#### Supplement to Heinrich Rickert

## Rickert’s Philosophy of Mathematics

Rickert’s philosophy of mathematics consists of a short book,
*Das Eine, die Einheit und die Eins* (hereafter EEE), first
published in *Logos* (2/26, 1911–1912), then
substantially revised in 1924. Most of its arguments relate to
Rickert’s epistemological works (see 1888, 1892, 1909, 1930) and
clarify their central claims. However, none of these works addresses
mathematical issues exclusively considered in EEE.

Here, Rickert elaborates his critical response to logicism, mainly
Natorp’s but also Frege’s (see Dewalque 2007; Catarzi
2016), to the extent that he develops an “implicit
comparison” (Heidegger 1987: 179) with Natorp’s
*Logische Grundlagen* (1910). Roughly put, Rickert opposes the
reducibility of numbers to logical constructions and defends the
separation of logic and arithmetic (see EEE: 1–8, 75–93).
For this purpose, he adopts a semantic strategy that reduces logic to
the *subject-predicate relation* (see EEE: 3–27; Friedman
2000: 30) and consistently shows that *logical identity* and
*mathematical equality* differ (see EEE: 27–53,
72–75). On these premises, Rickert argues for a notion of number
characterized by specific *alogical properties* (see EEE:
58–72).

- 1. Beyond Logicism and Empiricism
- 2. The Logical Object
- 3. The Numerical Object
- 4. The Historical Relevance
- Bibliography

## 1. Beyond Logicism and Empiricism

EEE’s basic tenet is that mathematics and logic differ despite
prima facie similarities. Their objects share some properties; they
all have ideality, mind-independency and don’t relate causally.
“Mathematics”, says Rickert, “deals with objects
that are not ‘real’ in the sense that physical or
psychical objects are” (EEE: 2). Similarly, logic involves
irreal (i.e., insensible) or ideal objects, different from physical
objects or psychical perceptions. So arose a confusion about their
boundaries, which Rickert intends to disentangle by showing that,
although mathematically elementary, a number isn’t something
purely logical. Instead, he sees its nature including
*alogical* properties (i.e., rational or theoretical, although
not in the logical sphere), distinguished from the *illogical*
(i.e., irrational) properties of mere sensations, such as ineffable
feelings.

Consistently, Rickert argues against those views opposing these
claims, starting with Mill’s (and Husserl’s)
*abstractionism* or *empirical psychologism*. So, he
initially sides with Natorp and Frege against Mill (see Frege 1884;
Natorp 1910), who reduces numbers to “abstract concepts derived
from groups of real things or events” (EEE: 6). Instead, Rickert
holds that “numbers form an ideal realm per se” (EEE: 7)
and obey laws, which real objects don’t share. However, Rickert
eventually rejects Frege’s *logicism* and its most
“dangerous” instance, namely Natorp’s *rational
psychologism*. This latter looks like hidden empiricism since it
mistakenly overlaps numerical objects and real acts of
“positing,” which Rickert understands as “a
psychical reality flowing in time.” Therefore, rational
psychologists step out of the logical field because the alogical
component imperceptibly employed in their foundation of mathematics is
“the thought itself”, namely “the real and psychical
process [taking place] in time” (EEE: 53). So, it’s an
ill-conceived attempt to logically derive numbers from a real
numbering. Indeed, for Rickert, learning to number is a psychological
process, but numbers themselves aren’t (see EEE: 7).

On the contrary, Rickert detaches what is logical from our actual thinking and restricts it to the logical object alone. As the main principle of his epistemology states:

The logically thinking subject can only

recognizewhat isvalidindependently of him/her or “objectively” (EEE: 57).

The argument recurs throughout Rickert’s epistemological writings (see Rickert 1892: 67, 1914: 209). Accordingly, knowledge starts by apprehending a logical object independent of any immanency, namely recognizing a “theoretical value” that rests in itself and transcends any subject (see Rickert 1921: 114). In this way, the cognizing subject relates to a “formal transcendent ought,” which Rickert regards as a “validity”, namely a “special kind of being but not of existing” (EEE: 83; see Rickert 1892: 63–72; 1909: 193–208). Therefore, a large part of EEE focuses on analyzing the logical object and its irreducible gap with mathematical objects (i.e., numbers). For this purpose, Rickert “looks for a point of view that lies beyond empiricism and rationalism” (EEE: 7), called “transcendental empiricism” (EEE: 8, 87) after Hessen’s suggestion (1909).

## 2. The Logical Object

With this notion, Rickert rethinks the Kantian *a priori* and
its transcendental purpose of providing the conditions of (the
possibility of) cognition and its objects. However, unlike Kant, he
grounds these conditions in semantics, detaching any mind-dependency.
Rickert started to develop this argument a few years before EEE, when
he was looking for a cognitive norm of thinking that could bestow
truth and objectivity to our claims (see Rickert 1892: 1; Oliva 2006:
47–86; Zijderveld 2006: 104–10). To this extent, EEE
represents a development of Rickert’s epistemology, moving from
that former norm, based on a broadly conceived subject-object
opposition (see Rickert 1892: 7–10; 1909), to a specific
semantic model. In EEE’s second edition, Rickert discusses four
definitions of the logical object, improved in other writings (see
Rickert 1921) after the first edition.

### D1 “Something in general”

With D1, Rickert aims to justify his semantic shift of the Kantian
notion of *a priori*. As far as I cannot think of anything
without thinking of something, my act of thinking always presupposes
*something in general*, namely an elementary semantic unit for
designating anything particular. Every act of thinking (i.e.,
cognizing) thus contains the logical object as its transcendental
condition. “At first”, says Rickert,

we only wanted to know the model of an “object in general” or the

minimumof components, without which the theoretical thinking of anything is not possible. (EEE: 27)

Accordingly, in every thought, he first distinguishes the
*subjective act of thinking* from the *object of
thought*. This latter corresponds to “Something that is
thought in general”, which Rickert also calls “the
Logical”, namely a mind-independent “Logos” hidden
in every thought (EEE: 9–10).

### D2 “The connection of form and content”

“In every Something”, continues Rickert, “one can
distinguish form and content” (EEE: 11; see Rickert 1921:
52–3). Thinking logically about Something means thinking
*a* content that necessarily has the form of *One* (das
Eine). However, this content per se isn’t anything particular or
alogical coming from the outside of the purely logical object. On the
contrary, every object, including the logical one, consists of form
and content. Hence, this content per se is formal and general, lacking
any specific materiality. It denotes “the logical
‘place’ for anything alogical” and so
“necessarily belongs in the purely logical objectivity, namely
the formality of the theoretical object in general” (EEE:
12).

### D3 “The unity of the One & the Other”

D2 shows that form and content as elements of every object demand each other “because”, clarifies Rickert,

there is no object that is either only the content or only the form of One (identity), but always both together. (EEE: 18)

They depend on each other and only together constitute “the
identical What or Something” (Ibid). Accordingly, the purely
logical object ultimately consists of a “relation of
*relata*, i.e., the One *and* the Other or form and
content” (Ibid). This relationship reveals “the synthetic
unity of the object”, through which “the multiplicity of
its elements is interconnected” (EEE: 24). Nevertheless, this
unity differs not only from the simple and undifferentiated unity of
identity since it demands difference and otherness, but also from the
semantic unity of the singular since it means a plurality.

### D4 “The subject-predicate relation”

Here, Rickert conveys all the properties stated in the previous definitions and finally reads “form and content” as “predicate and subject,” respectively.

With predicate, we must first understand only the

formthat the act of judgment ascribes to a content. Accordingly, the subject is only the formedcontent. In this original connection or “syntheses” of subject and predicate, i.e., the connection of content and form, we then actually have the simplest judgment. (EEE: 44)

For Rickert, the semantic relation of *subject and predicate*
matches the metaphysical connection of *content and form*.
Although the former represents a development of the latter, it retains
some aspects that we don’t recognize in modern logic. Here,
standard-form categorical claims correlate two classes denoted by the
*subject* and *predicate terms*. They assert that either
*all* or *part* of the *S*-term is “included
in” or “excluded from” the *P*-term. However,
this membership doesn’t affect the terms. Quite the contrary,
Rickert maintains that the semantic relation brings forth a new object
since the predicate modifies the subject by newly forming its content.
In this sense, “Every ‘subject’ *denoted* by
a word already *has* a ‘predicate.’” (EEE:
45)

Rickert derives D4, central to his philosophy (including the late works, see Rickert 1930), from multiple sources, starting from Brentano (1874). In 1888, he refers to Sigwart (1873/1878), Lotze (1874), Lange (1877), Schuppe (1878), and Windelband (1882). In 1892, he also considered Bergmann (1879). Finally, advancing Rickert’s view, his student Lask (1912) entirely relies on D4.

Following Windelband (1910, 1913), Rickert distinguishes *logical
identity* from *mathematical equality*. His philosophy of
mathematics stands or falls on it. If the logical object already
represented natural numbers, it should also share their properties. In
\(\mathbf{N}\), the equation \(1=1\) is always true. Yet, this
isn’t the case if \(1=1\) stands for *form and content*
or *the One & the Other*. They find their identity by
mutual exclusion: e.g., let \(F\) and \(C\) stand for *form*
and *content*, respectively, then, we obtain “\(\forall
x(Fx \leftrightarrow \neg Cx)\)”. The *form* (i.e.,
*the One*) is identical to whatever the *content* (i.e.,
*the Other*) is not, and vice versa. Further, *form and
content* cannot switch places as though they were elements of an
equation. Hence, they cannot be numbers since the commutative law
fails: \(FC\ne CF\) since the form can never become its own content, nor the content its own form.

Finally, the expressions “\(a\) is \(a\)” (i.e., \(a=a)\)
and “\(a\) is equal to 2” (i.e., \(a=2)\) differ, although
both employ the same “=” sign due to the lack of better
options. Anything is identical to itself and to itself alone, but
under certain circumstances, everything can be equal to everything
else, namely partially identical (see Husserl 1891: 103). However, each logical moment
(i.e., *form* or *content*) has no other parts.
Therefore, under no circumstance can they be equaled. So, concludes
Rickert, identity excludes alterity, while equality requires it. As
Aquinas argues, “*aequalitas diversorum est*”,
i.e., “equality requires distinct things” (*De
Veritate*, I-3), or Meister Eckhart claims, “*Gleichheit
besteht im Unterschied*”, i.e., “equality consists of
difference” (Predigt 19). On the contrary, identity turns
into tautology. The mathematical equality “\(a=2\)”
entails “\(a - 2=0\)”, but the logical identity \(a=a\)
becomes \(0=0\) (whatever value we attribute to \(a)\), namely a
tautology. Here Rickert detects the presence of logical properties in
mathematics. Any natural number equal to itself ends in the recurring
tautology \(0=0\), which he ultimately derives from logical
identity.

## 3. The Numerical Object

For Rickert, we obtain positive integers only when the logical object acquires alogical components (i.e., properties; hereafter P), thus determining its general and empty content. He identifies four of them.

### P1 “Homogeneous medium”

Numbers require a spacetime-like field where the same object can recur multiple times in different places. This field must guarantee the coexistence of identity and diversity, which Frege calls “identity combined with distinguishability” (1884 §40). E.g., in the equation \(1+1=2\), the same 1 recurs twice; the only difference between its first and second recurrence is the position in the field. So, we can even switch the first 1 and the second 1 without altering the identity of the object “1.” This replaceability, remarks Rickert, is “inadmissible in the purely logical dimension” and “means complete equality” (EEE: 58–9). Through it,

the numerical one is the object in general [i.e., the logical object] that lies in various places of time remaining, nevertheless, always identical. (EEE: 59–60)

### P2 “Order”

Numbers need *order* since the medium per se lacks progression,
i.e., an arrow pointing to a direction. Without an arrangement,
numbers would merely display a cluster of similar objects. Unlike the
other real numbers, positive integers must obey a well-ordering
principle stating that every nonempty set of \(\mathbf{N}^+\) has a
least element (i.e., a minimum). So, if \(A\) is a set such that
\(A\subseteq \mathbf{N}^+\) and \(A\ne\varnothing\), then there is a
natural number \(m\) such that \(m\in A\) and \(m \le a\), for all \(a
\in A\). Rickert believes that the \(m \le a\) relies on quantity.

### P3 “Quantity”

Accordingly, the logical object must be quantified, starting with an
arbitrary minimum amount that could set the standard unit for
plurality. Hence, its content must receive a particular
*quantum*. Then, the claim \(1+1=2\) could mean that the same
object or quantum (i.e., 1) seating in two different places (i.e.,
\(1+1)\) equals another object or quantum (i.e., 2). Although 1 and 2
are different objects, the quantity of \(1+1\) must be tantamount to 2
for the equation to be true. How is this possible, however? In
\(1+1=2\), the logical object recurs three times in three places. The
first two times, it changes the place alone. The third time, it
changes the quantified content. The objects \(1+1\) equal object 2
because they share the same quantity.

Therefore, the number is an object or something whose quality must assume a quantitative connotation, namely a quantitative content in the form of identity. So, the singular [number, i.e., 1] differs from the identical and general something [i.e., the logical object] not only through its place in the homogeneous medium but also through its qualitative content—something general has indeed only a “general content” and not yet a “content of this content”; similarly, the plural [number, i.e., \(x\ge 2\)] now stands for a quantitative unity, namely a merging of more singulars equal to it. (EEE: 64)

### P4 “Series”

Numbers display a *series* of quantitative inequalities, not
merely logical sequences. “If 2 and 3”, clarifies Rickert,

would solely differ from each other, without any further characterization of their diversity, we could never compare them as numbers,

namely

know that each quantum constituting the object \(1+1+1\) (equal to the number 3) is also equal to each quantum constituting the object \(1+1\) (equal to the number 2). (EEE: 66)

E.g., we will never know “whether 3 is larger than 2 or the other way around” (Ibid). Accordingly, Rickert defines the series as collecting quantities, added in succession from the smaller to the larger. Each number differs because its unique quantity corresponds to a unique place within the series.

## 4. The Historical Relevance

In conclusion, in the neo-Kantian School of Baden (see Heis 2018), EEE represents the only contribution to the foundation of mathematics, although outshined by the much more discussed writings of the neo-Kantian School of Marburg such as Cohen’s (1878, 1883), Natorp’s (1903, 1910), and Cassirer’s (1907, 1910). Indeed, Rickert’s popularity mainly derives from his axiological writings (see Rickert 1899, 1914; Krijnen 2001: 336–439, 2014; Zijderveld 2006: 139–217). Nevertheless, EEE’s first edition had a favorable reception, especially among critics of the Marburg School, such as Frischeisen-Köhler (1912), Marck (1917), Herrigel (1913/1921), Stenzel (1924), and, more importantly, Müller (1922, 1923), who develops a Rickert-like logical foundation of mathematics, later discussed by Reichenbach (1923) and Bernays (1924).

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### Acknowledgments

The supplement above is by Luca Oliva. The main entry is by Andrea Staiti.