the last, is not in any way a deductive necessity. The connections are anything but entailments, and the Phenomenology could always take another route and other starting points. (Solomon 1983: 230)

In a footnote to this passage, Solomon adds “that a formalization of Hegel’s logic, however ingenious, is impossible” (Solomon 1983: 230).

Some scholars have argued that Hegel’s necessity is not intended to be logical necessity. Walter Kaufmann suggested, for instance, that the necessity at work in Hegel’s dialectic is a kind of organic necessity. The moves in the Phenomenology, he said, follow one another “in the way in which, to use a Hegelian image from the preface, bud, blossom and fruit succeed each other” (Kaufmann 1965: 148; 1966: 132). Findlay argued that later stages provide what he called a “higher-order comment” on earlier stages, even if later stages do not follow from earlier ones in a trivial way (Findlay 1966: 367). Solomon suggested that the necessity that Hegel wants is not “‘necessity’ in the modern sense of ‘logical necessity,’” (Solomon 1983: 209), but a kind of progression (Solomon 1983: 207), or a “necessity within a context for some purpose” (Solomon 1983: 209). John Burbidge defines Hegel’s necessity in terms of three senses of the relationship between actuality and possibility, only the last of which is logical necessity (Burbidge 1981: 195–6).

Other scholars have defined the necessity of Hegel’s dialectics in terms of a transcendental argument. A transcendental argument begins with uncontroversial facts of experience and tries to show that other conditions must be present—or are necessary—for those facts to be possible. Jon Stewart argues, for instance, that “Hegel’s dialectic in the Phenomenology is a transcendental account” in this sense, and thus has the necessity of that form of argument (Stewart 2000: 23; cf. Taylor 1975: 97, 226–7; for a critique of this view, see Pinkard 1988: 7, 15).

Some scholars have avoided these debates by interpreting Hegel’s dialectics in a literary way. In his examination of the epistemological theory of the Phenomenology, for instance, Kenneth R. Westphal offers “a literary model” of Hegel’s dialectics based on the story of Sophocles’ play Antigone (Westphal 2003: 14, 16). Ermanno Bencivenga offers an interpretation that combines a narrative approach with a concept of necessity. For him, the necessity of Hegel’s dialectical logic can be captured by the notion of telling a good story—where “good” implies that the story is both creative and correct at the same time (Bencivenga 2000: 43–65).

Debate over whether Hegel’s logic is logical may be fueled in part by discomfort with his particular brand of logic, which, unlike today’s symbolic logic, is not only syntactic, but also semantic. While some of the moves from stage to stage are driven by syntactic necessity, other moves are driven by the meanings of the concepts in play. Indeed, Hegel rejected what he regarded as the overly formalistic logics that dominated the field during his day (EL Remark to §162). A logic that deals only with the forms of logical arguments and not the meanings of the concepts used in those argument forms will do no better in terms of preserving truth than the old joke about computer programs suggests: garbage in, garbage out. In those logics, if you plug in something for the P or Q (in the proposition “if P then Q” or “PQ”, for instance) or for the “F, “G”, or “x” (in the proposition “if F is x, then G is x” or “FxGx”, for instance) that means something true, then the syntax of symbolic logic will preserve that truth. But if you plug in something for those terms that is untrue or meaningless (garbage in), then the syntax of formal logic will lead to an untrue or meaningless conclusion (garbage out). Today’s prepositional logic also assumes that we know what the meaning of “is” is. Against these logics, Hegel wanted to develop a logic that not only preserved truth, but also determined how to construct truthful claims in the first place. A logic that defines concepts (semantics) as well as their relationships with one another (syntax) will show, Hegel thought, how concepts can be combined into meaningful forms. Because interpreters are familiar with modern logics focused on syntax, however, they may regard Hegel’s syntactic and semantic logic as not really logical (cf. Maybee 2009: xvii–xx).

In Hegel’s other works, the moves from stage to stage are often driven, not only by syntax and semantics—that is, by logic (given his account of logic)—but also by considerations that grow out of the relevant subject matter. In the Phenomenology, for instance, the moves are driven by syntax, semantics, and by phenomenological factors. Sometimes a move from one stage to the next is driven by a syntactic need—the need to stop an endless, back-and-forth process, for instance, or to take a new path after all the current options have been exhausted (cf. section 5). Sometimes, a move is driven by the meaning of a concept, such as the concept of a “This” or “Thing”. And sometimes a move is driven by a phenomenological need or necessity—by requirements of consciousness, or by the fact that the Phenomenology is about a consciousness that claims to be aware of (or to know) something. The logic of the Phenomenology is thus a phenomeno-logic, or a logic driven by logic—syntax and semantics—and by phenomenological considerations. Still, interpreters such as Quentin Lauer have suggested that, for Hegel,

phenomeno-logy is a logic of appearing, a logic of implication, like any other logic, even though not of the formal entailment with which logicians and mathematicians are familiar. (Lauer 1976: 3)

Lauer warns us against dismissing the idea that there is any implication or necessity in Hegel’s method at all (Lauer 1976: 3). (Other scholars who also believe there is a logical necessity to the dialectics of the Phenomenology include Hyppolite 1974: 78–9 and H.S. Harris 1997: xii.)

We should also be careful not to exaggerate the “necessity” of formal, symbolic logics. Even in these logics, there can often be more than one path from some premises to the same conclusion, logical operators can be dealt with in different orders, and different sets of operations can be used to reach the same conclusions. There is therefore often no strict, necessary “entailment” from one step to the next, even though the conclusion might be entailed by the whole series of steps, taken together. As in today’s logics, then, whether Hegel’s dialectics counts as logical depends on the degree to which he shows that we are forced—necessarily—from earlier stages or series of stages to later stages (see also section 5).

4. Why does Hegel use dialectics?

We can begin to see why Hegel was motivated to use a dialectical method by examining the project he set for himself, particularly in relation to the work of David Hume and Immanuel Kant (see entries on Hume and Kant). Hume had argued against what we can think of as the naïve view of how we come to have scientific knowledge. According to the naïve view, we gain knowledge of the world by using our senses to pull the world into our heads, so to speak. Although we may have to use careful observations and do experiments, our knowledge of the world is basically a mirror or copy of what the world is like. Hume argued, however, that naïve science’s claim that our knowledge corresponds to or copies what the world is like does not work. Take the scientific concept of cause, for instance. According to that concept of cause, to say that one event causes another is to say that there is a necessary connection between the first event (the cause) and the second event (the effect), such that, when the first event happens, the second event must also happen. According to naïve science, when we claim (or know) that some event causes some other event, our claim mirrors or copies what the world is like. It follows that the necessary, causal connection between the two events must itself be out there in the world. However, Hume argued, we never observe any such necessary causal connection in our experience of the world, nor can we infer that one exists based on our reasoning (see Hume’s A Treatise of Human Nature, Book I, Section II; Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, §6). There is nothing in the world itself that our idea of cause mirrors or copies.

Kant thought Hume’s argument led to an unacceptable, skeptical conclusion, and he rejected Hume’s own solution to the skepticism (see Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, B5, B19–20). Hume suggested that our idea of causal necessity is grounded merely in custom or habit, since it is generated by our own imaginations after repeated observations of one sort of event following another sort of event (see Hume’s A Treatise of Human Nature, Book I, Section VI; Hegel also rejected Hume’s solution, see EL §39). For Kant, science and knowledge should be grounded in reason, and he proposed a solution that aimed to reestablish the connection between reason and knowledge that was broken by Hume’s skeptical argument. Kant’s solution involved proposing a Copernican revolution in philosophy (Critique of Pure Reason, Bxvi). Nicholas Copernicus was the Polish astronomer who said that the earth revolves around the sun, rather than the other way around. Kant proposed a similar solution to Hume’s skepticism. Naïve science assumes that our knowledge revolves around what the world is like, but, Hume’s criticism argued, this view entails that we cannot then have knowledge of scientific causes through reason. We can reestablish a connection between reason and knowledge, however, Kant suggested, if we say—not that knowledge revolves around what the world is like—but that knowledge revolves around what we are like. For the purposes of our knowledge, Kant said, we do not revolve around the world—the world revolves around us. Because we are rational creatures, we share a cognitive structure with one another that regularizes our experiences of the world. This intersubjectively shared structure of rationality—and not the world itself—grounds our knowledge.

However, Kant’s solution to Hume’s skepticism led to a skeptical conclusion of its own that Hegel rejected. While the intersubjectively shared structure of our reason might allow us to have knowledge of the world from our perspective, so to speak, we cannot get outside of our mental, rational structures to see what the world might be like in itself. As Kant had to admit, according to his theory, there is still a world in itself or “Thing-in-itself” (Ding an sich) about which we can know nothing (see, e.g., Critique of Pure Reason, Bxxv–xxvi). Hegel rejected Kant’s skeptical conclusion that we can know nothing about the world- or Thing-in-itself, and he intended his own philosophy to be a response to this view (see, e.g., EL §44 and the Remark to §44).

How did Hegel respond to Kant’s skepticism—especially since Hegel accepted Kant’s Copernican revolution, or Kant’s claim that we have knowledge of the world because of what we are like, because of our reason? How, for Hegel, can we get out of our heads to see the world as it is in itself? Hegel’s answer is very close to the ancient Greek philosopher Aristotle’s response to Plato. Plato argued that we have knowledge of the world only through the Forms. The Forms are perfectly universal, rational concepts or ideas. Because the world is imperfect, however, Plato exiled the Forms to their own realm. Although things in the world get their definitions by participating in the Forms, those things are, at best, imperfect copies of the universal Forms (see, e.g., Parmenides 131–135a). The Forms are therefore not in this world, but in a separate realm of their own. Aristotle argued, however, that the world is knowable not because things in the world are imperfect copies of the Forms, but because the Forms are in things themselves as the defining essences of those things (see, e.g., De Anima [On the Soul], Book I, Chapter 1 [403a26–403b18]; Metaphysics, Book VII, Chapter 6 [1031b6–1032a5] and Chapter 8 [1033b20–1034a8]).

In a similar way, Hegel’s answer to Kant is that we can get out of our heads to see what the world is like in itself—and hence can have knowledge of the world in itself—because the very same rationality or reason that is in our heads is in the world itself. As Hegel apparently put it in a lecture, the opposition or antithesis between the subjective and objective disappears by saying, as the Ancients did,

that nous governs the world, or by our own saying that there is reason in the world, by which we mean that reason is the soul of the world, inhabits it, and is immanent in it, as it own, innermost nature, its universal. (EL Addition 1 to §24)

Hegel used an example familiar from Aristotle’s work to illustrate this view:

“to be an animal”, the kind considered as the universal, pertains to the determinate animal and constitutes its determinate essentiality. If we were to deprive a dog of its animality we could not say what it is. (EL Addition 1 to §24)

Kant’s mistake, then, was that he regarded reason or rationality as only in our heads, Hegel suggests (EL §§43–44), rather than in both us and the world itself. We can use our reason to have knowledge of the world because the very same reason that is in us, is in the world itself as it own defining principle. The rationality or reason in the world makes reality understandable, and that is why we can have knowledge of, or can understand, reality with our rationality. Dialectics—which is Hegel’s account of reason—characterizes not only logic, but also “everything true in general” (EL Remark to §79).

But why does Hegel come to define reason in terms of dialectics, and hence adopt a dialectical method? We can begin to see what drove Hegel to adopt a dialectical method by returning once again to Plato’s philosophy. Plato argued that we can have knowledge of the world only by grasping the Forms, which are perfectly universal, rational concepts or ideas. Because things in the world are so imperfect, however, Plato concluded that the Forms are not in this world, but in a realm of their own. After all, if a human being were perfectly beautiful, for instance, then he or she would never become not-beautiful. But human beings change, get old, and die, and so can be, at best, imperfect copies of the Form of beauty—though they get whatever beauty they have by participating in that Form. Moreover, for Plato, things in the world are such imperfect copies that we cannot gain knowledge of the Forms by studying things in the world, but only through reason, that is, only by using our rationality to access the separate realm of the Forms (as Plato argued in the well-known parable of the cave; Republic, Book 7, 514–516b).

Notice, however, that Plato’s conclusion that the Forms cannot be in this world and so must be exiled to a separate realm rests on two claims. First, it rests on the claim that the world is an imperfect and messy place—a claim that is hard to deny. But it also rests on the assumption that the Forms—the universal, rational concepts or ideas of reason itself—are static and fixed, and so cannot grasp the messiness within the imperfect world. Hegel is able to link reason back to our messy world by changing the definition of reason. Instead of saying that reason consists of static universals, concepts or ideas, Hegel says that the universal concepts or forms are themselves messy. Against Plato, Hegel’s dialectical method allows him to argue that universal concepts can “overgrasp” (from the German verb übergreifen) the messy, dialectical nature of the world because they, themselves, are dialectical. Moreover, because later concepts build on or sublate (cancel, but also preserve) earlier concepts, the later, more universal concepts grasp the dialectical processes of earlier concepts. As a result, higher-level concepts can grasp not only the dialectical nature of earlier concepts or forms, but also the dialectical processes that make the world itself a messy place. The highest definition of the concept of beauty, for instance, would not take beauty to be fixed and static, but would include within it the dialectical nature or finiteness of beauty, the idea that beauty becomes, on its own account, not-beauty. This dialectical understanding of the concept of beauty can then overgrasp the dialectical and finite nature of beauty in the world, and hence the truth that, in the world, beautiful things themselves become not-beautiful, or might be beautiful in one respect and not another. Similarly, the highest determination of the concept of “tree” will include within its definition the dialectical process of development and change from seed to sapling to tree. As Hegel says, dialectics is “the principle of all natural and spiritual life” (SL-M 56; SL-dG 35), or “the moving soul of scientific progression” (EL §81). Dialectics is what drives the development of both reason as well as of things in the world. A dialectical reason can overgrasp a dialectical world.

Two further journeys into the history of philosophy will help to show why Hegel chose dialectics as his method of argument. As we saw, Hegel argues against Kant’s skepticism by suggesting that reason is not only in our heads, but in the world itself. To show that reason is in the world itself, however, Hegel has to show that reason can be what it is without us human beings to help it. He has to show that reason can develop on its own, and does not need us to do the developing for it (at least for those things in the world that are not human-created). As we saw (cf. section 1), central to Hegel’s dialectics is the idea that concepts or forms develop on their own because they “self-sublate”, or sublate (cancel and preserve) themselves, and so pass into subsequent concepts or forms on their own accounts, because of their own, dialectical natures. Thus reason, as it were, drives itself, and hence does not need our heads to develop it. Hegel needs an account of self-driving reason to get beyond Kant’s skepticism.

Ironically, Hegel derives the basic outlines of his account of self-driving reason from Kant. Kant divided human rationality into two faculties: the faculty of the understanding and the faculty of reason. The understanding uses concepts to organize and regularize our experiences of the world. Reason’s job is to coordinate the concepts and categories of the understanding by developing a completely unified, conceptual system, and it does this work, Kant thought, on its own, independently of how those concepts might apply to the world. Reason coordinates the concepts of the understanding by following out necessary chains of syllogisms to produce concepts that achieve higher and higher levels of conceptual unity. Indeed, this process will lead reason to produce its own transcendental ideas, or concepts that go beyond the world of experience. Kant calls this necessary, concept-creating reason “speculative” reason (cf. Critique of Pure Reason, Bxx–xxi, A327/B384). Reason creates its own concepts or ideas—it “speculates”—by generating new and increasingly comprehensive concepts of its own, independently of the understanding. In the end, Kant thought, reason will follow out such chains of syllogisms until it develops completely comprehensive or unconditioned universals—universals that contain all of the conditions or all of the less-comprehensive concepts that help to define them. As we saw (cf. section 1), Hegel’s dialectics adopts Kant’s notion of a self-driving and concept-creating “speculative” reason, as well as Kant’s idea that reason aims toward unconditioned universality or absolute concepts.

Ultimately, Kant thought, reasons’ necessary, self-driving activity will lead it to produce contradictions—what he called the “antinomies”, which consist of a thesis and antithesis. Once reason has generated the unconditioned concept of the whole world, for instance, Kant argued, it can look at the world in two, contradictory ways. In the first antinomy, reason can see the world (1) as the whole totality or as the unconditioned, or (2) as the series of syllogisms that led up to that totality. If reason sees the world as the unconditioned or as a complete whole that is not conditioned by anything else, then it will see the world as having a beginning and end in terms of space and time, and so will conclude (the thesis) that the world has a beginning and end or limit. But if reason sees the world as the series, in which each member of the series is conditioned by the previous member, then the world will appear to be without a beginning and infinite, and reason will conclude (the antithesis) that the world does not have a limit in terms of space and time (cf. Critique of Pure Reason, A417–18/B445–6). Reason thus leads to a contradiction: it holds both that the world has a limit and that it does not have a limit at the same time. Because reason’s own process of self-development will lead it to develop contradictions or to be dialectical in this way, Kant thought that reason must be kept in check by the understanding. Any conclusions that reason draws that do not fall within the purview of the understanding cannot be applied to the world of experience, Kant said, and so cannot be considered genuine knowledge (Critique of Pure Reason, A506/B534).

Hegel adopts Kant’s dialectical conception of reason, but he liberates reason for knowledge from the tyranny of the understanding. Kant was right that reason speculatively generates concepts on its own, and that this speculative process is driven by necessity and leads to concepts of increasing universality or comprehensiveness. Kant was even right to suggest—as he had shown in the discussion of the antinomies—that reason is dialectical, or necessarily produces contradictions on its own. Again, Kant’s mistake was that he fell short of saying that these contradictions are in the world itself. He failed to apply the insights of his discussion of the antinomies to “things in themselves” (SL-M 56; SL-dG 35). Indeed, Kant’s own argument proves that the dialectical nature of reason can be applied to things themselves. The fact that reason develops those contradictions on its own, without our heads to help it, shows that those contradictions are not just in our heads, but are objective, or in the world itself. Kant, however, failed to draw this conclusion, and continued to regard reason’s conclusions as illusions. Still, Kant’s philosophy vindicated the general idea that the contradictions he took to be illusions are both objective—or out there in the world—and necessary. As Hegel puts it, Kant vindicates the general idea of “the objectivity of the illusion and the necessity of the contradiction which belongs to the nature of thought determinations” (SL-M 56; cf. SL-dG 35), or to the nature of concepts themselves.

The work of Johann Gottlieb Fichte (see entry on Fichte) showed Hegel how dialectics can get beyond Kant—beyond the contradictions that, as Kant had shown, reason (necessarily) develops on its own, beyond the reductio ad absurdum argument (which, as we saw above, holds that a contradiction leads to nothingness), and beyond Kant’s skepticism, or Kant’s claim that reason’s contradictions must be reined in by the understanding and cannot count as knowledge. Fichte argued that the task of discovering the foundation of all human knowledge leads to a contradiction or opposition between the self and the not-self (it is not important, for our purposes, why Fichte held this view). The kind of reasoning that leads to this contradiction, Fichte said, is the analytical or antithetical method of reasoning, which involves drawing out an opposition between elements (in this case, the self and not-self) that are being compared to, or equated with, one another. While the traditional reductio ad absurdum argument would lead us to reject both sides of the contradiction and start from scratch, Fichte argued that the contradiction or opposition between the self and not-self can be resolved. In particular, the contradiction is resolved by positing a third concept—the concept of divisibility—which unites the two sides (The Science of Knowledge, I: 110–11; Fichte 1982: 108–110). The concept of divisibility is produced by a synthetic procedure of reasoning, which involves “discovering in opposites the respect in which they are alike” (The Science of Knowledge, I: 112–13; Fichte 1982: 111). Indeed, Fichte argued, not only is the move to resolve contradictions with synthetic concepts or judgments possible, it is necessary. As he says of the move from the contradiction between self and not-self to the synthetic concept of divisibility,

there can be no further question as to the possibility of this [synthesis], nor can any ground for it be given; it is absolutely possible, and we are entitled to it without further grounds of any kind. (The Science of Knowledge, I: 114; Fichte 1982: 112)

Since the analytical method leads to oppositions or contradictions, he argued, if we use only analytic judgments, “we not only do not get very far, as Kant says; we do not get anywhere at all” (The Science of Knowledge, I: 113; Fichte 1982: 112). Without the synthetic concepts or judgments, we are left, as the classic reductio ad absurdum argument suggests, with nothing at all. The synthetic concepts or judgments are thus necessary to get beyond contradiction without leaving us with nothing.

Fichte’s account of the synthetic method provides Hegel with the key to moving beyond Kant. Fichte suggested that a synthetic concept that unifies the results of a dialectically-generated contradiction does not completely cancel the contradictory sides, but only limits them. As he said, in general, “[t]o limit something is to abolish its reality, not wholly, but in part only” (The Science of Knowledge, I: 108; Fichte 1982: 108). Instead of concluding, as a reductio ad absurdum requires, that the two sides of a contradiction must be dismissed altogether, the synthetic concept or judgment retroactively justifies the opposing sides by demonstrating their limit, by showing which part of reality they attach to and which they do not (The Science of Knowledge, I: 108–10; Fichte 1982: 108–9), or by determining in what respect and to what degree they are each true. For Hegel, as we saw (cf. section 1), later concepts and forms sublate—both cancel and preserve—earlier concepts and forms in the sense that they include earlier concepts and forms in their own definitions. From the point of view of the later concepts or forms, the earlier ones still have some validity, that is, they have a limited validity or truth defined by the higher-level concept or form.

Dialectically generated contradictions are therefore not a defect to be reigned in by the understanding, as Kant had said, but invitations for reason to “speculate”, that is, for reason to generate precisely the sort of increasingly comprehensive and universal concepts and forms that Kant had said reason aims to develop. Ultimately, Hegel thought, as we saw (cf. section 1), the dialectical process leads to a completely unconditioned concept or form for each subject matter—the Absolute Idea (logic), Absolute Spirit (phenomenology), Absolute Idea of right and law (Philosophy of Right), and so on—which, taken together, form the “circle of circles” (EL §15) that constitutes the whole philosophical system or “Idea” (EL §15) that both overgrasps the world and makes it understandable (for us).

Note that, while Hegel was clearly influenced by Fichte’s work, he never adopted Fichte’s triadic “thesis—antithesis—synthesis” language in his descriptions of his own philosophy (Mueller 1958: 411–2; Solomon 1983: 23), though he did apparently use it in his lectures to describe Kant’s philosophy (LHP III: 477). Indeed, Hegel criticized formalistic uses of the method of “triplicity [Triplizität]” (PhG §50; alternative translation) inspired by Kant—a criticism that could well have been aimed at Fichte. Hegel argued that Kantian-inspired uses of triadic form had been reduced to “a lifeless schema” and “an actual semblance [eigentlichen Scheinen]” (PhG §50; alternative translation) that, like a formula in mathematics, was simply imposed on top of subject matters. Instead, a properly scientific use of Kant’s “triplicity” should flow—as he said his own dialectical method did (see section 1)—out of “the inner life and self-movement” (PhG §51) of the content.

5. Syntactic patterns and special terminology in Hegel’s dialectics

Although Hegel’s dialectics is driven by syntax, semantics and considerations specific to the different subject matters (section 3 above), several important syntactic patterns appear repeatedly throughout his works. In many places, the dialectical process is driven by a syntactic necessity that is really a kind of exhaustion: when the current strategy has been exhausted, the process is forced, necessarily, to employ a new strategy. As we saw (section 2), once the strategy of treating Being and Nothing as separate concepts is exhausted, the dialectical process must, necessarily, adopt a different strategy, namely, one that takes the two concepts together. The concept of Becoming captures the first way in which Being and Nothing are taken together. In the stages of Quantum through Number, the concepts of One and Many take turns defining all the elements (cf. Maybee 2009, xviii–xix):

4 figures each contains a rounded corner rectangle bisected by a vertical rod. In #1 the rectangle boundary is labeled 'One' and each half is labeled 'Many'; the caption reads:'Quantum: 'one' refers to the outer boundary, 'many' within. #2 has the boundary also labeled 'One' but the halves labeled 'ones'; the caption reads: Number: 'one' on all sides. #3 has the boundary labeled 'Many' and the halves labeled 'Each a one'; the caption reads: Extensive and Intensive Magnitude: 'many' on the outer boundary, 'one' within'. #4 the rounded rectangle is enclosed by a box; the two halves are labeled 'Many (within)' and the space between the rectangle and the box is labeled 'Many (without)'; the caption reads: Degree: 'many' on all sides.

Figure 9

Since One and Many have been exhausted, the next stage, Ratio, must, necessarily, employ a different strategy to grasp the elements in play. Just as Being-for-itself is a concept of universality for Quality and captures the character of a set of something-others in its content (see section 1), so Ratio (the whole rectangle with rounded corners) is a concept of universality for Quantity and captures the character of a set of quantities in its content (EL §105–6; cf. Maybee 2009, xviii–xix, 95–7).

In a second, common syntactic pattern, the dialectical development leads to an endless, back-and-forth process—a bad or “spurious” infinity (EL §94)—between two concepts or forms. Hegel’s dialectics cannot rest with spurious infinities. So long as the dialectical process is passing endlessly back and forth between two elements, it is never finished, and the concept or form in play cannot be determined. Spurious infinities must therefore be resolved or stopped, and they are always resolved by a higher-level, more universal concept. In some cases, a new, higher-level concept is introduced that stops the spurious infinity by grasping the whole, back-and-forth process. Being-for-itself (cf. section 1), for instance, is introduced as a new, more universal concept that embraces—and hence stops—the whole, back-and-forth process between “something-others”. However, if the back-and-forth process takes place between a concept and its own content—in which case the concept already embraces the content—then that embracing concept is redefined in a new way that grasps the whole, back-and-forth process. The new definition raises the embracing concept to a higher level of universality—as a totality (an “all”) or as a complete and completed concept. Examples from logic include the redefinition of Appearance as the whole World of Appearance (EL §132; cf. SL-M 505–7, SL-dG 443–4), the move in which the endless, back-and-forth process of Real Possibility redefines the Condition as a totality (EL §147; cf. SL-M 547, SL-dG 483), and the move in which a back-and-forth process created by finite Cognition and finite Willing redefines the Subjective Idea as Absolute Idea (EL §§234–5; cf. SL-M 822–3, SL-dG 733–4).

Some of the most famous terms in Hegel’s works—“in itself”, “for itself” and “in and for itself”—capture other, common, syntactic patterns. A concept or form is “in itself” when it has a determination that it gets by being defined against its “other” (cf. Being-in-itself, EL §91). A concept or form is “for itself” when it is defined only in relation to its own content, so that, while it is technically defined in relation to an “other”, the “other” is not really an “other” for it. As a result, it is really defined only in relation to itself. Unlike an “in itself” concept or form, then, a “for itself” concept or form seems to have its definition on its own, or does not need a genuine “other” to be defined (like other concepts or forms, however, “for itself” concepts or forms turn out to be dialectical too, and hence push on to new concepts or forms). In the logic, Being-for-itself (cf. section 1), which is defined by embracing the “something others” in its content, is the first, “for itself” concept or form.

A concept or form is “in and for itself” when it is doubly “for itself”, or “for itself” not only in terms of content—insofar as it embraces its content—but also in terms of form or presentation, insofar as it also has the activity of presenting its content. It is “for itself” (embraces its content) for itself (through its own activity), or not only embraces its content (the “for itself” of content) but also presents its content through its own activity (the “for itself” of form). The second “for itself” of form provides the concept with a logical activity (i.e., presenting its contents) and hence a definition that goes beyond—and so is separate from—the definition that its content has. Since it has a definition of its own that is separate from the definition of its content, it comes to be defined—in the “in itself” sense—against its content, which has become its “other”. Because this “other” is still its own content, however, the concept or form is both “in itself” but also still “for itself” at the same time, or is “in and for itself” (EL §§148–9; cf. Maybee 2009: 244–6). The “in and for itself” relationship is the hallmark of a genuine Concept (EL §160), and captures the idea that a genuine concept is defined not only from the bottom up by its content, but also from the top down through its own activity of presenting its content. The genuine concept of animal, for instance, is not only defined by embracing its content (namely, all animals) from the bottom up, but also has a definition of its own, separate from that content, that leads it to determine, from the top down, what counts as an animal.

Other technical, syntactic terms include aufheben (“to sublate”), which we already saw (section 1), and “abstract”. To say that a concept or form is “abstract” is to say that it is only a partial definition. Hegel describes the moment of understanding, for instance, as abstract (EL §§79, 80) because it is a one-sided or restricted definition or determination (section 1). Conversely, a concept or form is “concrete” in the most basic sense when it has a content or definition that it gets from being built out of other concepts or forms. As we saw (section 2), Hegel regarded Becoming as the first concrete concept in the logic.

Although Hegel’s writing and his use of technical terms can make his philosophy notoriously difficult, his work can also be very rewarding. In spite of—or perhaps because of—the difficulty, there are a surprising number of fresh ideas in his work that have not yet been fully explored in philosophy.


English Translations of Key Texts by Hegel

  • [EL] The Encyclopedia Logic: Part 1 of the Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences [Enzyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften I], translated by T.F. Geraets, W.A. Suchting, and H.S. Harris, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1991.
  • [LHP], Lectures on the History of Philosophy [Geschichte der Philosophie], in three volumes, translated by E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson, New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1974.
  • [PhG], Phenomenology of Spirit [Phänomenologie des Geistes], translated by A.V. Miller, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • [PR], Elements of the Philosophy of Right [Philosophie des Rechts], edited by Allen W. Wood and translated by H.B. Nisbet, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • [SL-dG], The Science of Logic [Wissenschaft der Logik], translated by George di Giovanni, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • [SL-M], The Science of Logic [Wissenschaft der Logik], translated by A.V. Miller, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.

English Translations of Other Primary Sources

  • Aristotle, 1954, The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation (in two volumes), edited by Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press. (Citations to Aristotle’s text use the Bekker numbers, which appear in the margins of many translations of Aristotle’s works.)
  • Fichte, J.G., 1982 [1794/95], The Science of Knowledge, translated by Peter Heath and John Lachs, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (Citations to Fichte’s work include references to the volume and page number in the German edition of Fichte’s collected works edited by I.H Fichte, which are used in the margins of many translations of Fichte’s works.)
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1999 [1781], Critique of Pure Reason, translated and edited by Paul Guyer and Allen Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (Citations to Kant’s text use the “Ak.” numbers, which appear in the margins of many translations of Kant’s works.)
  • Plato, 1961, The Collected Dialogues of Plato: Including the Letters, edited by Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton University Press. (Citations to Plato’s text use the Stephanus numbers, which appear in the margins of many translations of Plato’s works.)

Secondary Literature

  • Bencivenga, Ermanno, 2000, Hegel’s Dialectical Logic, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Burbidge, John, 1981, On Hegel’s Logic: Fragments of a Commentary, Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • Findlay, J.N., 1962, Hegel: A Re-Examination, New York: Collier Books.
  • –––, 1966, Review of Hegel: Reinterpretation, Texts, and Commentary, by Walter Kaufmann. The Philosophical Quarterly (1950–), 16(65): 366–68.
  • Forster, Michael, 1993, “Hegel’s Dialectical Method”, in The Cambridge Companion to Hegel, Frederick C. Beiser (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 130–170.
  • Fritzman, J.M., 2014, Hegel, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Harris, Errol E., 1983, An Interpretation of the Logic of Hegel, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Harris, H.S. (Henry Silton), 1997, Hegel’s Ladder (in two volumes: vol. I, The Pilgrimage of Reason, and vol. II, The Odyssey of Spirit), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company).
  • Hyppolite, Jean, 1974, Genesis and Structure of Hegel’s “Phenomenology of Spirit”, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • Kaufmann, Walter Arnold, 1965, Hegel: Reinterpretation, Texts, and Commentary, Garden City, NY: Doubleday and Company Inc.
  • –––, 1966, A Reinterpretation, Garden City, NY: Anchor Books. (This book is a republication of the first part of Hegel: Reinterpretation, Texts, and Commentary.)
  • Kosok, Michael, 1972, “The Formalization of Hegel’s Dialectical Logic: Its Formal Structure, Logical Interpretation and Intuitive Foundation”, in Hegel: A Collection of Critical Essays, Alisdair MacIntyre (ed.), Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press: 237–87.
  • Lauer, Quentin, 1976, A Reading of Hegel’s “Phenomenology of Spirit”, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Maybee, Julie E., 2009, Picturing Hegel: An Illustrated Guide to Hegel’s “Encyclopaedia Logic”, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • McTaggart, John McTaggart Ellis, 1964 [1910], A Commentary of Hegel’s Logic, New York: Russell and Russell Inc. (This edition is a reissue of McTaggart’s book, which was first published in 1910.)
  • Mueller, Gustav, 1958, “The Hegel Legend of ‘Synthesis-Antithesis-Thesis’”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 19(3): 411–14.
  • Mure, G.R.G., 1950, A Study of Hegel’s Logic, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pinkard, Terry, 1988, Hegel’s Dialectic: The Explanation of a Possibility, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • Rosen, Michael, 1982, Hegel’s Dialectic and its Criticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rosen, Stanley, 2014, The Idea of Hegel’s “Science of Logic”, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Singer, Peter, 1983, Hegel, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Solomon, Robert C., 1983, In the Spirit of Hegel: A Study of G.W.F. Hegel’s “Phenomenology of Spirit”, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Stace, W.T., 1955 [1924], The Philosophy of Hegel: A Systematic Exposition, New York: Dover Publications. (This edition is a reprint of the first edition, published in 1924.)
  • Stewart, Jon, 1996, “Hegel’s Doctrine of Determinate Negation: An Example from ‘Sense-certainty’ and ‘Perception’”, Idealistic Studies, 26(1): 57–78.
  • –––, 2000, The Unity of Hegel’s “Phenomenology of Spirit”: A Systematic Interpretation, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • Taylor, Charles, 1975, Hegel, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Westphal, Kenneth R., 2003, Hegel’s Epistemology: A Philosophical Introduction to the “Phenomenology of Spirit”, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Winfield, Richard Dien, 1990, “The Method of Hegel’s Science of Logic”, in Essays on Hegel’s Logic, George di Giovanni (ed.), Albany, NY: State University of New York, pp. 45–57.

Other Internet Resources

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