Supplement to Johann Gottfried von Herder

Supplementary Discussion

1. Herder’s Role in the Birth of Linguistics and Anthropology

Herder—especially in the Ideas—laid the foundations for the discipline of linguistics with the following five principles:

  1. Thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language—i.e., one can only think if one has a language, and one can only think what one can express linguistically.
  2. Meanings or concepts consist (not in referents, Platonic forms, or the subjective mental “ideas” favored by the British Empiricists, but instead) in word-usages.
  3. Humankind exhibits profound differences in modes of thought, concepts, and language, especially between different historical periods and cultures.
  4. Because of principles (1) and (2), investigating the characters of peoples’ languages and their differences from each other is a primary and dependable means for discovering the character of, and the differences between, their modes of thought and concepts. For principles (1) and (2) entail that their languages constitute an empirically accessible and reliable window onto the nature of their modes of thought and concepts.
  5. Whereas the early Herder of the Treatise on the Origin (like the Enlightenment before him) had implied that languages were mere aggregates of particular words/concepts, in the Ideas he came to emphasize that grammatical structure [Bau] plays a fundamental role in languages. And whereas in the earlier work his conception of grammar had vacillated between supposing it inessential to language and supposing it universal, in the Ideas he developed the consistent view that all languages have a grammar but that they differ dramatically in their grammatical structures: besides exhibiting other forms of rich variety, “in the structure [Bau] of language, in the relation, the ordering, and the agreement of the parts with each other, it is almost immeasurable”. (G6:353)

These principles formed the foundation for modern linguistics. Friedrich Schlegel took them over and developed them further in On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians (1808), applying them in particular to the investigation of Sanskrit and related languages (i.e., Indo-European languages). Schlegel’s work then quickly inspired a whole wave of important further work based on the same general principles. This included the work of Franz Bopp, August Wilhelm Schlegel, Jakob Grimm, and Wilhelm von Humboldt.

No less importantly, Herder’s philosophy of language and interpretation, together with a number of other philosophical principles that he developed, also played a fundamental role in the birth of modern cultural anthropology. Several of his writings, especially the tenth Collection of the Letters for the Advancement, indeed contain a virtual blueprint for that future discipline. His specific contributions here were many and deep. They included: (1) a conception that the central focus of the discipline should be psychology; (2) the principle of radical mental difference; (3) a conception that the fundamental goal of the discipline is understanding rather than explaining; (4) a hermeneutics based on the recognition of radical mental diversity; (5) an insistence on methodological empiricism in interpretation; (6) an insistence, in the spirit of his philosophy of language, on the fundamental role of language in culture; (7) an insistence on holism in interpretation; (8) a recommendation of participant-observation; (9) a certain distinctive concept of culture; (10) an insistence on the variability, relative appropriateness, and incommensurability of values; (11) a pluralist cosmopolitanism; and (12) an insistence that understanding other cultures also contributes to better self-understanding.

These principles came to constitute the very core of the new discipline of cultural anthropology. The channels through which they influenced its birth centrally included Franz Boas, the founder of American anthropology, and Bronislaw Malinowski, the founder of British fieldwork anthropology.

2. Herder’s Moral Relativism

Concerning the relation of this relativism to other parts of Herder’s philosophy, he himself often backs away from it. As Frederick Beiser has pointed out, even within This Too a Philosophy of History he seems to try to combine it with an assumption of a higher moral standpoint that does in the end permit a sort of comparative ranking of moralities, namely, by invoking an analogy between the historical series of cultures and the different ages of man. Then in the Ideas he backs away from it in another way, now asserting that there is a fundamental moral value that is shared by all historical periods and cultures after all, one that can be used as a common measure to assess the overall morality of one period or culture as better or worse than that of another, namely, humanity [Humanität].

These attempts to back away from relativism do not pose an intrinsic problem for it, however, since they are themselves both very problematic. The appeal to an analogy with the different ages of man seems either to be a case of explaining obscurum per obscurius, more specifically, a case of explaining one apparent self-contradiction by another, or to depend on overlooking the fact that when we make such seemingly self-contradictory assessments about the different ages of man their self-contradictoriness turns out to be merely apparent precisely because when we posit an equality of value between the aspirations of different ages we are thinking of non-moral aspirations but when we posit progress in them we are thinking of moral ones. Moreover, the appeal to a universally shared moral value of humanity in the end merely looks like a desperate relapse into the sort of empirically false moral universalism that many of Herder’s Enlightenment predecessors (e.g., Hume and Voltaire) had espoused, but which Herder in his more insightful, relativistic moments had unmasked as an error. (Nietzsche later implied a criticism of Herder of just this sort in Homer’s Contest, where he argued that so far from championing humanity, as Herder had claimed, Homer and his culture rather championed cruelty, strife, and agonality.)

However, Herder’s relativism is in fact intrinsically problematic, nonetheless. The main problem with it is that it is psychologically impossible to refrain consistently from passing the sorts of comparative evaluative judgments on other moralities that it proscribes, and moreover harmful to try to do so. As Nietzsche memorably put it, “Is life not passing judgment, preferring, being unfair …?” (Beyond Good and Evil: section 9) If one is confronted with hard cases, such as the traditional Indian moral code of sutti (the forcible burning alive of the widow of a dead man) or the moral codes of certain tribes that prisoners of war should be cruelly tortured and/or eaten, is one really going to be able to sustain the relativistic assessment, “Just a different moral code, can’t say that it’s better or worse than our own”? And if one could, would that be a good thing? The answers to both of these questions seem to be No. Indeed, as has sometimes been pointed out, Herder himself, even in his most relativistic works, and especially in his less relativistic ones such as the Ideas, does not consistently refrain from passing negative judgments on other moral codes.

Still, there is a great danger of throwing out the baby with the bathwater here. For even if Herder’s relativism cannot be sustained in an unmodified form for the sorts of reasons just mentioned, it may nonetheless be a big step in the right direction, requiring only modest “tweaking” in order to make it tenable. And that, I suggest, is the case. The specific “tweak” in question is to grant to Herder’s relativism that there are no universal or objective moral values, and that moral values normally in some sense “suit” their contexts, but to continue upholding one’s own moral values and judging others’ moral values in light of them, only now doing so in a consciously non-universal, non-objective way. (As Nietzsche put it, “My judgment is my judgment” (Beyond Good and Evil: section 43), or, if one finds Nietzsche’s extreme individualism there problematic, “Our judgment is our judgment”, for some less-than-universal us.) Such a position does justice to the theoretical insights behind Herder’s relativism but without incurring its unacceptable costs.

Moreover, it still promises to support the sort of toleration that Herder saw as an important benefit of his relativism, albeit now in a slightly different way: not by outlawing comparative evaluations of moralities altogether, but instead by preserving an awareness that in cases where our morality conflicts with another morality both of them are usually based on non-universal moral sentiments that in some sense suit their contexts, so that unless the conflict between them is a really severe one an attitude of respect and forbearance is appropriate.

Nor (to anticipate an objection that some cognitivists will be itching to make here) does such a position threaten to undermine the seriousness of our moral commitments. To use an analogy that seems to me helpful here: when I love, and if push comes to shove prefer, my own child over other people’s children, this sort of commitment to him/her need not be undermined in its seriousness by a concession on my part (one virtually required by sanity in this case) that other parents have similar preferences for their children as well, that my child is not objectively better than all other children, and that like my own other parents’ preferences for their children serve important functions.

3. Herder’s Later Philosophy of History

His later writings by no means officially stay loyal to the view that history has no discernible meaning; famously, This Too a Philosophy of History insists that history does have an overall purpose, and that this fact (though not the nature of the purpose) is discernible from the cumulative way in which cultures have built upon one another historically, and the Ideas then goes on to tell a long story to the effect that history’s purpose consists in its steady realization of “reason” and “humanity”. However, Herder clearly still harbors grave doubts just below the surface. This is visible in This Too a Philosophy of History from the work’s ironically self-deprecating title; Pyrrhonian-spirited motto; vacillation between several incompatible models of history’s direction (progressive?, progressive and cyclical?, merely cyclical?, even regressive?); and morbid dwelling on, and unpersuasive attempt to rebut, the “skeptical” view of history as meaningless “Penelope-work”. (A few years later in his Theological Letters of 1780–1 Herder would write that history is “a textbook of the nullity of all human things” [G9/1:438].) It is also visible in the Ideas from the fact that Herder’s official account there of the purposiveness of history gets contradicted by other passages that insist on the inappropriateness of teleological (as contrasted with efficient causal) explanations in history. Herder’s official position certainly had a powerful influence on some successors (especially Hegel), but it is this quieter counterstrand of skepticism that represents his better philosophical judgment.

Concerning efficient causal insights, Herder’s later works again in a sense stay faithful to his skeptical position in the Older Critical Forestlet—but they also modify it, and this time for the better philosophically speaking. The mature Herder does not, like the Herder of that early work, rest his case on a general skepticism about the role or the discernibility of efficient causation in history. On the contrary, he insists that history is governed by efficient causation and that we should try to discover as far as possible the specific ways in which it is so. But he remains highly skeptical about the extent to which such an undertaking can be successful, and hence about how far it can take us toward real explanations of the past, and toward predicting or controlling the future. His main reason for this skepticism is that major historical deeds and events are not the products of some one or few readily identifiable causal factors (as political and military historians tend to assume), but rather of chance confluences of huge numbers of different causal factors, many of which, moreover, are individually unknown and unknowable by the historian—for example, because in themselves too trivial to have been recorded, or, in the case of psychological factors, because the historical agent failed to make them public, deliberately misrepresented them, or was himself unaware of them due to their submersion in the unconscious depths of his mind.

4. Herder on Skepticism

Herder tends to run together two problems in this connection: (1) the problem of whether there is any meaning to the seemingly anarchic and endless series of changes from age to age (or culture to culture); (2) the problem that the multiplication of conflicting views on virtually all subjects that is found in history (or in intercultural comparison) causes, or at least exacerbates, the ancient skeptic’s difficulty of unresolvable disputes forcing one to suspend belief.

Problem (1) has already been discussed. Here it is problem (2) that concerns us. This is a problem that Ernst Troeltsch would make much of in the twentieth century. But Herder had already clearly seen it.

Herder is determined to avoid this sort of skepticism. He has two main strategies for doing so, but they are inconsistent with each other, and neither of them works in the end. His first strategy is to try to defuse the problem at source by arguing that, on closer inspection, there is much more common ground between different periods and cultures than it allows. This strategy is already found in the Critical Forests, where (as was mentioned earlier) Herder argues that different standards of beauty have an underlying unity, and it plays a central role in the Ideas, where in particular “humanity” is presented as a shared ethical value. Herder’s second strategy is instead to acknowledge the problem in an unmitigated form and to respond with relativism: especially in This Too a Philosophy of History he argues that—at least where questions of moral, aesthetic, and prudential value are concerned—the different positions held by different periods and cultures are equally valid, namely, for the periods and cultures to which they belong, and that there can be no justification for a preferential ranking between them. The later Letters for the Advancement vacillates between these two strategies.

Neither of these strategies is satisfactory in the end. The first, that of asserting deep commonalities, is hopeless (notwithstanding its seemingly eternal appeal to empirically underinformed Anglophone philosophers). It flies in the face of the empirical evidence. Moreover, it flies in the face of Herder’s own better interpretive judgments about the empirical evidence—for example, his observation in On the Change of Taste and elsewhere that basic values have not only changed over the course of history but in some cases actually been inverted.

Herder’s alternative, relativist, strategy is more interesting, but is not in the end satisfactory either (even concerning values, where its prospects look best). Perhaps the most serious problem with it is a twofold one that Nietzsche saw: First, as has already been discussed in a previous link, it is psychologically impossible to sustain, and moreover sustaining it would be harmful. Second, nor does the phenomenon of fundamental value variations require us to adopt such an indifference. For, while it may indeed show that there are no universal or objective values, it leaves us with a better alternative to indifference: continuing to hold our values and to judge others’ values in light of them only now in a self-consciously non-universal, non-objective way (Nietzsche’s “My judgment is my judgment”, or its less individualistic variant: “Our judgment is our judgment”, for some less-than-universal us).

5. Herder and Human Rights

The late seventeenth and eighteenth centuries were a great age for the concepts of “rights” in general and “human rights” (in the form of the rights of “all men”, “les droits de l’homme”) in particular. Think, for example, of the English Bills of Rights (1689); the American Declaration of Independence (1776), Constitution (1787/9), and Bill of Rights (1791); and the French Déclaration des droits de l’homme et du citoyen (1789).

Herder, as a highly educated man of his time and a sympathizer with the American and French Revolutions, was certainly very familiar with the concept of human rights, or in his German “Menschenrechte”. However, his attitude toward it is ambivalent.

Thus if one reads the two works of his that are most relevant for this topic both thematically and chronologically, namely, the Ideas (1784–91) and the Letters for the Advancement (1793–7), the situation seems to be roughly as follows. On the one hand, he has enormous sympathy with the American and French Revolutions; embraces “humanity” as his highest ethical and political ideal; accordingly, writes at length and with great passion against despotism, imperialism, war, and every other form of abuse, oppression, or exploitation of one human being by another; and in the unfinished Ideas, where he lambasts the Catholic church for its history of violating such values, planned to conclude with an account of how, by contrast, the Protestant Reformation had prepared the way for the English Bill of Rights. But on the other hand, he conspicuously avoids using the already available terminology and concept of “human rights” in order to articulate these positions. There thus seems to be a tension in Herder between, on the one hand, passionate commitment to the substantive normative goals of the concept of “human rights” and, on the other hand, some sort of skepticism concerning the concept itself.

This ambivalence is interesting, not only for historical-exegetical reasons but also because it is arguably something we ought to share with Herder. What are Herder’s reasons, or at least (since he does not say very much on the subject explicitly) possible reasons, behind his skepticism about the concept?

A central set of worries that he evidently entertains about the concept of “human rights” concerns an essential connection between this concept and the concept of law. The eighteenth century standardly conceived human rights as belonging to a system of either God’s law or natural law, the latter in the sense of a set of universal norms either ordained by God or in some other way inscribed in the very order of nature. For example, the authors of the American Declaration of Independence used both of these characterizations, while the authors of the French Déclaration des droits de l’homme et du citoyen left out God and appealed to natural law alone. In addition, the concept of human rights emerged during the late seventeenth century and the eighteenth century within a context of positive law—specifically, within the context of framing new constitutional law. The English Bill of Rights, the American Declaration of Independence, the American Constitution with its appended Bill of Rights, and the French Déclaration des droits de l’homme et du citoyen all exhibit this feature.

The essential connection between the concept of human rights and the concept of law must have been especially clear to Herder, not only because of the history just outlined, but also because in German the word for a right, Recht, often simply means “law”, just as in French the word for a right, droit, often simply means “law”.

Now Herder would, I think, reject any such legalistic concept of “human rights” in principle. Consider, first of all, the conception of human rights as either God’s law or natural law. Herder would reject the idea that we should regard such rights as deriving directly from God’s law for reasons that are similar to those that lead him to reject the idea that human language or other natural phenomena are directly attributable to God.

What about a conception of human rights as natural law? Herder would be equally dissatisfied with this way of conceiving them as a type of law. Friedrich Meinecke in his justly famous book Historism: The Rise of a New Historical Outlook ([1936] 1972) has indeed gone as far as to depict it as one of Herder’s greatest philosophical achievements to have overthrown the relevant conception of natural law (and thereby ushered in a new historicism concerning values). Meinecke’s reading captures the most original, valuable, and influential strand in Herder’s thought, a strand that is prominent in such works as On the Change of Taste (1766), This Too a Philosophy of History (1774), and much of the Letters for the Advancement (1793–7). For in this strand of his thought Herder argues in sharp opposition to the natural law tradition that all moral (and also aesthetic and prudential) values are (1) profoundly variable between periods and cultures, and even to some extent between individuals within a single period and culture, and (2) based (not in divine commands or a normative structure otherwise inscribed in the order of nature but) in human beings’ highly variable moral sentiments.

So much for a conception of human rights as divine law or natural law. But Herder would be equally skeptical about the traditional close association of them with positive law as well. Why? His most important reason is that positive law is different from, and needs to be constrained by, the deeper phenomenon of morality, and that the ideals that are involved in the area of “human rights” really belong to the latter, deeper level. He articulates this position in the Letters for the Advancement, where he discusses it in connection with Romans law and morality and concludes,

Let us then adopt the Greeks’ and Romans’ concept of humanity, for this barbaric human right [Menschenrecht] makes us shudder. (G7:151–3)

Finally, while Herder nowhere goes as far as to deny that it is legitimate and important to complement the moral ideals involved in the area of “human rights” with a codification of them into law, he also worries that such codification tends to weaken them in certain ways. He implies such a worry in the Letters for the Advancement when he contrasts the simple morality of the Germanic tribes favorably with the complex Roman law that succeeded it.

For all of these reasons, Herder finds the attempt to capture the substantive moral ideals governing the respectful treatment of other human beings that he basically shares with champions of “human rights” in terms of the concept of “human rights” with its legal implications misguided. Instead, he prefers the unequivocally moral concept of “humanity”.

It seems arguable that his criticisms of conceptions of “human rights” as divine or natural law and his criticisms of the conception that they are intimately linked to positive law are well founded, and that this fact does indeed pose a serious, indeed potentially even fatal, problem for the very concept of “human rights”, given its essential conceptual connection to the idea of law.

Herder also has a number of further worries (or likely worries) about the concept of “human rights” that lead him prefer his own ideal of humanity. The concept of “rights” essentially involves a concept of “having” rights and thereby imports a conceptual connection to the legal institution of property. But from a left-wing Christian perspective like Herder’s, such a conceptual exaltation of property must seem objectionable.

Moreover, the concept of “human rights” leaves out, and even undermines, some other very important moral protections. For one thing, from its beginnings until today the concept has mainly been oriented to protecting individual human beings against abuses by their own governments. Herder certainly thinks that this is extremely important. But he is equally concerned to protect individuals against abuses from outside their countries: war, imperialism, colonialism, enslavement, economic exploitation, and so on. So the concept of “human rights” is at best incomplete. But worse than that, it also readily lends itself to a certain insidious and harmful misuse: that of distracting from, and even providing an ideological rationalization for, types of abuse of people that come from outside their countries, such as war and imperialism. In this spirit Herder already writes in This Too a Philosophy of History:

The universal dress of philosophy and love of mankind can hide oppressions, attacks on the true, personal freedom of human beings and lands, citizens, and peoples, of just the sort that Cesare Borgia would wish for. (HPW 351)

For another thing, it is a striking feature of Herder’s moral outlook that his moral sympathies extend beyond human beings to include non-human animals as well. But anyone who adopts such a position has grounds for viewing the concept of “human rights” with some suspicion.

Finally, Herder also has the resources for developing an additional objection to the concept of “human rights” that is closely related to the preceding objections in various ways. At several points in the Letters for the Advancement he makes the plausible conceptual point that rights entail duties, and this not only in the sense that one person’s right is always someone else’s duty, but also in the sense that only individuals who have relevant duties and who take them seriously can have rights. Such a conception no doubt makes good sense within the legal context from which the concept of “rights” was originally drawn. But it has very unfortunate consequences when the concept is transferred to the moral plane in the form of a doctrine of “human rights”. For it makes extending moral protection in the form of “rights” to individuals who for one reason or another are not able to have, or to live up to, corresponding duties—say, because the morality of their culture does not include a commitment to human rights, or merely because they are children or mentally disabled—into a sort of conceptual absurdity.

These, then, are some additional reasons (or at least likely reasons) why Herder shies away from the concept of “human rights”, preferring to replace it with the concept of “humanity”.

6. Herder’s Secularism

This can be seen from a comparison with Ernesti (the most important of the Bible scholars just mentioned, and the one most admired by Herder). Ernesti’s great work, Institutio interpretis Novi Testamenti (1761), which Herder singles out for special praise, is a key statement of the sort of secularism in question. Initially, the work seems to advocate a secularism identical in spirit to Herder’s, arguing that we must interpret biblical books in the same way as profane texts, and thereby learn whatever religious truth they contain. However, as the work develops, matters become much cloudier. In this connection, it is important to distinguish between two questions that can be asked concerning the relation between divine inspiration and interpretation: (1) May readers of sacred texts rely on a divine inspiration of themselves (for example, by the Holy Spirit) bringing them to a correct interpretation rather than on more usual interpretive means? (2) May they assume in interpretation that because the texts’ authors are divinely inspired the texts must be completely true and therefore also completely self-consistent? When Ernesti develops the details of his position it becomes clear that he has really only advanced as far toward secularism as consistently answering question (1) in the negative, not question (2). His failure to give a consistently negative answer to question (2) lands him in flat contradiction with his official commitment to interpreting sacred texts in exactly the same way as profane texts (for, of course, as he indeed himself implies, in interpreting profane texts we may not assume that the texts are throughout true and therefore also self-consistent). It also seems intellectually indefensible in other ways—merely a rather transparent refusal to stop, so to speak, “cooking the books” in favor of the Bible when interpreting it. By contrast, the young Herder advances beyond Ernesti in his secularism because he consistently answers both questions in the negative, and thereby, unlike Ernesti, achieves a position that is both self-consistent and otherwise intellectually defensible. Moreover, Herder’s actual interpretations of the Bible admirably conform to this theoretical position, not only refraining from any reliance on divine inspiration and instead employing normal interpretive techniques, but also frequently attributing false and even inconsistent positions to the Bible (both to the Old and to the New Testaments).

7. Herder’s Influence

For example (to begin with some cases that have already been touched on), it was mainly Herder (not, as has often been supposed, Hamann) who established the two fundamental theses that founded modern philosophy of language: the thesis that thought essentially depends on and is bounded by language and the thesis that meaning consists in word-usage. It was mainly Herder who, on the basis of those two theses in the philosophy of language (plus a third one), together with a revolutionary recognition of radical mental difference, established modern interpretation-theory, or “hermeneutics”, doing so in ways that would subsequently be taken over by Schleiermacher in his famous lectures on the subject and which would then be reformulated even more systematically by the latter’s pupil Boeckh. It was Herder who by doing so also made a fundamental contribution to establishing the methodological foundations of nineteenth-century German classical scholarship (which rested on the Schleiermacher-Boeckh methodology), thereby making possible the great achievements of that scholarship, and ultimately the methodology and the achievements of subsequent classical scholarship as well. It was Herder who through this new theory of interpretation, together with specific interpretive discoveries of his concerning the Bible that were grounded in it, made vital contributions to the development of modern biblical scholarship. It was Herder who, by recognizing the text-like character of visual art and the proper principles for interpreting such art, made possible the development of modern art history. It was Herder who, again on the basis of his new philosophy of language together with his recognition of radical mental difference, first developed a revolutionary new theory of “foreignizing” translation that transformed not only translation theory but also translation practice and which remains the preeminent theory of translation to this day (e.g., through the work of Antoine Berman). It was Herder who, through his theses in the philosophy of language, his discovery of deep variations in thought and language between different historical periods and cultures, his recognition of the fundamental role of grammar in language and of deep variations in languages’ grammatical structures, his empirical approach to investigating languages and thereby the modes of thought that they enable, and in other ways, inspired Friedrich Schlegel, Wilhelm von Humboldt, and others to found modern linguistics. And it was Herder who with his new philosophy of language and theory of interpretation, together with further important contributions, did more than anyone else to establish the modern discipline of cultural anthropology.

Herder’s influence on individual thinkers of stature has been enormous as well. For example, Goethe was transformed from being merely a talented but rather conventional poet in his early years into the great artist that he eventually became largely through the early and constant impact on him of Herder’s ideas. In particular, beginning with their first encounter in Strasbourg in 1770, and during several decades of friendship that followed, it was Herder who caused Goethe to develop his deep commitment to a Spinozist monism and his related fascination with natural science; to move away from the conventional formalism of his earlier poetry toward a poetry of nature and feeling (such a program was especially marked in Herder’s own thought at the time when they first met in the early 1770s); to develop a deep love of Homer, ancient tragedy, Shakespeare, and Ossian; to take a serious interest in the common ballads of ordinary people; to become a committed cosmopolitan; to see the importance of world literature; and indeed, to develop the character of Faust in his great play of that name, who was largely modeled on Herder.

Herder also influenced Nietzsche profoundly. This is true of Nietzsche’s philosophy of language—which in The Gay Science (1882/7) and elsewhere takes over a version of Herder’s position that thought is dependent on language and thereby on society, so that the self is so as well (albeit while in typically Nietzschean fashion also going on to assert, in contradiction of Herder, that there is a deeper sort of thought that is not dependent on language or society), and which also takes over Herder’s conception of the deeply metaphorical nature of language, for example, in projecting gender onto the world through grammar and in the pervasive creative, individualistic transformations that lead from object to stimulus to image to thought and language (compare here Nietzsche’s On Truth and Lying in an Extra-moral Sense (1873) with Herder’s On Image, Poetry, and Fable). It is true of Nietzsche’s philosophy of mind—including its rejection of dualism, its denial of any sharp division between the mental faculties (especially between cognition and volition, or affects), its emphasis on the unconscious, and its insistence on psychological individuality. It is true of his philosophy of history—including its commitment to radical mental difference across historical periods, cultures, and individuals, and its use of the method of genealogy in order to throw light on modern outlooks, a method that ultimately derived from Herder’s genetic method. And it is also true of his moral philosophy, where his sophisticated form of sentimentalism, his insistence on historical, cultural, and individual variations and even oppositions in moral sentiments, his explanation of moralities in terms of their function of serving specific societies and modes of life, and his application of the genealogical method to morality all derive from Herder.

Other important nineteenth-century philosophers were deeply influenced by Herder as well. For example, Wilhelm von Humboldt is deeply indebted to him for his philosophy of language, his linguistics, his ideal of Bildung, and his liberal political philosophy; Dilthey’s whole approach to history and the human sciences is heavily indebted to Herder as well; and even John Stuart Mill has important debts to Herder, namely, in his liberal political philosophy (largely via Humboldt).

However, in order to round out this picture of Herder’s massive influence, let us now discuss a further important aspect of it in a little more detail: his fundamental role in the development of both of the main philosophical movements that dominated German philosophy in the generation after him, namely, German Romanticism and post-Kantian German Idealism. For he massively prefigured both of these movements and neither of them could have arisen without him.

To begin with German Romanticism. Herder played an essential role in Friedrich Schlegel’s invention of the very idea of “Romanticism”. For it was mainly Herder’s theory of the historical mutability of genres and of the mistakenness of judging works from one genre in terms of the rules and purposes of another, in particular as he applied it in the Letters for the Advancement to the special case of the difference between ancient and modern poetry, that stimulated Friedrich Schlegel to make the famous shift in the course of writing his On the Study of Greek Poetry (1795/7) that first gave birth to Romanticism: a shift from an initial neo-classical position that modern poetry’s distinctive yearning for the infinite, individuality, mixing of genres, and so on are simply violations of classical rules to a position that they instead constitute a new type of poetry that has no less value than classical poetry. And it was also Herder who, especially in the Letters for the Advancement, contributed several of the other traits that came to define Romantic poetry for the Schlegel brothers (for example, a fusion of yearning for the infinite with erotic yearning for a female beloved, and an identification of the novel as the central Romantic genre).

But Herder’s contribution to German Romanticism also goes far beyond that. One important example of this lies in German Romanticism’s neo-Spinozist monism in metaphysics or religion. The Romantics’ adoption of such a position was largely a result of Herder’s prior development of it in God: Some Conversations, and accordingly took over Herder’s modifications of Spinoza’s position. For example, Schleiermacher already adopted a version of Spinoza’s metaphysical-religious monism in the 1790s, and in doing so incorporated into it Herder’s conception of the single principle in question as primal force (rather than substance).

Another important example lies in the philosophy of language, hermeneutics, and translation theory. Schleiermacher essentially took over Herder’s revolutionary new principles in all three of these areas. So too did Friedrich Schlegel.

Another significant example lies in the philosophy of mind. Schleiermacher, beginning in the 1790s and then continuing in his later lectures on psychology, took over three of Herder’s central principles in the philosophy of mind to form the core of his own philosophy of mind: a denial of dualism in favor of a non-reductive mental-physical monism; a denial of any sharp distinction between cognition and volition; and an espousal of a form of determinism.

Another important example lies in aesthetics. As has already been mentioned in passing, Schleiermacher’s aesthetics lectures are little more than a reworking of Herder’s systematic theory of the several arts in the Critical Forests. Likewise, Friedrich Schlegel’s (much more important) theory of art is profoundly indebted to Herder. For instance, Schlegel’s considered theory of both literary and non-linguistic artistic genres is basically the same as Herder’s. Moreover, he also takes over Herder’s positions that non-linguistic art is usually text-like, bearing meanings and thoughts and hence requiring interpretation, and that its meanings and thoughts are to be explained in a refined narrow expressivist manner as essentially dependent on the artist’s language.

Finally, yet another important example lies in the area of ethics and political philosophy. In particular, Friedrich Schlegel and Schleiermacher, especially in their most important early period, but to some extent also subsequently, took over from Herder a deep commitment to the values of individuality; liberalism and republicanism/democracy in domestic politics; and cosmopolitanism in international politics (including a strong rejection of misogyny, antisemitism, and racism).

A similar picture of Herder’s decisive influence emerges in connection with post-Kantian German Idealism: Schelling and Hegel. Herder’s influence here was absolutely fundamental and decisive (though, of course, this does not exclude significant modifications or other influences).

The central example of this influence concerns Schelling and Hegel’s metaphysical monism, their “absolute idealism”, which largely derives from Herder’s neo-Spinozist monism. Herder’s commitment to a neo-Spinozist monism antedates the Pantheismusstreit of 1785 between Jacobi and Mendelssohn by more than ten years, and was therefore by no means produced by it. Moreover, it was not Jacobi and Mendelssohn who were mainly responsible for the great wave of enthusiasm for neo-Spinozist monism that emerged in the next generation with the Romantics and the German Idealists, for they were both deeply hostile to Spinoza’s position, but instead that great enthusiast for Spinoza Herder (together with his fellow enthusiast Lessing and his follower in enthusiasm Goethe). This is confirmed by the fact that the main revisions of Spinoza’s monism that Herder undertook in God: Some Conversations were subsequently reproduced by the versions of neo-Spinozist monism that were championed by both the Romantics and the German Idealists.

The main revisions of Herder’s in question were: (1) a subjectivizing of Spinoza’s monistic principle (in contrast to Spinoza, Herder attributes to it not only thoughts but also understanding, volition, and intentions, and characterizes it as spirit, Geist); (2) a dynamizing of the principle (Herder no longer like Spinoza characterizes it as substance, but instead as force, Kraft); (3) a closer connection of the principle’s (as well as finite minds’) thought with extension/matter, namely by means of the concept of force; (4) a vitalizing, or teleologizing, of forces, both in the monistic principle itself and in the nature that is ultimately one with it; and (5) an ontological demoting not only of time but also of space to the rank of a mere appearance (Spinoza had himself demoted time in this way but not space).

With that broad picture before us, we are now in a position to consider Herder’s influence on Schelling and Hegel in a little more detail. Schelling’s preoccupation with Herder’s ideas began early, in his M.A. thesis De prima malorum origine (1792)—which deals with Herder’s mythological interpretation of Genesis in his Oldest Document of the Human Species (1774/6)—and in On Myths, Historical Legends, and Philosophemes of the Oldest World (1792/3)—in which he develops a Herder-inspired theory of mythology with the help of Herder’s Treatise on the Origin and Ideas.

But Herder’s most important influences on Schelling concern the later emergence of Schelling’s monistic absolute idealism and his philosophy of nature. Already in On the I as the Principle of Philosophy or On the Unconditional in Human Knowledge and in Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism (both 1795) Schelling basically takes over Herder’s revised version of Spinoza’s monism (albeit while omitting to mention Herder and officially rejecting Spinoza). In particular, he incorporates revisions (1) through (4). Concerning revision (5), the ontological demotion of time and space, Schelling at least emphasizes the ontological demotion of time.

In his Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (1797) (note the echo of Herder’s title Ideas for a Philosophy of History of Humanity) and On the World Soul (1798) Schelling then also takes over the beginnings of a philosophy of nature that Herder had sketched at the start of the Ideas and especially at the end of God: Some Conversations. Schelling in particular takes over and further develops Herder’s model there of a hierarchical system of opposing vitalistic forces (for example, in the magnet, in electricity, and in attraction/repulsion) that ascend to a sort of equilibrium and order and which are ultimately grounded in an absolute spirit.

Both of Schelling’s appropriations from Herder’s theories just mentioned later became central components of the explicitly Spinozist “Philosophy of Identity” that Schelling began to champion around the turn of the century, and which then strongly influenced Hegel.

Herder’s influence on Hegel is even deeper and more extensive. Like Schelling, Hegel famously went through a predominantly theological-mythological phase in the 1790s during which Herder’s ideas exercised a strong influence on him. When Hegel moved to Jena in 1800 and began a career as a philosopher, he largely retained those Herderian ideas, and moreover went on to take over further ideas from Herder (often modifying them in the process, to be sure).

Hegel took over Herder’s neo-Spinozist monism, in ways that were partly direct and partly indirect. First, he took over Herder’s neo-Spinozist conception of God as spirit [Geist] in a direct way—initially in the late additions to The Positivity of the Christian Religion (1795/6) and then more emphatically in The Spirit of Christianity and Its Fate (1798–1800). Both works deal with questions about the origin and character of Judaism and Christianity that had long been central topics of Herder’s, and are accordingly strongly influenced by Herder (who is mentioned there by name). The influence of Herder’s neo-Spinozist monistic conception of spirit is simply part of this broader influence. Second, when Hegel moved to Jena around the turn of the century he undertook a sort of fusion of this basically religious monism with his friend Schelling’s new “Philosophy of Identity”, including its philosophy of nature, which amounted to incorporating Herder’s influences on Schelling indirectly as well. In the course of the following few years Hegel also strove to save the subjectivity of the monistic principle involved, which had in the meantime been virtually lost by Schelling himself while he was developing the “Philosophy of Identity”, and indeed emphasized it increasingly as time went on (think, for example, of the preface of Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit [1807] where he insists that Spinoza’s principle of substance needs to be complemented with subjectivity). The upshot in Hegel was a version of neo-Spinozist monism almost exactly like Herder’s, in particular a version of it that incorporated each of Herder’s revisions (1)–(5) in one way or another (revision (5) specifically in Hegel’s famous interpretation and defense of Spinoza’s monism as a form of acosmism).

But Herder’s influence on Hegel is not limited to Hegel’s monism and philosophy of nature. It also extends to a whole series of further areas of Hegel’s philosophy (areas that probably today have more living relevance than its monism and philosophy of nature).

First, Hegel developed his conception of the transition from nature to the (human) mind through a reflection on, and revision of, a position of Herder’s. In the Ideas Herder had argued that human beings (a) exhibit a strong continuity with the “realm of animals” (he even calls the animals their “older brothers”) but (b) are distinguished from it by their possession of spirit, constituting a special “spiritual realm”. As can be seen from the ironically titled chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit “The Spiritual Animal Realm”, as well as from passages in his later Reason in History (published posthumously in 1837), Hegel rejected (a), but accepted (b). This produced his own systematic conception of the transition from nature to (human) spirit.

Second, Herder exerted a strong influence on Hegel’s philosophy of the human spirit, or mind, itself. For one thing, Herder’s anti-dualistic equation of the human mind with force in On the Cognition and Sensation was initially taken over by Hegel around the turn of the century, and then subjected by him to a subtle revision. As we saw, Herder had presupposed a realistic conception of force in general, according to which, while it is true that force essentially involves corresponding physical behavior, it is not reducible thereto. However, Hegel during his early Jena period (1801–7) criticized this realistic conception of force and replaced it with an anti-realistic conception that did reduce force to corresponding physical behavior. This revision automatically led Hegel to a straightforward identification of the mind in particular with corresponding physical behavior, and hence to an even stronger form of anti-dualism than Herder had championed. For another thing, Herder’s rejection in On the Cognition and Sensation of hard and fast divisions between mental faculties, for example, between cognition and sensation or between cognition and volition, led to a similar rejection of such hard and fast divisions in Hegel.

Third, Herder exerted a strong influence on Hegel’s philosophy of language. This influence is evident in almost all phases of Hegel’s career, but is especially prominent in the Phenomenology of Spirit, whose philosophy of language is almost entirely indebted to and in agreement with Herder’s. To give just a few examples: (1) As we have seen, Herder had already in early works such as On Diligence and the Fragments championed the doctrine that thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language. In chapters of the Phenomenology of Spirit such as “Sense-certainty”, “Phrenology”, and “The Artificer”, as well as in other works from the Jena period, Hegel assumes the same doctrine (in addition taking over Herder’s further conception that oral language is more fundamental than written). (2) Especially in On the Cognition and Sensation, Herder had championed the theory that language, and therefore also thought, depends on a linguistic community. This position too plays a central role in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit as well as in other works of his. (3) In his Treatise on the Origin Herder had argued that the whole human mind is dependent on thought and hence language, intimately involving them both. Similarly, Hegel in the Phenomenology of Spirit characterizes language as the very “existence [Dasein]” of the subject, or the mind, and he continues to champion this Herderian conception strongly in as late a text as the preface to the second edition of his Science of Logic (1832). (4) In keeping with that position, Herder had championed the thesis in On the Cognition and Sensation that not only language and therefore thought but also the subject depends on a linguistic community. This thesis too subsequently plays a central role in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit.

Fourth, Herder exercised a strong influence on Hegel’s philosophy of history. Several components of this influence can be distinguished: (1) Herder had argued in This Too a Philosophy of History that history has a necessary course that works to fulfill a final purpose, then in the Ideas he had identified the purpose in question as the realization of (humanity or) reason. In the Phenomenology of Spirit and his lectures on the philosophy of history Hegel takes over this position and develops it further. (2) Especially in This Too a Philosophy of History Herder had emphasized that the human spirit, or mind, changes in profound ways over the course of history. Hegel adopts this position too, especially in the Phenomenology of Spirit and other works concerned with history. (3) In Attempt at a History of Lyric Poetry (1764), the Fragments (1767/8), and This Too a Philosophy of History (1774) Herder had developed a “genetic” method that undertakes to explain modern spiritual or mental phenomena in terms of their gradual development out of earlier historical origins and antecedents. Hegel subsequently took over this method, especially in his Phenomenology of Spirit (where he discusses his version of it in the preface). (4) Finally, in This Too a Philosophy of History Herder had extended the application of the concept of formation [Bildung] from its then normal use in connection with individuals and their education to humankind and its historical self-development as a whole as well. Hegel takes over this new broader application of the concept of formation in the Phenomenology of Spirit. (This list of Hegel’s debts to Herder is by no means exhaustive.)

In short, besides the many other important ways in which Herder exercised a profound influence on his successors, he in particular did so by making possible, and setting the core agendas for, both of the main philosophical movements that emerged in Germany in the next generation: German Romanticism and post-Kantian German Idealism.

Why did Herder receive so little public credit for these enormous achievements? Largely because by the turn of the nineteenth century this uncompromisingly independent-minded critical spirit had managed to alienate both of the main intellectual power bases in Germany: Kant, Fichte, and their followers (through his ascerbic public criticism of their philosophical ideas) and Goethe, Schiller, and their admirers (through his criticism of their values and their poetry). So after that no one had much professional interest in giving Herder public credit for his achievements any more, rather very much the contrary—despite the fact that he so richly deserved it.

Copyright © 2017 by
Michael Forster <>

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