Heinrich Rickert was born in Gdańsk (then Danzig, in Prussia) on May 25th 1863. His father Heinrich Rickert Sr. (1833–1902) was a politician and editor in Berlin. Heinrich Sr. was a liberal democrat particularly invested in the cause of the German Jews. In 1890 Heinrich Sr. founded the Society Against Anti-Semitism in Berlin (Zijderveld 2006, 9). This is an interesting fact about Rickert Jr.’s background, considering that he eventually worked to support the appointment of philosophers of Jewish descent, such as Edmund Husserl and Georg Simmel, who were not under the protective wing of Hermann Cohen, the head of the Marburg School of Neo-Kantianism (see below) and a very influential Jewish thinker.
Between 1884 and 1885 Rickert was enrolled at the University of Berlin, where he attended lectures from the philosopher Friedrich Paulsen (1846–1908). In 1885 he moved to Strasbourg (then Straßburg and part of the Prussian Reich) where he attended the Neo-Kantian philosopher Wilhelm Windelband’s lectures. Windelband (1848–1915) was a major source of inspiration for Rickert’s work and he completed a dissertation on The Theory of Definition (Rickert 1915) under Windelband’s supervision in 1888. In the same year he married Sophie Keibel, a sculptor from Berlin. They had four children.
In 1889 Rickert moved to Freiburg for health-related reasons. Rickert’s health was always precarious. After undergoing intestinal surgery in 1896 he suffered lifelong intercostal neuralgia and he developed agoraphobia. In spite of his health problems, Rickert was able to complete his Habilitation under Alois Riehl (1844–1924) in Freiburg, where he was appointed extraordinary professor in 1894 and ordinary professor in 1896. The dissertation he produced for the Habilitation, The Object of Knowledge, is one of his most important works and a milestone in early twentieth century Neo-Kantianism.
Rickert remained in Freiburg until 1915, when he accepted an offer from the University of Heidelberg to replace his recently deceased mentor Windelband, who had moved there from Strasbourg in 1903. He taught in Heidelberg until 1932, when he retired. He died on July 25th 1936 in Heidelberg and was buried in Gdańsk.
Rickert had a long and successful academic career. He received several awards and honorary degrees. He taught and in some cases supervised important German thinkers of the next generation, such as Martin Heidegger (1889–1976), Emil Lask (1875–1915) and Walter Benjamin (1892–1940). He had close intellectual exchanges with leading figures of his time, including Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911), Georg Simmel (1858–1918), Edmund Husserl (1859–1938), Max Weber (1864–1920) and Karl Jaspers (1883–1969). Although very few of his writings are available in English, in recent years there has been a growing interest in Rickert’s work, both to the extent that it influenced other philosophers and as a significant contribution to the discipline in its own right.
Rickert was a very prolific writer. He managed his publications in a way that should strike the contemporary reader as familiar. He would present new ideas and lines of inquiry first in exploratory journal articles (many of them published in Logos, the journal he founded in Freiburg) and subsequently he would incorporate them in larger publications, often including previously published materials. Following a common trend in his time, he kept working at his two major books, The Object of Knowledge (first published in 1892) and The Limits of Concept-Formation in Natural Science (first published in 1902), for his entire life. Instead of writing new books he would rewrite entire chapters and add new sections to his two magna opera, thereby addressing criticism and sometimes even changing significantly his previous views. So, for instance, The Object of Knowledge grew from the 91 pages of the first edition to the 460 pages of the sixth edition in 1928. This style of writing makes the development of his thought particularly perspicuous. However, in spite of his constant revisions and additions, the fundamental principles of Rickert’s philosophy remained constant throughout his career. In keeping with his systematic understanding of philosophy (see below), his approach to new problems was geared towards connecting them to old problems, and his way of handling criticism was often characterized by an effort to reformulate his opponent’s views so as to make them compatible with his own.
- 1. Southwestern Neo-Kantianism vs. Marburg Neo-Kantianism
- 2. Theory of Knowledge
- 3. Theory of Science
- 4. The philosophy of values and the philosophy of history
- 5. Metaphilosophy
- 6. Ontology and Metaphysics
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Rickert is considered the head of the so-called Southwestern or Baden school of Neo-Kantianism, whose exponents worked in the philosophy departments at Freiburg and Heidelberg, both in the region of Baden in southwestern Germany. The Southwestern school stands in contrast to the so-called Marburg school, spearheaded by Hermann Cohen (1842–1918) and continued by Paul Natorp (1854–1924) and Ernst Cassirer (1874–1945). (For an overview of the two schools see Crowell 1999.)
In spite of their fierce opposition, the two schools present elements of similarity alongside the numerous elements of difference. These have been recently debated among Neo-Kantianism scholars (Krijnen 2001, 77–93; Krijnen/Noras 2012). One indisputably common element between the two schools is the preoccupation with the problem of validity, or Geltung, which is arguably the systematic core of Neo-Kantianism in general (Krijnen 2001, 84). Philosophy for the Neo-Kantians is concerned with the systematic elucidation of the a priori principles that allow for valid thinking in various spheres of knowledge. In keeping with Kant’s first Critique, valid thinking is not merely logically consistent thinking. Valid thinking requires, over and above the adherence to the laws of formal logic, thinking in accordance with the a priori principles governing the intelligibility of a given area of reality. These will be, for instance, the principles of causality, substantiality etc. in the sphere of physical nature and principles such as good and evil, responsibility, freedom, etc. in the sphere of ethics. It is the task of philosophy to identify these a priori principles in all the different spheres of culture, including politics, biology, art, history, etc. Helmuth Plessner captures metaphorically the spirit of Neo-Kantianism when he characterizes the Neo-Kantians as “botanists in the garden of the a priori” (Plessner 1974, 185).
In their attempt to clarify the way in which we should think of such principles, both the Southwestern and the Marburg Neo-Kantians reject any kind of psychological reading, which dominated among early 19th Century interpretations of Kant. The a priori principles of valid thinking are not mere facts about human psychology; they do not describe merely how our mind happens to function. Their validity is objective, that is, it is part of the formal structure of the objects of investigation and not merely an extrinsic mental scheme that exemplars of the species homo sapiens contingently apply to them.
Moreover, both schools were rather unenthusiastic about the label ‘Neo-Kantianism’. Their goal was not to go “back to Kant”, as Otto Liebmann (1840–1912) famously urged philosophers to do in his Kant und die Epigonen (Liebmann 1865), but, rather, to move forward beyond Kant building on his original views. Windelband, Rickert’s mentor and the forefather of Southwestern Neo-Kantianism, pronounced: “To understand Kant means to move beyond him” (Windelband 1915, IV). Likewise, the Marburg school leader Cohen pointed out: “From the very beginning I was concerned with developing Kant’s system further” (Cohen 1902, VII).
The two schools, however, diverge significantly in their interpretation of Kant. While the Marburg school was predominantly interested in the Critique of Pure Reason (Cohen 1885) and considered it to be an essay in the philosophical foundation of Newtonian science (a reading that is still prominent among contemporary Kant scholars, such as Friedmann 1992), Rickert and the Southwesterners emphasized the importance of reading Kant as a whole and considered the centerpiece of his philosophical program to be the system of the faculties outlined in the introduction to the Critique of Judgment (Rickert 1924b, 167). For Rickert, in particular, already in Kant’s first Critique “the focal point […] is not in the transcendental aesthetic and analytic but rather in the dialectic, and this means that the main problem of this work is not a theory of the experiential sciences (Erfahrungswissenschaften). Rather, it revolves around the old, ever-recurring problems of metaphysics. The work on these problems becomes the foundation for an encompassing theory of worldview culminating in the treatment of issues in the philosophy of religion. The theory of mathematics and physics is merely preparatory for the treatment of these issues” (Rickert 1924b, 153). Rickert’s Kant is primarily a philosopher of human culture at large, interested in questions about the meaning and value of our life in the world, whereas Cohen’s Kant is primarily (albeit not exclusively) a philosopher of the natural sciences. Incidentally, the largely ignored influence of Rickert’s Kant-interpretation is still vivid in Heidegger’s acclaimed book Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics (Heidegger 1997).
From these diverging interpretations of Kant flows another fundamental theoretical difference between the two schools. This difference has been effectively phrased by Rickert’s student, Emil Lask in terms of “pan-logism”, attributed to the Marburg Neo-Kantians, versus the “pan-archy of logos”, attributed to the Southwestern Neo-Kantians (Lask 1923, 133; Crowell 2010). If we take the distinction between intuition (Anschauung) and concept (Begriff) to be the fundamental paradigm of Kantian transcendentalism, then in Lask’s eyes the Marburg Neo-Kantians are committed to a kind of ‘pan-logism’ to the extent that they tend to minimize the role of intuition. As is particularly evident, for instance, in Natorp (1911, 26–67), for the Marburg Neo-Kantians whatever we might be tempted to consider a pure given or a raw datum of experience can be analyzed into an underlying thought-process, whereby the given is actually constructed according to a conceptually articulable (i.e., logical) pattern. Every alleged pure given (Gegebenes) is actually a task (Aufgegebenes) for conceptual thinking and can be resolved into an underlying thought process governed by logical a priori principles.
By contrast, Rickert and the Southwestern Neo-Kantians emphasize the ultimate irreducibility of what is given in intuition to conceptual forms. While everything can be grasped by concepts, and therefore no domain of reality and cultural life eludes in principle conceptual mastery (pan-archy), nothing can be grasped exhaustively by concepts, and therefore our rationality has to constantly take into account an irrational residue intrinsic to every conceptual construction. To conceptualize, for Rickert, is to recast the materials delivered immediately by the senses into a conceptual form. In so doing, we necessarily have to be selective, that is, we have to leave out of consideration an overwhelming amount of elements and take up in our conceptuality only those elements that match the criteria originally established for the purpose of solving our theoretical task. To give a simple example, in order to conceptualize, say, linear motion we have to isolate from the overwhelming amount of data stemming from the senses only those features that pertain to the movement of bodies (spatial location, speed, reciprocal position, etc.) and leave out of consideration everything else. This general characterization can serve as a prelude to Rickert’s theory of knowledge, which is the theme of the next section.
For us, epistemology has become a matter of good conscience, and we will not be prepared to listen to anyone who fails to justify his ideas on this basis. (Rickert 1986, 21)
For Rickert epistemology or Erkenntnistheorie (‘theory of knowledge’) has to be the point of departure and the systematic foundation of philosophy as a whole. He often uses interchangeably the words “logic” (Logik), “theory of knowledge” (Erkenntnistheorie), “methodology” (Methodologie), “theory of truth” (Wahrheitslehre) and “theory of science” (Wissenschaftslehre). (See for instance Rickert 1986, 19; Rickert 1909, 170.) This is because ultimately all these phrases refer to one and the same problem, i.e., the problem of the validity of thought and the principles on which valid thought rests. Erkenntnistheorie, therefore, is his preferred phrase because it makes this fundamental problem most explicit.
Rickert’s theory of knowledge is designed to answer the following question: “what is the subject-independent yardstick of knowledge? In other words, through what does knowledge receive its objectivity?” (Rickert 1921a, 1) Or, following the title of his major work in the theory of knowledge, what is the object of knowledge? In asking this question Rickert is explicitly setting up a transcendental argument that can be summarized as follow: given that (1) there is knowledge and that (2) knowledge as true thought can be contrasted to mere thought in that it grasps some thought-independent object, how are we to think this thought-independent object? (Rickert 1909, 170) Therefore Rickert rejects the idea that the theory of knowledge should somehow respond to skepticism (Rickert 1921a, 7; Rickert 1909, 174). To the extent that skepticism negates the very possibility of knowledge it cannot be meaningfully addressed in a theory that sets out to determine precisely what knowledge is. Nonetheless Rickert believes that a modified version of skeptical doubt, which he compares to Husserl’s epoché (Rickert 1921a, 12), is beneficial to the theory of knowledge. The theory of knowledge cannot begin without some presuppositions, in particular, that there are true thoughts in which a subject successfully grasps an object. “However, the theory of knowledge ought to be ‘presuppositionless’ in the sense that it ought to limit as much as possible the presuppositions upon which the objectivity of knowledge rests” (Rickert 1921a, 12). It is through the exercise of doubt that we get to raise the key question as to whether we necessarily have to posit a transcendent reality existing independently of consciousness as the source of validation for knowledge. The pursuit of the object of knowledge, then, leads straight to the problem of transcendence and its relation to the knowing subject. Note that Rickert is not questioning one of the inescapable assumptions of any theory of knowledge, namely, that there has to be some subject-independent yardstick or criterion that validates knowledge. He is questioning whether this subject-independent criterion has to be understood as a transcendent reality, for instance, a world of mind-independent and presumably physical things in themselves. His conclusion will be precisely that this transcendent criterion cannot be meaningfully conceived of as a reality and that only values can be considered genuinely transcendent.
Rickert argues that we can tackle the problem of the theory of knowledge in two ways: “One can begin first with an analysis of the real act of knowledge as a psychic process and then, from there, move progressively to determine the transcendent object. Secondly, one can attempt to reach as quickly as possible the sphere of the transcendent object and deal with it in a purely ‘logical’ fashion without considering the psychic act of knowing” (Rickert 1909, 174). He labels these two approaches the “transcendental-psychological” (or subjective) and the “transcendental-logical” (or objective) ways (Rickert 1909, 174). While in the first editions of The Object of Knowledge Rickert privileged the transcendental-psychological way, in the early 1900s he introduced the transcendental-logical way and incorporated it into later editions of the book, arguing that the two ways should be considered complementary.
The most important move at the beginning of the subjective way is to determine the notions of subject and object that the theory of knowledge can legitimately operate with, and, in particular to characterize “the epistemological subject” (das erkenntnistheoretische Subjekt) (Rickert 1921a, 41). Rickert examines three different subject/object dichotomies. (1) We can define the object in spatial terms as what is out there in the world. This is what the expression ‘external world’ seems to refer to. Correspondingly, the subject, too, will be defined in spatial terms as the animated body, for which there are spatial surroundings populated by objects. The first dichotomy construes subject and object as “two bodies” (Rickert 1921a, 14) facing each other in physical space. (2) We can construe a second dichotomy, in which we take our body, too, to be an object like other objects and consider ‘subject’ to refer exclusively to consciousness. “In this second case my consciousness and its content are the subject, and therefore the object is everything that is not my content of consciousness or my consciousness itself” (Rickert 1921a, 15). This second dichotomy captures the traditional distinction between immanence and transcendence. (3) A third dichotomy ensues from a further distinction that we can carry out within the sphere of immanence, that is, the distinction between the ego and its representations, or between any content of consciousness and consciousness itself. In this third case representations, perceptions, feelings, emotions etc. would be the object and the subject would be the ego standing over against them.
Based on these dichotomies, it seems that the problem of transcendence and its possible denial only pertains to (2). It would not make sense to question the transcendence of the object if by object we mean what occupies the spatial surroundings of a psychophysical human subject and, similarly, it would not make sense to deny the transcendence of our representations, perceptions, emotions etc. from the point of view of the pure ego-subject undergoing such representations, perceptions, emotions, etc. Following the subjective way, we should then set out to determine whether we necessarily have to posit the existence of transcendent objects independent from the contents of our consciousness. We should, it seems, assume what the positivists have called “the standpoint of immanence” (Rickert 1921a, 21) and see if there is some rationally justifiable way to infer our way out of it.
This conception however, is misleading and if we took it as our point of departure it would put the whole enterprise of the theory of knowledge in jeopardy. Who or what is the subject, for which the problem of transcendence can be meaningfully posed? Rickert indicates that the three concepts of subject considered above ought to be seen in their mutual relations. If we begin with the psychophysical subject in (1), we can obtain the notion of subject in (2) by way of a progressive ‘objectification’ of the body (Rickert 1921a, 35). I can progressively consider each part of my body as itself an ‘object’ or content of my consciousness and once the whole body has been ‘purged out’ the result will be a purely psychic subject, which Rickert defines as “the limit concept (Grenzbegriff) of the series, in which the physical component in the subject becomes progressively smaller” (Rickert 1921a, 36). In a similar way, we can continue the process of ‘de-objectification’ of the subject and consider each and every mental state as itself an object for an absolutely non-objective and non-objectifiable ego. In this way we reach the authentic epistemological subject, the identical “subject-factor” (Rickert 1921a, 42) that provides the form ‘subjectivity’ to every possible content of consciousness. Following Kant’s terminology Rickert designates the epistemological subject “consciousness in general”, that is, a “nameless, generic, impersonal consciousness” (Rickert 1921a, 42). This consciousness in general has to be distinguished sharply not only from the individual psychophysical human subject but also from the individual psychic subject with its empirical mental states.
Rickert insists: “The question regarding immanence or transcendence only makes epistemological sense with respect to the epistemological subject or consciousness in general” (Rickert 1921a, 43). From this perspective, “to be immanent means nothing but to carry the form of being-conscious (Bewußtheit) and to be transcendent means to really exist without such form” (Rickert 1921a, 48). Given these definitions, Rickert contends that while there are many good reasons to reject psychological idealism, if one holds fast to consciousness in general there is no good reason to posit the existence of a transcendent reality beyond the sphere encompassed by the epistemological subject. His theory of knowledge is therefore committed to transcendental idealism. In order to defend this point Rickert examines three types of arguments that have been traditionally played out against transcendental idealism as defenses of the necessity to posit a transcendent reality: (1) transcendence as the unexperienced cause of conscious experiences (Rickert 1921a, 62–73); (2) transcendence as necessary in order to fill the gaps in our conscious experiences (Rickert 1921a, 74–84); (3) transcendence as the objective counterpart of our will, that is, as the correlate of the experience of a resistance and constraint to our willful actions (Rickert 1921a, 84–93). All these arguments, however, only show that we cannot reduce reality to psychic existence. In other words, they are good arguments only against a psychological idealism à la Berkeley according to which reality would coincide with our empirical mental states. From the point of view of the epistemological subject, however, both psychic and physical occurrences are objects whose reality is encompassed by the form ‘consciousness in general’. A transcendental idealist, then, emphatically agrees that there is an extra-mental physical reality causing the occurrence of mental states in empirical subjects. To the extent that they are experienced or experienceable, however, both extra-mental (physical things) and intra-mental realities (mental states) have to be seen as content of consciousness, namely, of transcendental consciousness in general. It is important to remember that by ‘consciousness in general’ Rickert means no individual psychic subject but the general form of subjective accessibility. In other words, to say that all reality is a content of consciousness does not mean that all reality is psychic. It means that all reality (both psychic and physical) is encompassed by a general form of subjectivity, which makes it available for theoretical determination. Commenting on his own brand of transcendental idealism, Rickert states: “our standpoint is the true realism” (Rickert 1921a, 104), in that it refuses to counterpose an immanent psychic reality to an inaccessible transcendent reality to be posited via inferential reasoning. Rickert insists that transcendental idealism considers real precisely the reality that we encounter in everyday life through sensory experience, consisting of immediately aware psychic and physical occurrences. What it rejects is that this reality can be meaningfully construed as transcendent vis-à-vis consciousness in general.
The reason why one might be prone to reject transcendental idealism is a wrong conception of what knowledge really is all about. Rickert labels this conception the copy-theory or pictorial theory (Abbildtheorie) of knowledge. According to this conception, “the act of knowing has to depict (abbilden) a reality independent from its activity of representing (vorstellen)” (Rickert 1921a, 119). The rejection of a pictorial theory of cognition and the ensuing intuitionism (according to which to know is merely to intuit some mind-independent real or noetic object), remains a constant in Rickert’s philosophy (see Rickert 1934a; Staiti 2013a). It also connects Rickert with other Neo-Kantians, including Natorp and Cassirer in Marburg, who likewise reject the notion that knowledge is a merely picturing representation of the object (see Holzey 2010; Kubalica 2013).
In order to expose the untenable notions in the pictorial theory of knowledge Rickert introduces a distinction between the form and the content of cognition. While nothing is wrong with the idea that in order to have knowledge we have to take up in some representations some content, what distinguishes knowledge from other kinds of representation must be sought in its form. If I say of a piece of paper that it is white, then certainly “my representation reproduces what is real with respect to the white, and this is why the statement is true” (Rickert 1921a, 125). However, this is not all. “In the statement at issue (this piece of paper is white), in fact, not only is the being-white asserted alongside the being-white, but rather, the white as ‘property’ is also attributed to a ‘thing’, and, in so being, the being-white is determined more specifically. Thing and property, however, are, as much as being and reality, concepts that do not belong in the content of knowledge. One has to know beforehand what it means epistemologically that a ‘thing’ has a ‘property’ and what the objectivity of this piece of knowledge rests upon in order to be able to say: ‘the thought: this piece of paper is white grasps what is real through pictorial representations” (Rickert 1921a, 125–126; Rickert 1909, 177). The theorist of knowledge cannot overlook the gulf that exists between the pre-discursive perceptual experience of seeing a white piece of paper and the articulation of the true judgment ‘this piece of paper is white’. The judgment does not merely mirror or depict perceptual reality. Rather, the judgment transforms and reshapes the perceptual material delivered by the senses by way casting it into a new form, whose legitimacy does not rest in the faithful depiction of the perceptual scene but in the logical validity of such forms. The problem of the pictorial theory of cognition is that it “ignores the form” (Rickert 1909, 178).
These considerations lead to one of the key theses in Rickert’s theory of knowledge: “The fundamental problem of the theory of knowledge is the question regarding the yardstick or the object of judging (Rickert 1921a, 131–132). The epistemological subject is not merely a representational subject, but rather a judging subject. Judgment is for Rickert the place where the standpoint of immanence is necessarily broken and the genuine meaning of transcendence becomes manifest. In his analysis of judgment Rickert draws a sharp distinction between the psychological act of judging and the content (Gehalt) of a judgment, which parallels Husserl’s treatment of the same issue in Logical Investigations (Husserl 1973). While the act of judging, say, that 2 + 2 = 4 is a psychic occurrence unfolding in time and differing for each empirical subject making this judgment, the objective content grasped by this act, the true relation 2 + 2 = 4 is timelessly valid and it is one over and against the many psychic acts directed towards it. Moreover, if by real we mean either a psychic or a physical entity, then the content of the judgment 2 + 2 = 4 has to be deemed “unreal” (Rickert 1921a, 145). Taking notice of the objective content of an act and reflecting back on the psychological act of judging that intends such content we also have to highlight a third component of a judgment, which Rickert labels “immanent sense” of the act (Rickert 1921a, 145), i.e. that which orients the act towards the judged content. As one commentator puts it: “the immanent sense of the judgment stands in an intermediate position between the real psychic act and the unreal logical content” (Oliva 2006, 97). It is the function (Leistung) performed by the psychic act seen purely and exclusively in its functionality of connecting psychological subjectivity and logical objectivity. Determining what kind of immanent function characterizes judgments and how this function sets them apart from other kinds of psychic occurrences is Rickert’s next step.
In order to grasp the epistemological essence of judgment and its relation to the fundamental epistemological problem of transcendence we have to describe its difference from a mere representation or string of representations. The best way to characterize the specific essence of judgment is by “considering the judgment the answer to a question” (Rickert 1921a, 153). Rickert thus identifies the essence of judgment is thus in the function of “affirmation or negation” (Rickert 1921a, 154), thereby following a trend in logic that dates back to Brentano (see Brentano 1995, 194–234). If we consider exclusively the representational content, the judgment, “this paper is white”, and the question, “is this paper white?” do not differ in the slightest. The same representational elements are there in a meaningful connection. The genuine performance of judgment, for Rickert, is all contained in the ‘yes’ or ‘no’ that we could answer to the question, thereby taking a stance with regards to the represented content. In fact, what distinguishes judgment from all sorts of representations is the moment of ‘stance-taking’ (Stellungnehmen) expressed by the words ‘yes’ or ‘no’. Judging should then be considered a “practical comportment (Verhalten)” (Rickert 1921a, 165), in which something is acknowledged as true or rejected as false. In this regard, judging has to be considered an “act of valuing” (Rickert 1921a, 165). What is it, however, that elicits from the epistemological subject an act of stance-taking? Rickert explains: “With our act of affirming we can only orient ourselves toward requirements (Forderungen), only vis-à-vis a requirement can we comport ourselves in an endorsing fashion. In this way we have obtained the broadest concept for the object of knowledge. What is known, that is, what is affirmed or acknowledged in the act of judgment must be located in the sphere of the ‘ought’ (Sollen)” (Rickert 1909, 184). This is the kind of transcendence that Rickert set out to determine at the beginning. The object of knowledge has to be conceived as transcendent, however, not as a transcendent reality mirrored by a psychological act of representation but as a “transcendent ought” (Rickert 1909, 187). This prompts the theoretically oriented subject to affirm the transcendent theoretical value of truth in the necessary connection existing between the form and the content expressed in a true judgment.
Examining retrospectively the results of this first subjective path of the theory of knowledge Rickert points out a number of shortcomings. It seems that if we begin with an analysis of the act of judging, we can only reach the transcendent object of knowledge by way of a “petitio principii” (Rickert 1909, 190). If we take our cues from the psychologically perceived “feeling of a requirement” (Forderungsgefühl) and from the evidence of the judged content as the “immanent indicator of the transcendent” (Rickert 1909, 189), we have no sufficient reason to posit a transcendent object of knowledge unless we somehow already presupposed it in the very analysis of this feeling and its psychological connotations. It seems that the only conclusion we could legitimately draw without falling into circular reasoning is that when a certain compelling feeling of evidence occurs, we feel the urge to affirm the truth of a certain connection between a form and a content. But this does not really amount to proving that the internally felt sense of ought is connected to a transcendent ought. Rickert considers petitio principii inherent in the subjective path to be problematic but nonetheless a useful starting point, in that it allows us to analyze the meaning of certain fundamental concepts of the theory of knowledge such as transcendence, ought, stance-taking and recognition. However, in order to have a complete theory of knowledge, an objective or transcendental-logical path has to be taken.
Acts of judgments are not the only kinds of realities to which truth or falsehood attach. Propositions can also be true or false and their meanings can be taken as a new point of departure for the sake of determining the transcendent object of knowledge avoiding a petitio principii (Rickert 1909, 197). The meaning of a proposition can be taken objectively and independently of empirical acts of thought. In this case, we can say of the proposition itself that is either true or false, without thereby referring to the feeling of evidence or necessity perceived by the subject of judgment. In propositional logic we are accustomed to assign a truth-value to a given proposition and in so doing we think of the truth-value as pertaining to the proposition itself and not to the immanent psychological act that affirms the proposition’s truth. This is the advantage of the objective path over the subjective path: “The subjective path led us to the object as a requirement (Forderung) and this requirement was then interpreted as a transcendent ought. The objective path leads us directly to a transcendent value, and this concept yields the form of the object in its purity for the first time. Value and ought do not coincide. The ought is not the pure value. It represents the unreal as a command and relates it to a subject from which it demands obedience, recognition and submission. This is a secondary and even misleading addition. Only the value which rests upon itself and holds valid as value […] is the transcendent object” (Rickert 1921a, 242).
Rickert considers the concept of transcendent value (as pure validity independent of subjective acts of valuing) the culmination of his theory of knowledge. It is ultimately the theoretical value of truth, the unreal transcendent object, that is ‘known’ or grasped in every act of true judgment. However, this does not imply a complete rejection or neglect of the valuing subjectivity. Rickert maintains that once the theory of knowledge has established the absolute transcendence of values and their independence from empirical acts of valuing, it is then possible to relate values back to subjectivity. As we know, the immanent sense of acts (Aktsinn) is the unreal component of acts that mediates between the empirical sphere of psyche and the unreal sphere of values. Subjectivity is then interpreted as the ‘middle’ factor capable of mediating between reality and value, and thereby it receives its philosophical ‘dignification’. It is fair to say that Rickert’s work in all other fields of philosophy and in particular in the theory of the empirical sciences is an attempt to reconstruct the meaning of various spheres of reality and knowledge from his fundamental insight into the transcendence of values.
Empirical reality becomes nature when we conceive it with reference to the general. It becomes history when we conceive it with reference to the distinctive and the individual. (Rickert 1986, 54)
Rickert’s theory of science is primarily geared towards a philosophical elucidation of the natural and the historical sciences. This is intended to provide a defense of the sui generis scientificity of the historical sciences against the threat of positivism and naturalism. Rickert’s work on this issue builds upon Windelband’s influential paper History and Natural Science (Windelband 1980, 169–185). While Rickert criticizes some terminological and argumentative limits of his teacher’s essay, the bulk of his lengthy volume, The Limits of Concept Formation in Natural Science: An Introduction to the Historical Sciences (Rickert 1986), is consistent with the tenets of Windelband’s position.
Windelband pointed out that the customary distinction of the empirical sciences into natural sciences and Geisteswissenschaften (that is, literally spiritual or mental sciences and used in German to indicate the humanities and the social sciences) is deeply misleading (Windelband 1980, 173). This is because it seems to suggest that these two groups of sciences differ primarily with respect to their subject matter, that is, in the first case ‘nature’ and in the second case ‘mind’. However, there are at least two problems with this classification: (1) a significant number of disciplines commonly considered Geisteswissenschaften have little or nothing to do with the study of the human mind. Take, for instance, art history, political economics or archeology. None of these disciplines seems to have mental processes and states as their subject matter. (2) According to this classification psychology should be considered a Geisteswissenschaft and presumably even the most fundamental of all Geisteswissenschaften in that it studies the human mind in the most direct and rigorous fashion. Indeed, in late nineteenth century Germany there was a widely spread expectation that progress in psychology should have led to significant reforms in all other humanistic fields of research. This expectation, however, clashes with the fact that psychology’s method is much more similar to that of physics, chemistry, and biology than with that of literary studies or musicology. Psychology, too, seeks to determine its subject matter in terms of general laws and works with the aid of mathematical models and experiments. Considering these anomalies Windelband’s proposal is to drop content-related distinctions altogether and rely exclusively on a methodological distinction between “nomothetic” and “idiographic” sciences (Windelband 1980, 175). One group of sciences works by way of positing general laws and understanding its objects as examples of such general laws (nomo-thetic). Another group of sciences aims at producing illuminating descriptions of irreducibly individual and unrepeatable occurrences (idiographic). Most importantly, “the same subjects can be the object of both a nomothetic and an idiographic investigation” (Windelband 1980, 175). From this purely methodological point of view, sciences like psychology, physics, chemistry, and biology all belong in the same group as nomothetic, whereas sciences like history, art history, and musicology are to be considered idiographic. This distinction is meant to reorganize the universe of knowledge and to avoid unhelpful encroachments of empirical psychology on the work of humanistic disciplines, whose theoretical aims are fundamentally alien to nomothetic inquiry.
Rickert enhances and corrects Windelband’s perspective in two ways: (1) He revises his terminology and rejects the phrase ‘idiographic’, which seems to suggest a purely pictorial or reproductive procedure. This would not qualify as knowledge by Rickert’s epistemological standards (see Zijderveld 2006, 246–255; Ferrari 1998). (2) He insists on the necessity of beginning a reflection on the classification of the sciences with a purely methodological criterion, but only to articulate subsequently a more adequate content-related distinction to replace the customary Naturwissenschaft/Geisteswissenschaft pair (Rickert 1962, 11).
Rickert defines the task of a logical/methodological investigation of the sciences in the following terms: “The logical distinctiveness of an empirical science is to be understood in terms of the relationship the content of its concepts bears to empirical reality in its unique and distinctive form” (Rickert 1986, 114). In other words, the task of a theory of science is to determine how the science under scrutiny forms its concepts and in so doing overcomes the unsurveyable, “immeasurable manifold” (Rickert 1962, 32) of empirical reality as it is given in intuition. Concept formation for Rickert indicates “the conclusion of an investigation” (Rickert 1986, 27), that is the fulfillment of the scientific task posed at the beginning of that investigation. In keeping with his general rejection of a pictorial theory of knowledge (see above), Rickert rejects the view that the empirical sciences would simply have to depict (abbilden) reality as it is in itself. Rather, the task of the empirical sciences is to re-mold (umbilden) immediately given reality and form concepts, in which only a small fraction of the original given is taken up. The criteria for such selections and re-molding activities culminating in the formation of a scientific concept are the specific preoccupation of the philosophy of science.
As for the natural sciences, Rickert contends that Kant already provided a satisfactory definition of their logical structure. In the Prolegomena Kant stated: “Nature is the existence of things, insofar as [sofern] that existence is determined according to universal laws” (Kant 2002, 89; Rickert 1962, 5). Following Kant, Rickert defines the natural sciences as generalizing (Rickert 1986, 34; Rickert 1962, 46), that is, they form their concepts by way of moving away from the individual, unrepeatable occurrences encountered in experience. As Windelband already saw, the natural sciences view individual occurrences as mere examples of general laws. In this way, individuality “fixes the limits of natural scientific concept formation” (Rickert 1986, 40) and calls forth its logical complement: “individualizing concept-formation” (Rickert 1986, 62) as the method defining the historical sciences. The logical distinction between the sciences, then, has to be between the generalizing natural sciences and the individualizing historical sciences. In other words, while the natural sciences build their concepts by way of disregarding what is individual, the historical sciences build their concepts in order to grasp precisely what is individual.
How are we to understand, then, historical individuality? Rickert’s definition unfolds in three stages (Rickert 1986, 98). (1) In the broadest sense, the individual is every single empirical reality in its uniqueness and distinctiveness. This, however, is not yet historically relevant individuality. (2) In a more specific and etymological sense, a historical individual is what “should not be divided” (Rickert 1986, 85), that is, it is an individual whose “uniqueness is related to a value” (Rickert 1986, 84). Rickert suggests to compare a lump of coal and the famous Koh-i-noor diamond. While the lump of coal can be split at any time without any significant loss, the Koh-i-noor ought not be spilt because it is a good, that is, a bit of reality related to a value and valued by any subject capable of carrying out valuations. (3) The historical individual as the object of the historical sciences has to be a good related to generally acknowledged values as opposed to merely personal values. In other words, while a certain item can be valuable to me as an individual (for instance, because a beloved person gave it to me), this is not enough to make it an object of historical interest. The Koh-i-noor, on the contrary, has a more than merely individual historical relevance because it is inextricably related to the historical vicissitudes of India and British colonialism.
The notions of value and value-relatedness are crucial to determine Rickert’s material or content-related (inhaltlich) criterion for the demarcation of the sciences. In this respect we have to distinguish between the value-free sphere of nature and the value-related sphere of culture (Rickert 1962, 21). Accordingly, the material distinction that has to replace the customary distinction between natural sciences and Geisteswissenschaften is the distinction between the sciences of nature (value-free objects) and the sciences of culture (value-related objects). It is the reference to objectively acknowledged cultural values that ‘preserves’ the individuality of empirical objects and makes them relevant to historical inquiry.
In the context of this distinction Rickert insists on the important distinction between Wertung, or valuation, and Wertbeziehung, or the act of relating something to a value. The two notions stand in sharp opposition. While human subjects in their practical lives constantly engage in valuations resulting in positive or negative value-judgments, the historical scientist must abstain from every act of valuation and limit herself to the ascertainment of objective value-relations in the cultural materials under scrutiny. “Accordingly, if it is to express the character of history as a theoretical science, the procedure that we speak of as oriented to values is to be most sharply separated from one that posits values. This means that history treats values only in so far as they are actually accepted by subjects so that certain objects are actually denoted as goods. Thus, even if history deals with values, it is not a science that posits values” (Rickert 1962, 89). Rickert gives the following example to illustrate this distinction: “We can regard the personality of Luther as either a good thing or a bad thing. In other words, we can believe that it was a stroke of luck for the cultural development of Germany or that it brought misfortune. On this point, the opinions of historians will probably always be in disagreement. But no one who knows the facts will doubt that Luther had some sort of significance with reference to generally acknowledged values, and it can never occur to a historian to claim that Luther’s personality is historically unimportant” (Rickert 1986, 93; for a critical response to this view see Oakes 1988, 111–144).
By contrasting the generalizing method of the natural sciences dealing with value-free objects and the individualizing (i.e., historical) method of the cultural sciences dealing with value-related objects, Rickert does not mean to say that values play no role in the natural sciences or that generalizing procedures and general objects are completely absent form the cultural sciences. On the contrary, he emphasizes that “natural science is not free of valuations” (Rickert 1986, 93). In a way that anticipates much late twentieth century philosophy of science (see for instance Laudan 1985; Lacey 1999; Allchin 1999) Rickert insists that natural science and, for that matter, science in general obeys “logical values to which the investigator is committed, and which are implicitly presupposed in all scientific concept formation” (Rickert 1986, 94). What remains ‘value-free’ is the material that the natural sciences investigate. To stay with the above example, for a mineralogist studying diamonds the Koh-i-noor will be merely an instance of some general law of crystallization as much as any other diamond. It is not considered in its relation to culturally acknowledged values. On the other hand, the historical sciences do not completely dispense with elements of generality. Rickert identifies four senses in which ‘the general’ is at play in historical research. “First, the elements of all scientific concepts are general” (Rickert 1986, 115). This means that, for example, in order to form the concept ‘French Revolution’ we have to use general concepts such as ‘French’ and ‘revolution’. However, these two general concepts are compounded in order to capture a unique historical event. In a second sense, as we saw, history has to take into account the relation of events and objects to general values. However, the fact that a certain object has a reference to a general value (e.g. the French Revolution bears a reference to the general value ‘political freedom’) does not make the concept of that object general. “Third, historical science never regards individuals in isolation, as the generalizing sciences do, but in a general nexus” (Rickert 1986, 115). We cannot understand the individual Robespierre unless we view his actions in the meaningful general context of the French Revolution. Such ‘nexus’, however, is not itself a general concept but is itself an ‘individual’, that is, a unique and unrepeatable constellation of events. Fourth, in some cases the historical scientist will deliberately study groups of individuals, say, late-medieval serfs in Holland. In this case single individuals (either people or objects) will be seen as mere examples of dynamics and characteristics pertaining to their group in a way that seems to resemble the generalizing procedure of natural science. However, even in this case the historian is not interested in the ‘general nature’ of human groups but in the individuality of the group at issue.
Rickert engaged in a lifelong controversy with another prominent theorist of the human sciences, Wilhelm Dilthey (on the controversy see Makkreel/Luft 2010 and Makkreel 2010). Dilthey advocated the necessity to maintain a primarily content-related distinction to demarcate different ambits of science and he defended the legitimacy of the phrase Geisteswissenschaft. Dilthey rejected the argument that psychology could not be foundational for the human sciences because of its methodological similarity to the natural sciences. He considered the empirical (or, in his language, explanative) psychology of his time to be deeply flawed in that it imitated the methods of the natural sciences without paying attention to the specificity of the mental domain (Dilthey 2010, 119). Psychology, for Dilthey, should be conducted in a descriptive-analytical spirit, starting off from the overall meaningfulness and intelligibility of mental phenomena and working to describe the intricate connections or nexuses of significance characterizing human life (Dilthey 2010, 182). “Such a psychology will become the foundation of the human sciences, just as mathematics grounds the natural sciences” (Dilthey 2010, 165). This is because, for Dilthey, all the products of culture studied by the human sciences are nothing but “psychic life that has become objective, […] the products of active forces of a psychic nature and stable configurations formed from psychic elements and their laws” (Dilthey 2010, 171). For this reason, Dilthey contends that in the human sciences we can only understand, as opposed to explain, (Dilthey 2010, 119) cultural products (poems, artworks, juridical systems, etc.) to the extent that we reactivate the psychic life at their origin and relive (nacherleben) the life-experience that brought them about. If we had theoretical tools provided by a descriptive psychology to orient ourselves in the complexity of psychic objectifications, we would make significant advancements in the human sciences, too.
Rickert is willing to grant the “paramount significance of mental beings within the historical material” (Rickert 1986, 123) and the importance of “historical personalities that valuate” (Rickert 1986, 122) for the cultural sciences. He is also open to the use of Geist, provided that this term is considered synonymous with culture. However, he insists that Dilthey’s emphasis on psychic life and reliving is both systematically and methodologically misleading. First, not all of psychic life is relevant in the cultural sciences. Most psychic manifestations, both those occurring in individuals and those objectified in cultural objects, are completely devoid of historical significance, in that they lack the reference to a general value. Second, even if we had the capacity to relive past experiences in their total intensity and vividness, this would not amount to understanding those experiences and their cultural objectifications. In the historical sciences, too, to know does not mean merely to mirror or depict a real object. Only if the notion of value and the objective value-relatedness of historical individuals (be they physical or psychic) are taken as the systematic point of departure can the subjectivity involved in history be adequately understood. “The fact that history is a science of mental entities does not determine its logical structure, for mental processes can also be represented in a natural scientific or generalizing fashion. Rather, the converse is true: On the basis of the logical structure of historical science […] it can be understood why history primarily takes a certain kind of mental life as the object of its investigation” (Rickert 1986, 127).
Rickert’s theory of generalizing and individualizing concept formation as the systematically fundamental criterion for the demarcation of science elicited other waves of criticism. Husserl, for example, considered it an oversimplification of the Kantian problem of the transcendental deduction in that Rickert simply takes for granted that the infinite, unsurveyable manifold of immediate experience is amenable to conceptualization (Husserl 2001, 91). However, given his premises it is hard to see why a completely chaotic and heterogeneous immediate experience would nonetheless lend itself to conceptual rationalization. The problem, according to Husserl, is that for Rickert “world-experience (Welterfahrung) remains an empty word” (Husserl 2001, 100). Moreover, and similarly to Dilthey, Husserl laments the fact that Rickert downplays historically active subjectivity as the source of culture. Like Rickert, Husserl distinguishes between nature and culture in terms of “the world considered without significance” as opposed to “the world full of significance” (Husserl 2002, 139), however, he immediately relates back such significance to the operations of “meaning-bestowing subjectivity, which endows things with spiritual meaning [vergeistigen] through operations of significance [Bedeutungsleistungen]” (Husserl 2002, 140). For this reason, Husserl considers the whole dispute about whether the correct pair of concepts to demarcate the ambits of science should be nature/Geist (Dilthey) or nature/culture (Rickert) “a mere verbal dispute” (Husserl 2002, 140). Another line of criticism of Rickert’s distinction comes from his student, Emil Lask. In his personal notes Lask forcefully asserts that “a purely logical meaning of nature must be absolutely denied” (Lask 1924, 272). Lask argues that in Rickert’s reconstruction natural-scientific generalization and historical individualization are treated as equally legitimate and complementary ways of conceptualizing empirical reality. Against this view Lask contends that the generalizations carried out by the natural sciences presuppose a preliminary ‘devitalization’ (Ertötung) and ‘quantification’ of reality, in which the dimension of significance and value is put out of play (Lask 1924, 244). In a way that anticipates Husserl’s later treatment of this issue in The Crisis of the European Sciences (Husserl 1970). Lask points out that our original experience of the world is pervaded with value and significance and it is only by way of an abstractive impoverishment of this original experience that the natural sciences create their value-free (and to that extent artificial) field of research. As a matter of fact, however, there is evidence that Rickert was well aware of the quantifying tendency of natural science (see for instance Rickert 1900, 76), although he did not assign to it a central role.
Fundamental progress in the cultural sciences with respect to their objectivity, their universality, and their arrangement in a coherent system, is dependent on progress in the development of an objective and systematically articulated concept of culture, i.e., on the approach to a knowledge of value based on a system of valid values. (Rickert 1962, 139–140)
While Rickert does not believe that significant progress in the historical sciences of culture can be expected from the development of psychology, he believes that a philosophy of history grounded in an unconditionally valid system of values (Rickert 1924a, 118) would be of paramount importance. If philosophy were able to identify and justify a formal set of values common to all cultures and historical constellations, then the historical sciences could employ such a formal set of values to orient their inquiries. In order to do this, however, philosophy cannot simply rely on empirical generalizations. Given the multiplicity of cultures and the complexity of human history, it would be impossible to adopt a generalizing procedure in order to identify a robust set of values common to all. “Rather, it would be appropriate to reflect (completely independently of the multiplicity of the historical material) on that which holds valid by necessity, that is, the formal presupposition of each value-judgment claiming more than individual validity. Only when such timelessly valid formal values are found will it be possible to relate them to the plenitude of empirically detectable values actually developed in history” (Rickert 1924a, 118). Rickert underscores in various places that such system, however, should be understood as completely “open” (Rickert 1913, 297; Rickert 1921b, 348–355; see Bohlken 2002, 124). This means that it is intended to provide merely the “most encompassing framework in which all meaningful cultural life plays itself out” (Rickert 1934b, 225). The areas of values identified in the system can be filled with the most diverse concrete historical values.
Rickert’s first attempt to articulate a timelessly valid system of values can be found in his paper On the System of Values (Rickert 1913). The position developed here was eventually recast and schematized visually in the first (and only) volume of his System of Philosophy (Rickert 1921b). Rickert begins his inquiry by describing different kinds of goods, that is, concrete objects related to values. His intent is to read off the objectively valid values from concrete classes of goods. The human creation of goods related to values follows a general impulse towards “completion” (Vollendung), which can be best described as the attainment of a certain goal. Moreover, each realization of values in a good can be understood as the work on a certain ‘content’, which receives a value-related form. Such content can be interpreted as a whole consisting of parts. Starting from these abstract distinctions, Rickert identifies three domains of goods, that of the “uncompletable (unendlich) totality”, that of “fully completed (voll-endlich) particularity” and that which synthesizes the two in a “fully completed totality” (Rickert 1913, 302). To each of these domains of goods Rickert assigns a temporal dimension, such that the goods of un-ending totality are goods of the future, those of fully completed particularity are goods of the present and those of fully completed totality are goods of eternity. A further overarching distinction, however, cuts across these three domains of goods, thus giving as a result six domains: the distinction between contemplation and activity, whose parallel categories of objects are “thing” and “person”. After fleshing out this general scheme Rickert fills in the six domains with actual values and the corresponding cultural activities according to the following schema (Rickert 1921b, annex):
Goods: asocial matters (Sachen)
Subjective Comportment: monistic contemplation
Stages of completeness Goods: social persons
Subjective Comportment: pluralistic activity
Domain of Logic (1)
Subjective Comportment: judgment
Goods of the future
Domain of Ethics (4)
Value: morality (Sittlichkeit)
Good: community of free people
Subjective Comportment: autonomous action
Worldview: moralism (Moralismus)
Domain of Aesthetics (2)
Subjective Comportment: intuition (anschauen)
Fully completed particularity
Goods of the present
Domain of Erotics (5)
Value: happiness (Glück)
Good: loving community
Subjective Comportment: inclination—devotion (Hingabe)
System of Philosophy (8)
Comprehensive theory of worldviews
Love between man and woman (7)
Domain of Mystics (3)
Value: impersonal sanctity
Good: the All-One (world-mystery)
Subjective Comportment: solitude (Abgeschiedenheit) (divinization)
Fully completed totality
Goods of eternity
Domain of the Philosophy of Religion (6)
Value: personal sanctity
Good: the world of god (Götterwelt)
Subjective comportment: piety
The following points are distinctive of Rickert’s approach to values as presented in the above table:
(1) Note that Rickert distinguishes the way in which values relate to their materials in the spheres of contemplation and in the sphere of practice. In his language, the value of truth ‘encompasses’ scientific theories and likewise the value of beauty encompasses works of art. This means that the value is experienced as something essentially ‘beyond’ the particular theory or artwork at issue. On the contrary, in the sphere of practice values ‘pervade’ their materials, that is to say they structure them ‘from within’, as it were.
(2) Rickert prides himself on having ‘discovered’ and defended the autonomy of the fifth domain of values, which he labels ‘erotics’ (Rickert 1913, 313–319). Erotics is the sphere of practical life in which subjects cultivate specific values attaching to their relationships to particular people or groups of people. According to Rickert in the philosophical tradition this autonomous domain has been unduly overshadowed by the domain of ethics, which constantly tried to impose its distinctive values on erotics (Rickert 1921b, 406). However, for Rickert our practical life would be unbearable if it were dedicated exclusively to the pursuit of ethical values and the utopian ideal of a community of free subjects (that is, Kant’s kingdom of ends). We need a particular sphere of relationships in which the practical thrust of our social life finds full realization in the present. The values characterizing these spheres, such as family, homeland, religious community, etc. need to be respected and studied as a class of values in its own right.
(3) Rickert assigns an important role to religion in the totality of cultural life (see Crowe 2010). He points out an inevitable tension between the pursuit of goods of totality in domains (1) and (4), which are ultimately unattainable in our earthly life, and the pursuit of goods of particularity in (2) and (5), which are fully attainable but inevitably finite. Religion opens up the space for ‘transcendent syntheses’, in which this tension is overcome through the pursuit of goods of eternity. These, in Rickert’s view, do justice to both our human desire for infinity and our human need for actually experienced fulfillment. Mysticism thus offers a transcendent synthesis between the sense of fulfillment characterizing aesthetic contemplation and the unending process of scientific theorein via conceptual knowledge. Similarly, the religious devotion to a divinity experienced as ‘dwelling among us’ (in both polytheistic and monotheistic religions) promises a transcendent synthesis between the values of ethics and those of erotics.
(4) For Rickert, however, the transcendent syntheses promised by religion are prefigured, as it were, in two earthly kinds of syntheses, that is, the love between man and woman in the sphere of practice and the production of a philosophical system oriented towards a comprehensive worldview-theory in the sphere of contemplation. As for the love between man and woman, Rickert’s view rests on the dubious assumption that women are “essentially” more oriented toward the realization of goods of the present, while men are “essentially” more oriented toward the realization of goods of the future (Rickert 1921b, 403). Since no meaningful existence can be devoted exclusively to one type of goods (the goods of the future being ultimately unattainable and the goods of the present being ultimately too narrow), Rickert argues that the “personal union” (Rickert 1921b, 402) between man and woman amounts to a mutual completion and a synthesis of the two domains of values. Needless to say, to a contemporary reader this view sounds extremely antiquated and even sexist. However, it has to be interpreted in the context of Rickert’s time. In his eyes, insisting on the mutual completion and irreducibility of the values traditionally associated with masculinity and those traditionally associated with feminineness (Rickert 1921b, 403) was a way to defend the equal value of men and women in the whole of cultural life. Philosophy as a worldview-theory based on the system of values, in turn, can provide a comprehensive picture of the world in which all contemplative and practical activity takes place. To the extent that it strives towards a comprehensive system, however, philosophy tends to exceed the sphere of theoretical goods (Rickert 1921b, 408). Instead of partaking in the indefinitely open work of the specialized sciences philosophy attempts to survey the totality of cultural life and to systematically determine its underlying value-related structure. In each successfully articulated philosophical system we then find a completed cultural good, which differs from the characteristic open-endedness of theories in the specialized sciences. The philosopher thus occupies the middle ground between the scientist moving indefinitely forward in her specialized investigations and the artist striving to produce a complete artwork. Philosophy, then, can then be considered an immanent synthesis between the unending totality characterizing the goods of science and the particularity characterizing the goods of art.
Philosophy has to be characterized as the scientific activity, which, in the stream of restlessly forward-moving development, endeavors to make a stop and find a resting point. It stands still in order to bring to light the significance for the meaning of life of what has been hitherto achieved. (Rickert 1921b, 410)
Rickert’s conception of philosophy is tightly connected to his notion of worldview. Worldview (Weltanschauung) was a buzzword in early twentieth century German culture. Life-philosophers and anti-rationalists used the phrase ‘Weltanschauung’ to designate the inherently elusive and obscure source of all cultural life and thinking (see Dilthey 1960, 80; Simmel 1996, 29; Mannheim 1952, 38). On this reading philosophy is nothing but the conceptual articulation of pre-theoretical worldviews that are inextricably related to the historical, psychological, and cultural conditions of individual philosophers. Worldview philosophy was extremely critical of all attempts to describe the discipline as a science, that is, as a purely theoretical enterprise. Rooted in existentially grounded worldviews, philosophy is an expression of the whole human being and not merely an impersonal conceptual construction of the one-sided ‘theoretical man’ (see Staiti 2013b, 795–799).
Rickert agrees that philosophy, unlike the specialized empirical sciences, must be oriented toward the world as a whole (Weltganze), and not merely toward this or that specific part of the world (Rickert 1910, 1; Rickert 1934, 1). However, he firmly rejects the view that, in order to grasp the world as a whole, philosophers ought to shun the ideal of scientificity and work as whole human beings merely expressing what their existential intuition of the world-whole suggests. In this regard, for Rickert, the phrase ‘worldview’ should designate the goal of philosophical work and not philosophy’s obscure existential origin. Furthermore, the goal of a comprehensive theory of worldview can only be achieved with the aid of concepts and logical thinking, that is, adopting a scientific standpoint. Contra Dilthey, Simmel, and the antirationalist life-philosophers Rickert points out that “only the one-sided, theoretically oriented man is able to reflect upon the world in its totality” (Rickert 1933, 50). On the contrary, “[t]he whole human being, precisely as ‘whole’ or ‘existing’ human being, will never transcend his ‘small’ world and this small world inevitably takes on different shapes for different people. For the pre-scientific man only that which stands in an essential connection with his own life can become ‘world’” (Rickert 1933, 49–50; see Staiti 2013b: 799–804). Rickert contends that the historical beginnings of philosophy in ancient Greece coincide with the birth of a purely ‘theoretical man’, that is, of a subject who pursues knowledge for knowledge’s sake and in so doing discloses a dimension of totality unknown to natural, practically oriented human subjects (Rickert 1923b).
In order to produce knowledge about the world as a whole, philosophy cannot rely on empirical methods like the specialized sciences do, nor can it simplistically project one concept or set of concepts describing one of the world’s parts onto the world-whole. For Rickert philosophy has to rely on what he calls “the heterological principle” (Rickert 1921b, 57; Rickert 1934b, 39). Scholars agree that the notion of heterology is the most distinctive element of Rickert’s philosophy (Glockner 1937, 11; Flach 1958, 564; Orth 1998, 81) and even his “principle of all principles” (Krijnen 2001, 256). Heterology is a relational mode of thinking, which Rickert considers paramount to the theoretical determination of objects in general (Rickert 1921b, 57) and utterly unavoidable for a conceptual grasp of totalities. It consists in using a pair of mutually exclusive concepts, that is, concepts that negate each other, and take them together as complementary. To think heterologically means to posit a given initial concept (thesis) and then proceed to posit a second concept that can be seen as its ‘other’ (hetero-thesis), so that the two concepts taken together cover the entirety of the totality to be theoretically determined. “Wherever we can construct concepts that, through their determinations (i.e., their limitations), do not merely negate, but they simultaneously determine positively the negated component that is missing from the whole, we can think in terms of alternatives. In so doing we are able to grasp conceptually, through a kind of detour, a whole that cannot be grasped through concepts in a direct fashion. This is because we can construct two concepts, under which every element belonging to the whole necessarily falls” (Rickert 1934b, 34). We already encountered heterological pairs of concepts in the previous sections, for instance, the transcendental-psychological and the transcendental-logical paths in the theory of knowledge and generalizing and individualizing concept formation in the theory of science (see above.) In both cases the two opposite concepts, if taken together, circumscribe a totality: in the first case, the totality of epistemology, and, in the second case, the totality of scientific methods in empirical research. The ‘test’ for successful heterological reasoning is that the negation of one of the two related concepts results positively into the other concept, so that one can be a priori certain that any item not falling under the first concept necessarily falls under the second concept. As an example Rickert illustrates how to determine heterologically the totality of bodies (Rickert 1934b, 42). We can start with the thesis ‘organic living bodies’ and if we proceed to negate it we see that the merely negative concept ‘~ organic living bodies’ immediately results in the positive concept ‘dead mechanical bodies’. Taken together the two concepts amount to a successful theoretical grasp of the whole ‘bodies’. We can see with evidence that within the totality ‘bodies’, whatever body does not fall under the category ‘organic living body’ necessarily falls under the category ‘dead mechanical body’. Using heterology philosophy can reflect upon the world as a whole in terms of “world-alternatives” (Rickert 1934b, 42) and set out to determine what pair of concepts is best suited to encompass the totality of what is. As we know from previous sections, Rickert contends that the pair of concepts nature/psyche does not withstand the heterological test, in that what is not nature can be either psyche or timelessly valid value. Ultimately for Rickert the correct heterology in terms of which we can approach philosophically the world as a whole is reality/value (Rickert 1913, 11). This is because whatever is not an empirical reality (be it physical or psychic) lies necessarily in the sphere of value and vice versa. Once this broad categorization of the world as whole is established, philosophy can set out to determine more specifically the subordinated wholes out of which the world as a whole is constituted and to articulate meaningfully their mutual relations.
Only an ontological pluralism does justice to the richness of the world. (Rickert 1932, 100)
From roughly the beginning of the 1920s Rickert’s philosophy is characterized by what has been referred to as an “ontological turn” (Farges 2010, 26; Kuttig 1987). However, in Rickert’s eyes the introduction of ontology is not a departure from his earlier epistemological focus or the leap into a completely new philosophical dimension. As his definition of ontology as “the doctrine of what is predicated as being” (Rickert 1934b, 54) already suggests, ontological questions are deeply connected to questions about judgment and predication. In other words, if we take our knowledge to consist of judgments and if we take our judgments to consist of a formal and a material component, then it is legitimate to ask what is the material component cast into conceptual forms in judgments. As the opening quote of this section indicates, for Rickert it is important to uphold pluralism in ontology. In keeping with the pluralism of meaningful predication (there is a plurality of things that we can meaningfully articulate judgments about), we cannot dogmatically presuppose that there is only one meaning of the ‘being’ addressed in our predicative activities. In this regard, far from being detrimental to a genuine ontological investigation, Rickert’s insistence on the preeminence of epistemology turns out to have a positive effect on ontology. If the compass to orient ourselves in ontology is meaningful predication, then we are from the beginning immune to dogmatic reductions of what is to one monistically conceived dimension of reality (Rickert 1934b, 57).
Rickert’s ontology contemplates four “kinds of being (Seinsarten) of the world” (Rickert 1934b, 153): (1) sensible (sinnlich) being; (2) non-sensible (unsinnlich) being; (3) pro-physical (pro-physisches) being; (4) supersensible (übersinnlich) being.
(1) Sensible being is the ontological category under which fall both physical and psychological being, that is, material things and mental states. Both the sphere of the physical and the sphere of the psychological are directly accessible to experience (Rickert 1934b, 63–64) and can be the object of meaningful predication. Therefore they must be granted equal ontological worth. Psychophysical dualism, however, causes the classical problems of mind-body causal interaction versus mind-body parallelism. Rickert’s sympathies are clearly with the idea of psychophysical causality (both body to mind and mind to body) versus the hypothesis of psychophysical parallelism and the ensuing panpsychism (Rickert 1900). He considers psychophysical parallelism a self-undermining hypothesis to the extent that it relies on the atomization and quantification of psyche. Defenders of psychophysical parallelism (such as Baruch Spinoza and Gustav Fechner) introduced this hypothesis in order to preserve the autonomy of the psyche as the domain of the qualitative, which they take to be essentially different from merely quantitative physical being. However, in order to articulate their model they have to rely on a quantification of the psyche, which undercuts precisely the premise, based on which psychophysical parallelism was considered a good alternative to psychophysical causality to begin with (Rickert 1900, 76; Rickert 1934b, 66–73). The reason why the idea of a two-way causal link between mental and physical being seems to pose an impossible puzzle is that, prima facie, the order of the psychic and the order of the physical strike us as belonging to two separate ontological domains. However, for Rickert this is because we generally overlook the tertium comparationis, which proves that they actually belong in one an the same ontological dimension, namely, that they are both domains of sensible being, i.e., being that is directly accessible to perception. From this perspective causal interaction between mind and body is nothing but causal interaction between two ontologically homogeneous species of one and the same ontological genus ‘sensible being’. To be sure, the physical and the psychic display vastly different characteristics (extension vs. unextendedness; intentionality vs. lack of intentionality; spatiotemporal individuation vs. temporal individuation.) However, for Rickert this is not enough reason to consider the two dimensions as ontologically heterogeneous. If they are ontologically homogeneous, then it is the task of specialized empirical research and not of philosophy to determine their causal relations.
(2) The ontological homogeneity of the physical and the psychic becomes even more clear if we turn our attention to a completely different ontological sphere, which taken together heterologically with sensible being completes the concept of the world of experience (Erfahrungswelt). The second kind of being in Rickert’s ontology is what he calls non-sensible being. In order to introduce non-sensible being Rickert recommends that we turn our attention to word-meanings (Rickert 1934b, 79). While having a conversation, we do not only perceive the physical body of our interlocutor and the psychic reality attached to it. We also ‘receive’ in the same direct, immediate way the meanings of the words that he or she is uttering. These meanings are not psychic realities. They do not coincide with the thoughts of the speaker or with the acoustic stimuli of the listener. The very same meanings could be conveyed by a completely different sensible ‘support’ such as ink scribbles on paper. We can even recognize the same meaning as being instantiated by different words in different languages, such as the identical meaning of ‘red’, ‘rot’, ‘rosso’ and ‘rouge’. While the meaning of words must be carried by some sensible support, it is itself not sensible. It is not sensed or perceived but rather understood. This is why Rickert proposes to call the second ontological domain the non-sensible sphere of understandable meaning-configurations (verstehbare Sinngebilde) (Rickert 1934b, 81). Word-meanings, however, are only a tiny fraction of the meaning-configurations that we can experience. The arrangement of the musical notes in a symphony is likewise understood as a meaning-configuration possibly carried by different sensible supports—the same melody can be played in a different key, with a different instrument, it can be sung, etc. Looking at the works of a great artist we can understand one and the same non-sensible meaning-configuration (say, the same ‘style’) realized sensibly in different media. The universe of meaning-configurations constitutes for Rickert an authentic mundus intelligibilis experienced in concomitance with but as different from the mundus sensibilis of perceivable being. However, he takes pains to remind us that we should not repeat the old Platonic mistake of taking the world of non-sensible being to be a metaphysically separate reality. Understandable meaning-configurations are an ingredient of our everyday experience and so they have to be counted among the ontological ingredients of the experiential world. In exploring the world of meaning-configurations we must take into account the principles that allow for meaning-configurations to be intelligible. Not every string of words is intelligible and, most importantly, not every intelligible string of words is true. The same holds for every meaning-configuration. It is intelligible only if its constitutive non-sensible elements are held together by the reference to a specific value. True sentences, for instance, are unified by their reference to the theoretical value of truth. In this way, Rickert clarifies the ontological status of values as non-sensible beings. The real dualism pertaining to the world of experience, then, is not the one between body and mind but the one between the sensible world of perceivable entities and the non-sensible world of understandable meaning-configurations (Rickert 1934b, 92–97). This insight defeats a view Rickert calls “hyletic sensualism” (Rickert 1934b, 93) that he attributes to both Kant and Husserl. Hyletic sensualists assume that the content of our experience can only be sensible, and that whatever is non-sensible and intelligible must be ascribed to the form of our experience instead. However, based on the above analyses, Rickert emphasizes that the very content of our experience is both sensible (perceivable) and non-sensible (intelligible). Accordingly, in order to generate knowledge of sensible entities and intelligible meaning-configurations the conceptual forms of our cognition must apply to both domains.
(3) Upon closer scrutiny, the kind of content that we encounter in the world of experience and conceptualize in the empirical sciences shows itself to be a compound of form and content. In fact, the entities that we encounter and theorize about in the world of experience are always objects, in a broad sense comprising physical, psychic and non-sensible entities (meaning-configurations). In keeping with the Kantian tradition, however, objects are the result of synthetic processes of objectification guided by some categories (forms). It is therefore possible to raise a question about a third domain of being: how are we to think the pure content or hyle that is immediately experienced prior to all objectification and categorization? At first this universe of absolutely raw and unsynthesized content has to be conceived of as prior to the distinction between sensible and non-sensible being, and, within the sphere of sensible being, prior to the distinction between physical and psychic reality. This is why Rickert suggests to call this third domain of being the “pro-physical world” (Rickert 1934b, 111; Rickert 1921b, 296), using improperly the term ‘physical’ in the phrase to indicate the whole domain of the experiential world. In this sense, “the problem of prophysics [is] at the same time the problem of the immediate” (Rickert 1934b, 112), that is of the pure, immediately lived content preceding all synthesis and categorization. The regression to the prophysical world, however, does not leave us with a completely undifferentiated and inchoate mass of raw ‘content’. If we think of objects as the products of a subject’s activity of categorial formation, then suspending all categorial syntheses leads us back to a pre-objective subject (Rickert 1934b, 115), whose synthetic activity brings about objects out of the pure pro-physical material in the first place. One might be inclined to think that the pro-physical subject coincides with Kant’s transcendental apperception, that is, a mere empty ‘form’ of subjectivity or consciousness in general. However, and in keeping with the analyses of subjectivity in The Object of Knowledge (see above), in order to be responsible for the processes of objectification and thus form primordial materials into proper objects, the pro-physical subject must be conceived of as active and capable of stance-takings toward values (Rickert 1934b, 118). In other words, the pro-physical subject that we necessarily have to think as prior to all psychic, physical and meaning-related objectifications must be conceived of as free (Rickert 1934b, 120). While empirical psychology operating in the sphere of already objectified sensible being presents us with empirical subjects who are causally determined in various ways, pro-physics unearths a transcendental dimension of freedom that is presupposed by all objectifications. Rickert suggests that this insight solves the “mystery” (Rickert 1934b, 123) of freedom by way of dissolving, as it were, the traditional antinomy between freedom and determinism. These two notions, in Rickert’s view, belong in two distinct ontological spheres. While the objectified psychic subject is indeed causally determined as much as any other bit of sensible being, the pro-physical subject responsible for each objectification is inherently free. In this sense, freedom and determinism are not opposed. To the extent that determinism presupposed the process of objectification, (psychophysical) determinism presupposes (prophysical) freedom. After establishing the ontological features of the prophysical subject, we can turn to the primordial materials or contents that the prophysical subject forms. Rickert suggests to calls the branch of prophysics dealing with pure materials Zustandslehre, an expression hardly translatable into English without losing its intended assonance with Gegenstandslehre (Rickert 1934b, 127). Gegen-stand is the German term for object, that is, literally, that which stands over and against a subject. However, if Gegend-stand is the product of an objectifying process, then Rickert suggests that we call that which is thereby objectified and placed ‘over and against’ Zu-stand, which can be roughly translated as ‘state’. A doctrine of pure states (reine Zustände) is meant to investigate the pre-objectified, pure content independently of the categorial forms that pervade such content in our sensible experiences of fully formed objects (Rickert 1934b, 129). The gist of Rickert’s Zustandslehre is that even in the pro-physical world we have no reason to think of content in a monistic fashion. “In the Zustandslehre we can exhibit the ultimate ground for the encompassing dualism of the world of objects. Already the dimension of pure states (das Zuständliche) pertaining to understandable objects, that is, its bare material, is as non-sensible as the form which creates non-sensible objects out of it. The understandable meaning-configuration has both a non-sensible form and a non-sensible content” (Rickert 1934b, 131). In other words, Rickert wants to say that the understandable meaning-configurations considered in the second domain of ontology are non-sensible through and through. One might be tempted to think that a word-meaning is composed of a non-sensible form (the ideal Bedeutung) and a sensible content, say, the acoustic data forming the distinctive sound of the word ‘red’ in English or those forming the distinctive sound of the word ‘rosso’ in Italian. On Rickert’s account, however, this would be wrong. We have to distinguish the acoustic carrier of the word-meaning from the word-meaning as a whole, in both its form and its content. The acoustic carrier is entirely sensible and the word-meaning itself is entirely non-sensible. The conclusion of Rickert’s prophysics is that if we consider its domain as that of the “universal minimum” of thinkability (Rickert 1934b, 133), then we have to concede that such universal minimum already entails a plurality of factors, namely, the minimal distinction between I (the prophysical subject) and non-I (the domain of pure states) and the further distinction within the sphere of non-I between the pro-physical sensible and the pro-physical non-sensible, whose objectifications carried out by the free pro-physical subject give rise to the objects in the world of experience.
(4) The fourth and last ontological domain Rickert considers is that of supersensible being, traditionally addressed by metaphysics. Rickert’s approach to metaphysics is guided by the problem of the ultimate connection between reality and value. Both the analysis of the world of experience and the analysis of the prophysical world resulted in an inevitable dualism between the sensible and the non-sensible, viz., the perceivable and the understandable. This poses the problem of how to preserve the dualism and still be able to conceive of the world as a whole in a unitary fashion. The first clue to think about the unity of the world is provided by the doctrine of the prophysical subject: “It produces a connection of what is real and what is meaningful (das Sinnhafte) and at the same time with the valid value” (Rickert 1934b, 135). With its free stance-takings relating (sensible and non-sensible) materials to (non-sensible) values the prophysical subject encompasses both terms of the dualism and thus provides a criterion to conceive of them as united. However, this seems to tie the unity of reality and value to the particularity and contingency of actual stance-takings. This unity seems to be extremely precarious and ultimately grounded in the arbitrary acts of a pro-physical subject. The thought of a unity of reality and value beyond the particular acts of valuing subjectivity and thus beyond the scope of contents of consciousness opens up the intellectual space of metaphysics. Rickert is adamant that ultimately the transcendent unity of reality and value beyond subjectivity is the object of “faith” (Rickert 1934b, 137) and not scientific knowledge. However, he insists that we need such faith in order to live both as practical and as theoretical human beings. “If the world were not arranged in such a way that our stance-taking toward the value of truth ‘succeeds’ beyond the I’s act, then science, which pushes forward to cognize the world, is impossible. As scientific people, too, we need the assumption that there is a more than particular, ‘cosmic’ connection of value and reality” (Rickert 1934b, 138). The “supersensible unity” of value and reality (Wirklichkeit) or the domain of “value-reality” (Wertrealität) (Rickert 1934b, 139) is the object of metaphysics. Describing the mode of access to the domain of value-reality in metaphysics, Rickert holds fast to Kant’s view that metaphysics is not possible as a science. This, however, entails neither that metaphysics is altogether impossible, nor that some other kind of non-scientific knowledge may not be produced as legitimate metaphysical knowledge. Rickert refers to metaphysical knowledge in scare quotes as “allegoric”, “image-building” (sinnbildlich) or “symbolic” (Rickert 1934b, 140). In other words, metaphysics is bound to employ images, metaphors and oblique expressions in order to produce indirect knowledge of the transcendent, subject-independent unity of reality and value. Rickert here clearly has in mind the most illustrious of all metaphysicians: Plato. When he called the Forms ‘real’ he borrowed a phrase that has an established meaning for this-worldly realities and applied it metaphorically to the domain of otherworldly or supersensible being. Moreover, as is well known, he made abundant use of allegories, similes and mythological stories in order to illustrate the ultimately inaccessible world of the supersensible. Finally, Rickert warns against a conflation of metaphysics and religion (Rickert 1934, 201). While in concrete cultural worlds and living individuals these two spheres of culture often intersect and overlap, it is important to keep them conceptually distinct. Metaphysics is a theoretical enterprise trying to determine conceptually supersensible being with the aid of metaphors, symbols, etc. It does involve faith but it is a purely rational faith in some kind of transcendent unity of reality and value. Religion, on the contrary, is characterized by faith in the existence of a supersensible divine being, in which ultimately all values and meanings are grounded. Both are valuable and important component of culture. Empirically speaking, they often occur together and have numerous mutual influences. However, they can never be reduced theoretically to one another. In other words, the rational faith of metaphysics does not automatically lead to religious faith in a divine being and, conversely, religious faith does not necessitate the believer to accept that the ultimate unity of reality and value is accessible (through symbolic knowledge) to the rational discourse of metaphysics.
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