William Heytesbury (c. 1313–1372/3), a member of Oxford’s Merton College and the School of “Oxford Calculators”, was most likely a student of Richard Kilvington, who was a younger contemporary of John Dumbleton. Heytesbury developed the works of Thomas Bradwardine and Richard Kilvington, and he was also influenced by Walter Burley, William Ockham, and Roger Swyneshed (or Swineshead). He authored a popular textbook Regulae solvendi sophismata and several other collections of sophisms. He linked interests in logic, mathematics, and physics. He formulated the Middle Degree Theorem (also known as the Mean Speed Theorem) offering a proper rule for uniformly accelerated motion, later developed by Galileo. His works anticipated nineteenth-century mathematical analyses of the continuum. He influenced logic in Britain and Italy (where several late fourteenth and early fifteenth-century editions of his texts were printed) and his influence lasted until the sixteenth century, when the debates he participated in declined.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Logic
- 3. Speculative Physics
- 4. Influence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Works
William Heytesbury was most likely born before 1313 in Wiltshire (Salisbury Diocese). He is first mentioned as a fellow at Merton College in Oxford in 1330; he is thus among the second generation of Oxford Calculators (a follower of Thomas Bradwardine and Richard Kilvington, a contemporary of John Dumbleton and Roger Swyneshed, and a predecessor of Richard Swineshead). He held the administrative position of a bursar of Merton in 1338–1339, responsible for determining dues, auditing accounts, and collecting revenues. By 1340 he had completed his regency in arts at Merton and, together with John Dumbleton, was named a foundation fellow at the new Queen’s College in 1340, but was soon mentioned among the fellows of Merton College again. He is recorded as having become a Doctor of Theology in 1348, yet none of his theological works are known. He was chancellor of the University in 1371–72 (and perhaps also in 1353–54) and died shortly thereafter, between December 1372 and January 1373.
Heytesbury’s extant writings, which are currently agreed to have originated in 1330s, typically develop a certain logical or physical theory through analysing sophisms. For most of these texts, there is a modern (in some cases critical) edition, some are available in incunabular editions and early prints, and several modern translations are available. There is a spectrum of works based on how certain their authenticity is in the present state of research. These break down to three categories, such that shifts between them in the future are possible (albeit unlikely in some cases):
Works agreed to be authentic:
- Regulae solvendi sophismata [RSS] or Logica
- Sophismata [Soph]
- Sophismata asinina [SophAs]
- Iuxta hunc textum [IHT] or Consequentiae Heytesbury
- De sensu composito et diviso [SCD]
Regulae solvendi sophismata [RSS] or Logica (a collection of six treatises: on paradoxes, on knowing and doubting, on relative terms, on beginning and ceasing, on maxima and minima, and on the speed of motions) is concerned with instructions for solving different types of sophisms in the first year of logical studies. In a way, [RSS] is a paradigm of authenticity for Heytesbury’s works (mutual coherence being used as the criterion of authenticity). Sophismata [Soph] is a collection of sophisms for advanced students working on natural philosophy. Sophismata asinina [SophAs] is a collection of sophistical proofs that the reader is a donkey. Iuxta hunc textum [IHT], also known as Consequentiae Heytesbury, is a collection of sophisms designed for testing formal inference rules. De sensu composito et diviso [SCD] is a manual on the logical analysis of the de re/de dicto ambiguity.
Works of uncertain authenticity:
- Probationes conclusionum
- Casus obligationis [CO]
- De propositionibus multiplicibus or De propositionum multiplicium significatione
- Termini naturales
Probationes conclusionum follows [RSS] and analyses sophisms of various kinds. Casus obligationis [CO] is a collection of epistemic sophisms, related to the second chapter of [RSS]. De propositionibus multiplicibus is a short treatise on the analysis and inferential roles of various kinds of sentences. Termini naturales is a vocabulary of elementary physics, very popular in the late-medieval period.
Works which have been erroneously attributed to Heytesbury in the past:
- De veritate et falsitate propositionis (authored by Henry Hopton)
De veritate et falsitate propositionis is a treatise on sentential semantics motivated by the analysis of the sophism “Every sentence is true or false”.
Since most of Heytesbury’s logical views are spelled out either in the context or in terms of obligationes, a brief note on these must be the starting point of their presentation. The most important passages are in [SCD] and [Soph] and to a certain degree in [RSS]. Three problems will be introduced: 1) the basic concepts, and in particular, relevance; 2) the distinction between metaphysical and epistemic possibility; and 3) the distinction between conceding a sentence and conceding that a sentence is true.
Heytesbury’s obligationes are zero-sum and dynamic consistency games participated in by two players, an “opponent” and a “respondent”. The opponent posits a “casus” (ponitur casus), i.e., the initial linguistic and extra-linguistic assumptions, and proposes particular sentences. The respondent admits or denies the casus (admittitur, negatur casus) depending on its consistency and concedes (concedo), negates (nego), or doubts (dubito) the proposed sentences, the criteria being logical relations to either the casus or to the totality of preceding moves (including the casus). Heytesbury chooses the latter option, thus subscribing to so-called “antiqua responsio” (Read 2013: 20–23). The respondent wins if he maintains consistency.
Sentences proposed to the respondent split into “relevant” or “irrelevant” depending on their logical relation to preceding moves. If the sentence proposed to the respondent or its negation follows from preceding moves, it is relevant (pertinens) and should be either conceded (if implied by these moves) or negated (if it is incompatible with them); otherwise, it is irrelevant (impertinens). An irrelevant sentence is either conceded, negated, or doubted depending on the respondent’s knowledge about the “external” world; it is conceded if known to be actually true, negated if known to be actually false and doubted otherwise. Such a game is dynamic in the sense that the status of irrelevant sentences can change in the course of the game ([SCD] 1494: fol. 4ra–rb [1988a: 432–433]). This can happen for two reasons. First, if the external world changes during the game, the respondent’s move would change along with his new information state since the respondent’s moves regarding irrelevant sentences depend on his knowledge of the external world ([SCD] 1494: fol. 4rb [1988a: 433]). The second (and more interesting) case is brought about by the course of a particular game. Heytesbury’s example is the following game:
|Opponent’s moves||Respondent’s moves||Justification|
|[O1] POSITIO: The king is seated or you are in Rome.||[R1] I admit the casus.||The casus is possible.|
|[O2] PROPONITUR: The king is seated.||[R2] I doubt that.||Irrelevant and not known to be true or false in the external world.|
|[O3] PROPONITUR: You are in Rome.||[R3] I negate that.||Irrelevant and known to be false.|
|[O4] PROPONITUR: The king is seated.||[R4] I concede that.||Relevant and implied by [R1] and [R3].|
[R2] and [R4] are correct moves because [R1] and [R3] are. When “the king is seated” is proposed in [O2], it can only be relevant with respect to [R1], which is not the case as disjunctions do not entail their sub-formulas. If the respondent is unaware of the king’s whereabouts, the sentence must be doubted. “You are in Rome” proposed in [O3] is also irrelevant, but can be negated as known to be false in the external world. At that point, “the king is seated” becomes relevant and must be conceded as implied by “the king is seated or you are in Rome” and the negation of “you are in Rome” via disjunctive syllogism ([SCD] 1494: fol. 4rb [1988a: 433–434]).
Heytesbury considers three types of casus: a) possible; b) impossible but imaginable; and c) impossible and unimaginable ([Soph] soph. 18 and 31 [1494: fols. 131va–vb and 162va–vb]). The criteria of possibility, which probably pertain to metaphysics, are not spelled out clearly. The criteria of imaginability are logical and epistemological:
Briefly, every casus which is not explicitly inconsistent or impossible in a way not easily imaginable (such as a man being a donkey etc.) can be admitted for the sake of disputation. But first, the respondent has to make the impossibility of such casus explicit and emphasize that he has not admitted the casus as possible but merely as imaginable, to defend its implications (as imaginable, not as possible) and to negate what is incompatible with it in accord with his obligation. ([Soph] soph. 31 [1494: fol. 162va–vb])
The realm of the imaginable includes whatever is epistemically admissible for either logical or epistemic reasons. Neither is purely objective: what can and cannot be imagined seems player-relative, as is being “explicitly” inconsistent (for seeing or overlooking a contradiction is a matter of individual skill). Examples of the imaginable include the existence of a vacuum, infinite velocities, expansions of physical objects, and men being immortal, but not men being donkeys. The criteria may be practical: certain hypotheses are not productive. Since the respondent’s goal is to maintain consistency, accepting overtly inconsistent assumptions is a nonstarter, and certain impossibilities are such that nobody would agree to defend them even for the sake of argument. Defining admissibility in terms of imaginability makes obligationes into a framework for discussing “impossibilities” with applications in physics as a science based on conceptual analysis and thought-experiments, where the “secundum imaginationem” assumptions play the same role as the modern day idealizations such as mass points or frictionless movement.
A principle utilized in Heytesbury’s solution to various paradoxes states that a proposed sentence is evaluated according to its standard meaning, even if it is assumed to signify something else in the casus. For instance, the following moves of the respondent would be correct:
|Opponent’s moves||Respondent’s moves||Justification|
|[O1] POSITIO: “All mice are grey” signifies that all cats are blue. All cats are white.||[R1] I concede the casus.||The casus is possible.|
|[O2] PROPONITUR: All mice are grey.||[R2] I concede that.||Irrelevant and known to be true in the external world.|
|[O3] PROPONITUR: The sentence “all mice are grey” is true.||[R3] I negate that.||Relevant and inconsistent with the casus.|
By [R2], the respondent agrees that all mice are grey, while by [R3] he denies that all cats are blue. To concede a sentence is to agree that what the sentence signifies according to its standard meaning is the case, but to concede that a certain sentence is true is to agree that what the sentence signifies in the casus is the case. These may or may not be the same depending on the casus. ([SophAs] 412)
2.2 Proprietates terminorum
The genre of “proprietates terminorum” developed in the twelfth century alongside the reception of Aristotle’s Sophistical refutations, and the logico-semantical analysis of fallacies seems to have been one of its primary applications. It is an umbrella genre for, among others, theories of meaning and reference, the use-mention distinction, quantification, and tense. These are utilized in several of Heytesbury’s works with terminological variations. Three of these issues will be presented here: the theories of “suppositio”, “mobilitatio”, and “ampliatio”.
Supposition is a semantic relation between terms and the object(s) they stand for in a sentential context. The modes of supposition are connected to the way sentences can be analyzed (expositio), in particular, to the way general terms can be replaced by a structured collection of subordinate terms, the so-called “descensus”. The following classifications of suppositions can be reconstructed from Heytesbury’s writings:
- (1) material supposition (s. materialis)
- (2) personal supposition (s. personalis)
- (2.1) discrete supposition (s. discreta)
- (2.2) common supposition (s. communis)
- (2.21) determinate supposition (s. determinata)
- (2.22) confused supposition (s. confusa)
- (2.221) merely confused or non-distributive supposition (s. confusa tantum, confusa non distributiva)
- (2.222) confused and distributive supposition (s. confusa distributiva)
Material supposition (“only you are a donkey” in “only you are a donkey is false”) consists in mentioning an expression ([SophAs] 403), whereas personal (or significative) supposition consists in using it ([SophAs] 404). Discrete supposition is a personal supposition of a singular term ([SophAs] 390); its complement is usually called “common” supposition and is further divided into determinate and confused suppositions. Determinate supposition is exemplified by the supposition of “human” in “some human is an animal” ([SCD] 1494: fol. 3va [1988a: 427]), connected to the descensus, whereby it can be paraphrased as “this human is an animal or that human is an animal etc.” ([SophAs] 387). Merely confused or non-distributive supposition is exemplified by the supposition of “animal” in “every human is an animal” and connected to “disjunctive” descensus ([SCD] 1494, fol. 2va–vb [1988a: 420–421]; [Soph] soph. 7 [1494: fol. 106rb] and soph. 16 (1494: fol. 127vb)), whereby it can be paraphrased as “every man is this animal or that animal etc.” Confused and distributive suppositions are most typically exemplified by the supposition of “human” in “every human is an animal”, connecting the descensus to every instance of the common term, whereby it can be paraphrased as “this human is an animal and that human is an animal etc.” ([SCD] 1494: fol. 2va–vb [1988a: 420–421]; [Soph] soph. 7 [1494: fol. 106rb] and soph. 16 [1494: fol. 127vb]).
The theory of suppositio is extended by the theory of “mobility” and “immobility”. If a particular mode of descensus is admissible, that type of supposition is called “mobile” (mobilis); otherwise it is called “immobile” (immobilis). Heytesbury’s example of immobile supposition is the function of “penny” in “I promise you a penny” or “human” in “by necessity, every man is an animal” ([PC] 1494: fol. 188vb; [IHT] arg. 19; [SophAs] 398).
Three points should be noted here. First, the so-called “simple” (“human” in “human is a species”) supposition is omitted. Second, Heytesbury’s analysis of predicates in terms of the merely confused supposition is nominalist, as opposed to the realist analysis of these examples in terms of standing for an abstract object. Third, Heytesbury endorses the Aristotelian sensus compositus-sensus divisus distinction, rather than the terminist framework in cases where that would be appropriate.
Lastly, Heytesbury introduces the so-called “ampliatio”, which consists in extending the range of a term to non-actual entities, such as entities in the past, future, or mere possibilia. Thus, for instance, the proper paraphrase of the sentence “a white thing can be black” is “something that now is white or can be white can be black” ([SCD] 1494: fol. 2va [1988a: 418]). The complementary property is called “restrictio” ([Soph] soph. 4 [1494: fol. 89vb]).
2.3 Deductive Validity
The basic textual evidence for Heytesbury’s theory of deductive validity includes [IHT], [Soph] and [RSS].
[IHT] is a collection of arguments for both the validity and invalidity of spurious inferences. Typically, the pro-arguments construe them as instances of formal inference rules (bona et formalis), the contra-arguments argue that they are not valid (non valet), and the resolutions show that the inference under scrutiny is not a genuine instance of such a rule. This method presupposes that deductive validity is ultimately truth-preservation (an inference is valid if its consequent cannot be false while its antecedent is true or if its antecedent is incompatible with the negation of the consequent) ([IHT] arg. 6). The criterion is that it is not possible to present a counterexample, i.e., a possible (obligational) situation (casu possibili posito) verifying the antecedent and falsifying the consequent ([IHT] arg. 2). The method also presupposes that the underlying inference rules are assumed to be legitimate but misapplied in such sophisms as to require elucidation, and not revision. The treatise is mostly concerned with the analysis of logical form (expositio) of sentences containing operators (officialia) such as “only”, “nothing but”, “begins”, “ceases”, etc., with a few applications of modal and epistemic logic.
[IHT] introduces the distinction between the “universal” (bona et formalis generaliter) and “restricted” (bona et formalis specialiter) formal validity:
An inference is formally valid in the universal sense if the opposite of its consequent is formally incompatible with its antecedent and a similar form [of argument] holds in all applications (consimilis forma valet in omni materia) (…) An inference is [formally] valid in the restricted sense if the opposite of its consequent is formally incompatible with its antecedent, but not every such application is valid. ([IHT] arg. 11)
The concept of formal compatibility is not explicitly introduced in this context.
[Soph] relates the relevance view of formality as a conceptual connection between premises and conclusions to the substitutional view of formality as validity under any substitution of extra-logical terms or in any domain of application (in omni materia). If an inference is valid only in a restricted domain of application, it is valid based on content or in a particular domain of application (de materia, gratia materiae) or “simply valid” (bona simpliciter) ([IHT] arg. 11; [Soph] soph. 3 [1494: fol. 86ra]). The concept of formal incompatibility is clarified as part of the explication of validity based upon the form (de forma):
It is commonly agreed that such an inference is not valid based upon the form, because the opposite of its consequent and its antecedent do not formally imply a contradiction, where “to imply a contradiction formally” means that these two cannot be distinguished or consistently and distinctively imagined as holding simultaneously. ([Soph] soph. 2 [1494: fol. 83rb])
As opposed to testing simple validity against possible counter-models, formal validity is tested against impossible but imaginable counter-models to eliminate extra-linguistic influences. Imaginable casus introduced in obligationes are thereby utilized as part of general logic.
Finally, a “necessary” inference is one which can be reduced to a categorical or hypothetical syllogism via a necessary auxiliary assumption or “middle” (per medium necessarium) ([Soph] soph. 2 [1494: fol. 83rb]). Similarly, two sentences are assumed to be logically equivalent (convertantur) if they imply each other formally via a necessary middle ([RSS] 1494: fol. 15rb–va [1988b: 461–462]). This represents the view of validity as reducibility to paradigmatically valid syllogisms.
In general, Heytesbury introduces three levels of validity. First, validity as relevance secured by logical form in every domain of application, explicated as truth-preservation of all inferences sharing the same logical form (forma or modus arguendi) with respect to every imaginable world. Second, validity as relevance secured by conceptual content with a restricted domain of application, explicated as truth-preservation with respect to all imaginable worlds, which is not substitution-invariant. Third, validity as simple truth-preservation with respect to all possible worlds. Heytesbury’s parallel use of different concepts of formality makes him a representative of British logic in the transitional period, containing different stages of development: the substitutional view (validity preserved in all substitution-instances) typical for the “Continental tradition”, the relevance view (conceptual connection) typical for the “British tradition” and later Paul of Venice and Paul of Pergula, and formality as reducibility to a syllogism typical for the early fourteenth-century tradition.
2.4 Logic of Epistemic Statements
Heytesbury’s analysis of epistemic statements encompasses the logical analysis of epistemic statements, inference rules for sentences containing epistemic operators, and rules for obligational games with epistemic statements, most of which are applied to solutions to sophisms and instructions for obligational games. The underlying principles pertaining to the logical analysis of language and inference rules for epistemic statements will be addressed below.
2.4.1 De re/de dicto Ambiguity and Epistemic Statements
Let us consider the following two sentences:
- Socrates I know to be running in Beaumont.
- I know that Socrates is running in Beaumont.
(dr), called “sensus divisus” by Heytesbury, denotes that there is a person (who happens to be Socrates) of whom I correctly know that he is running in Beaumont, but about whom I may or may not know that he is Socrates; his kinematics, but not his identity, is part of my belief. On the other hand, according to (dd), called “sensus compositus” by Heytesbury, I know that it is Socrates who is running in Beaumont. Hence if I believed that Socrates died years ago, (dr) could be true but (dd) would be false ([SCD] 1494: fol. 3va [1988a: 427] and [RSS] 1494, fol. 13rb and [1988b: 444]). By strictly endorsing the Aristotelian framework and analyzing epistemic contexts in terms of the de re/de dicto ambiguity, Heytesbury does not participate in the fourteenth-century developments in the logical analysis of language. Also, his criteria for distinguishing between the two readings are purely syntactic, whereby scholastic Latin is viewed as an artificial language with strict formation rules.
2.4.2 Inference Rules
Heytesbury’s remarks on the “common interpretation of knowledge” emphasize that a firm and unhesitant belief does not constitute knowledge unless it is veridical, which results in the formulation “to know is nothing other than unhesitatingly to apprehend the truth—i.e., to believe unhesitatingly that it is so when it is so in reality” ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 447]). This implies the veracity of knowledge:
- if ξ knows that X, then X is the case.
The introspection axioms govern iterated epistemic modalities (Boh 1984 and 1985, Hanke 2018a). While denying the possibility of doubting one’s own knowledge, Heytesbury proposes what is an equivalent to positive introspection:
- if the agent ξ perceives that X and ξ is considering whether ξ perceives that X, then ξ perceives that he perceives that X.
As perception is in this context replaceable with knowledge, the principle is equivalent to its modern counterpart, save the emphasis on active consideration of the problem (i.e., attention), which appears to correct the principle for the limitations of human agents. The principles for both first and second-order knowledge are based on the same evidence ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 447–448]). Heytesbury also holds the contraposition of (4) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 448]).
In the context of (T), Heytesbury discusses the casus where an agent sees a person who looks exactly like a king, but is not one. The agent can believe the man to be a king beyond any doubt and even believe himself to know that. But, by (T), he knows neither that the man is a king (because that is not true), nor that the man is not a king (because he does not believe that) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 447]). Even though Heytesbury does not explicitly say so, it seems natural to assume that this agent does not know that he failed to know that man is a king. Hence, he fails to know something, but also, presumably, fails to know that he fails to know it, which is a counterexample to negative introspection. Accepting the positive introspection while denying the negative introspection is based on Heytesbury’s interpretation of knowledge as an evidence-based act of considering something and apprehending its factuality: the absence of knowledge alone does not constitute conscious ignorance.Heytesbury’s account of the closure properties of knowledge encompasses the closure of meaning under entailment, the distribution of knowledge over implication, and the distribution of knowledge over signification.
First, Heytesbury introduces the concept of implied meaning (significare ex consequenti) and believes that sentential meaning is closed under entailment. As he explains the different senses of “signifying precisely” (significare precise), he claims that a sentence cannot signify something precisely in the sense of not signifying anything else. Instead, “to signify precisely” means that a sentence has a “primary meaning” (“significat primo et principaliter” or “significatio primaria et adequata”) plus whatever its primary meaning entails (quod sequitur ipsam significantem quod ita sit), but nothing else ([RSS] 1494: fol. 15ra–rb [1988b: 459–460]). To allow that, Heytesbury’s semantics must validate some version of the Bradwardinian sentential semantics.
Second, in the possibly inauthentic [CO], outright logical omniscience, i.e., the closure of knowledge under implication, is denied:
- If X implies Y and ξ knows that X, then ξ knows that Y,
but the distribution of knowledge over implication, i.e., that knowledge is closed under known inferences (the “axiom K”), is accepted:
- If ξ knows that X implies Y, and ξ knows that X, then ξ knows that Y.
Third, if an agent knows that it is completely the case as a sentence signifies, does he know that everything it signifies is the case? The problem of conceding a sentence whose meaning is deductively closed by an agent with a finite cognitive capacity is solved by introducing a distinction parallel to (K) and (O) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 15rb [1988b: 460]); Heytesbury denies:
- If ξ knows that however x signifies is the case, and x signifies that X, then ξ knows that X,
- If ξ knows that however x signifies is the case, and ξ knows that x signifies that X, then ξ knows that X.
Together with “strong” semantic closure, Heytesbury’s analysis of epistemic operators validates the weaker distribution principles and rejects the stronger closure principles, i.e., different forms of logical omniscience.
Heytesbury analyzes insolubilia or self-referential paradoxes most thoroughly in the first chapter of [RSS], where he dismisses three alternative solutions to paradoxes to settle for the fourth. The first three positions agree that paradoxical sentences can have precisely their standard meaning. According to the first position held by Roger Swyneshed, paradoxical sentences are false because they imply their own falsity, and a sentence and its negation can be false at the same time if one of them is paradoxical ([RSS] 1494: fol. 4va and 6rb [1979: 18–19 and 45]). According to the second position, paradoxical sentences do not make genuine statements, hence are neither true nor false ([RSS] 1494: fols. 4va–vb [1979: 19]). That is reminiscent of the so-called “cassantes” who claim that paradoxical sentences fail to make a true or false statement (literally “say nothing”) (de Rijk 1966), available, for instance, through Burley or Bradwardine (Roure 1970; Bradwardine B-I). Heytesbury also could have viewed the second position as the interpretation of Bradwardine’s “mediantes”, who claims that paradoxical sentences are neither true nor false, but of a “middle value”. According to the third position, paradoxical sentences are either-true-or-false but neither true nor false; they make genuine statements, but fail to have a standard truth-value ([RSS] 1494: fol. 4vb [1979: 19–20]).
According to the fourth position, paradoxical sentences have their standard meaning, but say more than what their overt meanings indicate. It is based on the definitions of a paradoxical casus and a paradoxical sentence. There are two versions of these definitions, differing in the last clause:
A paradoxical casus is one in which mention is made of some sentence such that if in the same casus that sentence signifies precisely as its words commonly pretend, from its being true follows that it is false, and vice versa. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6rb [1979: 47])
…it follows that it is true and also false. (Pozzi 1987: 236)
A paradoxical sentence is one of which mention is made in a paradoxical casus, such that if in the same casus it signifies precisely as its words commonly pretend, then from its being true follows that it is false, and vice versa. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6rb [1979: 47])
…it follows that it is true and also false. (Pozzi 1987: 236)
The solution to paradoxes is exemplified by the casus, where Socrates only pronounces the sentence “Socrates is saying something false”, henceforth labelled (s). Five elementary settings differ in assumptions concerning its meaning:
- (1) the meaning of (s) is not posited
- (2) the meaning of (s) is posited, such that:
- (2.1) (s) has precisely its standard meaning
- (2.2) (s) has its standard meaning, but not precisely its standard meaning, and the additional meaning is not certified
- (2.3) (s) has its standard meaning and its additional meaning is
certified, such that:
- (2.31) (s) has a logical form of a conjunction
- (2.32) (s) has a logical form of a disjunction
For Heytesbury, “to solve a paradox” is to instruct the respondent in the corresponding obligatio-game. His instructions are as follows:
- If someone constructs a paradoxical casus, either he posits how that paradoxical sentence should signify or not. If not, then: when the paradoxical sentence is proposed, one should respond to it exactly as one would respond when the casus is not assumed. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 47])
The corresponding moves are:
|Opponent’s moves||Respondent’s moves||Justification|
|[O1] POSITIO: Socrates only pronounces (s).||[R1] I admit the casus.||The casus is possible.|
|[O2] PROPONITUR: (s) is false.||[R2] ???||Irrelevant and ???|
Heytesbury applies his view of obligationes: in the absence of any other assumptions, (s) is initially irrelevant. As such, if proposed as the first sentence in the game, the respondent’s move cannot be affected by either the casus or the previous moves, but must follow the respondent’s knowledge about the external world. Heytesbury’s emphasis on the stage of the game suggests that this can change due to the dynamic character of obligationes.
- If a paradoxical casus is posited and together with that it is assumed that the paradoxical sentence precisely signifies as its terms commonly pretend, the casus may in no way be admitted. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 48])
The corresponding moves are:
|Opponent’s moves||Respondent’s moves||Justification|
|[O1] POSITIO: Socrates only pronounces (s) and (s) signifies precisely that (s) is false||[R1] I do not admit the casus.||The casus is inconsistent.|
Since obligationes are consistency-maintenance games, the only non-losing strategy for a respondent is not to start such a game, for otherwise he would be dragged into inconsistency via the well-known paradoxical reasoning.
- If someone constructs a paradoxical casus and if it is also assumed that the paradoxical sentence signifies as its terms pretend (but not precisely so), then when this casus is admitted, the insoluble sentence has to be conceded as implied at whatever stage of the game it is proposed, but that it is true has to be denied as incompatible. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 49])
The corresponding moves are:
|Opponent’s moves||Respondent’s moves||Justification|
|[O1] POSITIO: Socrates only pronounces (s) and (s) signifies that (s) is false||[R1] I admit the casus.||The casus is consistent.|
|[O2] PROPONITUR: (s) is false.||[R2] I concede that.||Implied by the casus.|
|[O3] PROPONITUR: “(s) is false” is true.||[R3] I deny that.||Incompatible with the casus.|
The justification of [R2] is not clearly explained in [RSS]. A minimalist interpretation is that the proposed sentence is implied by [R1] via reductio: If (s) is false, then it is false (trivially); if (s) is not false, it is true, and then it is the case as it signifies, hence it is false. Either way, it is false, hence it is false. An obligational explanation is that (s) is regarded as relevant in this casus, and as such can only be conceded or denied. Since its denial implies an inconsistency, such a move must be avoided in a consistency-maintenance game; therefore it should be conceded. Since the casus has been admitted as consistent, it cannot validate an inconsistent move; hence, it must validate its opposite. By the same reasoning, it is possible to deny that (s) is true. Furthermore, Heytesbury refuses to certify the additional meaning of (s) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 49–50]). Unsatisfactory as this may seem, it is legitimate from the point of view of obligationes: meaning certification is not a move available to the respondent, and since the instructions are respondent-oriented, the actual meaning of (s) is an external problem.
(2.31) and (2.32) are dealt with along the same lines.
For Heytesbury, paradoxes are obligational games with self-referential sentences. However, his criticism of alternative solutions is part of the fourteenth-century developments relating paradoxes to general logico-semantical issues. He views his approach as relatively defensible and probable, but admits that he cannot solve all objections and considers a completely satisfactory solution to paradoxes impossible (unfortunately without a justification). Without too much self-confidence, he closes his treatise by saying that young students should move past the topic and do something useful. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 4vb and 7rb [1979: 21 and 58])
3. Speculative Physics
Heytesbury’s RSS may be taken as representative of Oxford Calculators’ speculative/mathematical physics. It links interests in logic, mathematics, and physics. As Curtis Wilson says: “Heytesbury employs the concept of “limit” and “infinite aggregate” with considerable precision and subtlety; and in treating of variable physics quantities, he approaches the ideal of a purely mathematical description” (Wilson 1960: 3). Not only does Heytesbury analyze physical and mathematical problems by means of the techniques of the logica moderna, but he also employs physical and mathematical rules in the analyses of logical or semantic problems of denomination. Heytesbury is mostly interested in the problem of determining under what conditions a subject can be denominated such-and-such, e.g., “white” or “running”. The issue of denomination arises because the attributes of subjects vary in degrees of intensity or completeness. He establishes sets of rules of everyday speech, determining how we denominate a subject under all imaginable circumstances of change. For example, in the sophism Omnis homo qui est albus currit, he concludes that a man is called to be “white” if and only if the external surface of the upper half of him is white (in everyday speech, a man is white if the skin on his face is white) (Wilson 1960: 22–23).
Like one of the founders of the School of Oxford Calculators—Richard Kilvington– Heytesbury takes Ockham’s nominalist position and affirms that the real physical world consists only of res absolutae, i.e., substances and qualities. They both acknowledge that terms such as “point”, “line”, “latitude”, and “degree” do not have any representation in reality, but are useful for describing different types of change. They also hold that time is not real since time is not distinguished realiter from the motion of celestial spheres, and motion is not distinguished realiter from the body which moves. Thus, they both contrast things that are really distinct with things distinguishable only in reason, i.e., in the imagination. Heytesbury follows Kilvington’s frequent use of the phrase secundum imaginationem to describe hypothetical situations in which the elements of the description, and not the situation itself, are of primary concern. The only requirement for an imaginable case is that it should not involve a formal logical contradiction; whether it is physically possible or not is a matter of indifference. As Wilson says,
a distinction is drawn between realiter or naturaliter or physice loquendo and logice or sophistice loquendo: physice we follow experience and the principles laid down in the natural philosophy of Aristotle; logice or sophistice we are free to introduce whatever distinctions and cases are convenient and imaginable. (Wilson 1960: 25)
Heytesbury, however, remains in the framework of Aristotelian philosophy of nature, and the problems he discusses are to be found in Aristotle’s Physica and De caelo. Nevertheless, Heytesbury is captivated by the mathematical approach es the earlier Oxford Calculators. Like Thomas Bradwardine and Richard Kilvington, he examines physical problems using mathematical apparatus. In Chapters 4–6 of the Regulae, Heytesbury develops measurement by limit, i.e., by the first and last instants of beginning and ending, and by the intrinsic and extrinsic limits of passive and active capacities. Although these types of “measuring” do not appear to be straightforwardly mathematical, they provide the basis for mathematical considerations and give excellent results in analyses of the instantaneous motion, as well as continua. As Wilson states:
Heytesbury admits “according to the common mode of speech” that everything which is, whether time or motion or instant, is in an instant, in the sense that it is instantaneously measured by an instant […] the instant in time and the instantaneous position in movement are always to be regarded as “limits”. (Wilson 1960: 41)
The second type of measurement employs a new calculus of compounding ratios. The third type of measurement, by latitude of forms, describes motion, in which an accidental form, such as speed, is intensified or diminished. Heytesbury focuses on establishing the rules for the “measurement” of speed in every type of the continuous changes enumerated by Aristotle, i.e., in local motion, in augmentation, and in alteration.
3.1 Beginning and Ceasing
In chapter IV of the Regulae (De incipit et desinit) Heytesbury poses and analyzes in great detail cases in which any process, thing, or state may be said to begin or cease to be. He begins with possible expositions of the terms “beginning” (incipere) and “ceasing” (desinere) in a way that uncovers certain paradoxical properties of the temporal continuum. “Beginning” may be expounded by positio of the present (i.e., by the positing of existence in the present instant) and remotio of the past (i.e., by denial of existence in the past), meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is, and immediately prior to the present instant it was not. “Beginning” may be also expounded by remotio of the present and positio of the future, meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is not, and immediately after the present instant it will be. Likewise, “ceasing” may be expounded in two ways, either by remotio of the present and positio of the past, meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is not, and immediately prior to the present instant it was, or by positio of the present and remotio of the future, meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is, and immediately after the present instant it will not be. Heytesbury offers a number of sophisms involving the limit-decision. One of them is particularly interesting since it clearly exhibits Heytesbury’s remarkable skill in solving problems of instantaneous motion and time without the symbolic techniques of calculus. Heytesbury poses a case in which both Plato and Socrates begin to move from rest at the same instant, but Plato starts to move with a constant acceleration and Socrates with an acceleration which starts at zero degree and increases uniformly with time. He concludes that “both Socrates and Plato infinitely slowly begin to be moved, and yet Socrates infinitely more slowly begins to be moved than Plato” (Wilson 1960: 54, [RSS] 1494: fol. 26vb). As Wilson proves, the conclusion is an effect of comparison of two infinitesimals of different order.
In the case under consideration both the velocity of Plato (\(v_p\)) and the velocity of Socrates (\(v_s\)) are infinitesimal for time t approaching zero. Two infinitesimals are said to be of different order if the limit of their quotient is either zero or infinite. In the case under consideration the limit of the quotient \(v_p/v_s\) as \(t\rightarrow 0\) is infinite. (Wilson 1960: 55)
3.2 Maxima and Minima
In chapter V of the Regulae, Heytesbury considers the limits of capacities, and he applies the limit-concept to the bounding of the ranges of variables and aggregates. All capacities are sorted as active or passive. An active capacity (force) is measured against the passive capacity (resistance) which it can overcome. If an active capacity can overcome some resistance, it can overcome less. For example, if Socrates can lift one hundred pounds, he can lift fifty pounds. Conversely, if a passive capacity can be affected by less, it can be affected by greater. For example, if Socrates can see a grain of millet from the distance of a mile, he will be able to see the Church at the same distance. The boundaries of capacities are of two kinds: an intrinsic boundary (when an element is a member of the sequence of elements it bounds: maximum quod sic, minimum quod sic) and an extrinsic boundary (when an element which serves as a boundary stands outside the range of elements which it bounds: maximum quod non, minimum quod non). From the definitions of active and passive capacities, it follows that the boundary of an active capacity must be assigned either by the affirmation of the maximum (maximum quod sic) or by the negation of the minimum (minimum quod non); the boundary of a passive capacity is assigned either by the affirmation of the minimum (minimum quod sic) or by the negation of the maximum (maximum quod non).
Heytesbury sets the following conditions which must be obtained for limits to exist: (1) there must be a range in which the capacity can act or be acted upon, and another range in which it cannot act or be acted upon, and not both; (2) each capacity should only be able to take a value in the range on which it is measured from zero and the value which serves as its boundary. Thus, if an active capacity is capable of acting upon a given passive capacity in the range, it must be capable of acting upon any less, and if it is not capable of acting upon a given passive capacity, it is not capable of acting upon any greater. Conversely, if a passive capacity is capable of being acted upon by a certain agent, it must be capable of being acted upon by any agent of greater strength, and if it is not capable of being acted upon by a certain agent, it is not capable of being acted upon by a weaker agent; and (3) infinite capacities like the infinite power of God are excluded from the discussion, since no termination can be assigned for them ([RSS] 1494: fol. 29va–vb).
Heytesbury, like Kilvington, classifies all capacities as mutable or immutable. A mutable capacity is capable of more and less, and both affirmative and negative parts of the division might be assigned. For example, with respect to Socrates, a mutable power of lifting (an active capacity) a minimum quod non is assigned. For a passive capacity the maximum quod non is assigned, e.g., a maximum visible body which cannot be seen at a given distance. An immutable capacity acts in a determinate way, so it produces only the one effect it actually produces. Therefore, the affirmative part of the division is always assigned as a boundary for immutable capacity. Thus, e.g., there is a maximum distance which, ceteris paribus, Socrates can traverse in an hour by a speed which increases uniformly from A to B degree ([RSS] 1494: fol. 29vb; Wilson 1960: 73).
3.3 Three Categories of Change
Chapter VI (De tribus praedicamentis) of the Regulae deals with motion in three categories: place, quantity, and quality. The first part (de motu locali) deals with the speed or slowness of uniformly or difformly accelerated and decelerated motion considered in its kinematical aspect. The second part (de velocitate motus augmentationis) deals with augmentation understood as pure increase in size, and more specifically with the speed of rarefaction as measured by the effect produced, i.e., by space traversed in time. The third part (de velocitate motus alterationis) is concentrated on mathematical description of variation of intensity in space and time. The prime purpose to be achieved in this chapter is to establish definitions of speed in the three categories of motion. All debated cases are posed secundum imaginationem.
3.3.1 Local Motion
According to Heytesbury’s own words: “local motion by nature precedes other kinds [of change] just as the first” (De motu locali [DML] 2020: § 2, 270). He focuses on the possible measure of the speed of these changes by the effect produced (i.e., the space traversed) during an equal length of time. Consequently, he is interested in the kinematic aspect of motion (DML 2020: § 63, 296). Local motions are grouped into two classes: uniform and difform. A uniform motion is motion in which equal spaces are traversed continually in equal parts of time . Difform motions can vary in infinite ways, both with respect to the magnitude or the subject moved, and with respect to time (DML 2020: §§ 3–5, 270). Difform motion with respect to the subject moved is motion in which different points of the body move with unequal speeds; for instance, a rolling wheel moves with difform motion since different points on the wheel vary in regard to distance from the axis of rotation (DML 2020: §§ 9–16, 271–273). Difform motion with respect to time is motion in which unequal spaces are traversed in equal times. Motion can also be difform with respect to both time and the subject moved (DML 2020: §§ 17–20, 273–274). Difform motions are subdivided into two classes: the uniformly difform (uniformiter difformis) motion and the difformly difform (difformiter difformis) motion (DML 2020: § 21, 275). Uniformly difform motion is motion in which the speed either increases or decreases uniformly, that is, a motion in which in any equal parts of time, equal latitudes of speed are either acquired or lost (DML 2020: § 22, 275). A difformly difform motion is motion in which a greater latitude of velocity is gained or lost in one part of time than in another equal to it (DML 2020: § 40, 284).
The most gripping example of uniformly difform motion is accelerated motion, like a motion of a body moving towards the Earth. Heytesbury gives a general rule, called the Middle Degree Theorem, by which we may calculate the distance traversed from the latitude of speed uniformly acquired. He makes use of this theorem with respect to both accelerated and decelerated motions. In his own formulation it reads as follows:
Certainly, every latitude [of speed] that is acquired or lost uniformly, whether commencing at a non-degree or at any degree, as long as it is limited to some finite degree, corresponds precisely to its own middle degree in such a way that a moving body that uniformly acquires or loses its speed in any given time traverses the distance perfectly equal to the one it would traverse during the same time when moving with [a speed corresponding to] this middle degree. (DML 2020: § 26, 276; see also Wilson 1960: 122–23)
According to this rule, the distance traversed by a uniformly accelerated body in a given time is equal to the distance which would be traversed in the same time in a uniform motion with its middle degree of speed (half of the sum of the initial and final speed). A number of conclusions follow from this theorem:
- Since the medium degree of uniformly acquired latitude of speed [in uniformly difform motion] which commences at no-degree and ends at some finite degree is precisely half the degree of that terminating the motion, it follows that a body which moves with a uniformly difform motion commencing at no-degree and terminating at some finite degree [of speed] traverses less than half [the distance] which would be traversed by a body moving uniformly during the same time with a speed equal to a given degree terminating the motion. (DML 2020: § 27, 272; see also Wilson 1960: 123)
- [Given that] the medium degree of uniformly difform latitude of speed which commences at some degree and ends at another is greater than half the degree terminating the latitude of its more intense extreme, it follows that a body which moves with uniformly difform motion commencing at some degree of speed and terminating at another traverses more than half the distance which would be traversed by a body moving uniformly during the same time with a speed equal to the most intense speed in the uniformly difform motion. (DML 2020: § 28, 272; see also Wilson 1960: 123)
- In a uniformly difform motion commencing with no-degree speed and ending with some finite degree, the distance traversed in the first half of the time is one third of that traversed in the second half. And conversely, in a motion in which the speed decreases uniformly from some degree to no-degree the distance traversed in the first half of the time is three times that traversed in the second half. (DML 2020: § 35, 276; see Wilson 1960: 124).
By the end of the chapter, Heytesbury states that an infinite number of sophisms can be made concerning speed in local motion, as well as the intension and remission of such speed (DML 2020: § 61, 294).
In the subsequent chapter dealing with qualitative changes, Heytesbury expresses the same concerns. He takes part in the debate over one of the most widely discussed problems in the fourteenth-century philosophy of nature focused on the possible “measure” of the intension and remission of forms. Like most of the Oxford Calculators, Heytesbury accepts Scotus’s and Ockham’s addition theory and assumes that the intension of form is the result of adding qualitative parts. As an Ockhamist, Heytesbury emphasizes that the term “motion” in alteration connotes nothing else than the degrees or latitude of quality that are successively acquired. A basic assumption is that qualitative intensity is a certain kind of linearly ordered and additive quantity. Thus, as in the case of local motion, Heytesbury divides the latitudes of motion of alteration into the latitude of motion of intension and the latitude of motion of remission; and the latitude of the latitude of motion into the latitude of the acquisition of the latitude of motion and the latitude of the loss of latitude of motion. In modern terminology, these latitudes correspond to latitudes of speed and of acceleration and deceleration, respectively. Since there is no limit to speeds of alteration nor to rates of acceleration or deceleration of that speed, those latitudes are all infinite.
Heytesbury presents three different ways of “measuring” the speed of alteration in which the intensity of a quality varies form one point to another, or from instant to instant of time, or from point to point of the moving body: (1) by the degree (gradus) induced (a subject is considered to be altered faster when a higher degree is induced); (2) by the latitude of form acquired in comparison to the size of the subject (the speed of alteration is proportionally greater in a larger body); and (3) by the latitude acquired in a given time, regardless of the size of the subject undergoing alteration. Heytesbury holds the third position and claims that as in the case of local motion, the speed of alteration is to be measured at the point of the body where the rate of change is most rapid, that is, where the maximum latitude of form is acquired ([RSS] 1494: fol. 51ra).
Heytesbury deals with augmentation as with pure increase in size, which is the same process as rarefaction; more precisely, he deals with the speed of rarefaction as measured by the effect produced. There are three ways of “measuring” the speed of augmentation acquired in time: (1) by the maximum quantity acquired; (2) by the latitude of rarity or rareness; and (3) by the ratio of new size to previous size ([RSS] 1494: fol. 60rb). He holds the third position, according to which the ratios correspond to different degrees of augmentation. Augmentation, like the two other motions, can be uniform or difform. An augmentation is uniform if in equal intervals of time, the body undergoing augmentation increases in size by the same ratio. While discussing the above mentioned positions, Heytesbury makes broad use of the new calculus of ratios invented by Kilvington and Bradwardine.
As a logician, Heytesbury strongly influenced logic in fourteenth and fifteenth-century Britain, and there is a notable fifteenth and early sixteenth-century reception in Italy where multiple editions of his commentaries on [RSS] and [SCD] were printed (Ashworth & Spade 1992; de Rijk 1975, 1977). Despite his dismissive attitude toward this genre, Heytesbury’s treatise is one of the most influential late medieval texts. These influences include the British logical tradition (see Pironet 2008), the Italian logical tradition, and John Mair’s circle, and the treatise is referred to even as late as 1688 (De Benedictis 1688: 580–590; for other influence, see Spade 1989: 273). Heytesbury’s catalogue of solutions to the paradoxes, where the positions are (correctly or not) attributed to fourteenth-century British logicians, is further developed and sometimes defended against Heytesbury’s harsh and sarcastic dismissal. (R2.2) is developed by extending the proof and supplemented by saying that paradoxical sentences (or all sentences, for that matter) signify their own truth. Furthermore, Heytesbury’s contribution to epistemic logic in the second chapter of [RSS] appears to have sparked further debate in the upcoming centuries, as documented by the fourteenth and fifteenth-century development of the British and Italian treatises de scire et dubitare which typically revolved around the sophisms formulated by Heytesbury and where Heytesbury’s position was among those which were discussed, sometimes with an explicit attribution to Heytesbury (Boh 1993 and Hanke 2018a and 2018b). As a philosopher, Heytesbury significantly influenced later Oxford Calculators: John Dumbleton, anonymous author of the Tractatus de sex inconvenientibus, Richard Swineshead, author of one of the most famous treatises Liber Calculationum, and continental fourteenth and fifteenth-century philosophers, e.g., John Casali, John of Holland, Petrus of Mantua, Cajetan of Thiene, Giovanni Marliani, and Paul of Venice (see Wilson 1956: 25–28, Rommevaux 2017: 154–160, Jung, Podkoński 2020: 130–31, 148–149, 151). The Middle Degree Theorem was widely discussed during the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries, and later played an important role in the formulation of the law of free fall (see Damerow et al. 1992: 161–200, esp. 232–236).
List of Abbreviations
- [CO] Casus obligationis
- [DML] De motu locali
- [IHT] Iuxta hunc textum (Consequentie subtiles Hentisberi)
- [PC] Probationes conclusionum
- [RSS] Regulae solvendi sophismata (=Logica )
- [SCD] De sensu composito et diviso
- [Soph] Sophismata
- [SophAs] Sophismata asinina
General Bibliographical Sources
- Sharpe, Richard, 2001, A Handlist of the Latin Writers of Great Britain and Ireland before 1540. With Additions and Corrections, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Spade, Paul Vincent, 1989, “The Manuscripts of William Heytesbury’s ‘Regulae Solvendi Sophismata’: Conclusions, Notes and Descriptions”, Medioevo, 15: 271–314.
- Weijers, Olga, 1998, Le travail intellectuel à la Faculté des arts de Paris: textes et maîtres (ca. 1200–1500). Répertoire des noms commençant par G, Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 212–217.
- Weisheipl, James A., 1969, “Repertorium Mertonense”, Mediaeval Studies, 31: 174–224. doi:10.1484/J.MS.2.306064
Manuscripts of Heytesbury’s Texts
- De propositionibus multiplicibus:
- Cambridge: Gonville and Caius College, ms. 434/434, fols. 19r–21.
- Venezia: Biblioteca Marciana, lat. VI. 160 (2816), fols. 252r–253v.
- Logica or Regulae solvendi
- Bergamo: Biblioteca Civita Angelo Mai 481 (IV 7), fols. 1ra–87rb.
- Bruges: Openbare Bibliotheek 497, fols. 46–59va.
- Bruges: Openbare Bibliotheek 500, fols. 33–71va [c. 2–6].
- Cesena: Biblioteca Malatestiana S. X. 5, fols.117ra–150rb.
- Erfurt: Wissenschaftliche Allgemeinebibliothek, Amploniana Cms 2o 135, fols. 1ra–17rb.
- Erfurt: Wissenschaftliche Allgemeinebibliothek, Amploniana Cms 2o 313, fols. 195rb–209va [c. 1–5].
- Erfurt: Wissenschaftliche Allgemeinebibliothek, Amploniana Cms 4o 270, fols. 1r–30v.
- Firenze: Biblioteca Riccardiana, 790, fols. 45ra–51va [c. 5], 51vb–59ra [c. 2], 85va–87ra [c. 4, incomplete].
- Firenze: Biblioteca Riccardiana, 821, fols. 2ra–31va.
- Kraków: Biblioteka Jagiellońska 621, fols. 23ra–47va.
- Kraków: Biblioteka Jagiellońska 704, fols.1ra–24ra.
- Leipzig: Universitätsbibliothek, 529, fols. 152ra–168va.
- Leipzig: Universitätsbibliothek 1360, fols. 108ra–140vb.
- Leipzig: Universitätsbibliothek 1370, fols. 2r–39v.
- London: Wellcome Historical Medical Library 350, fols. 2ra–49rb.
- Milano: Biblioteca Ambrosiana, MS C 23 fols. 1r–51r.
- München: Bayerische Staatsbibliothek, Clm 23530, fols. 222v–255r.
- Oxford: Bodleian Library, Canonici Miscellaneous 221, fols. 60ra–82ra.
- Oxford: Bodleian Library, Canonici Miscellaneous 429, fols. 1ra–18vb.
- Oxford: Bodleian Library, Canonici Miscellaneous 456, fols. 1ra–43ra.
- Padua: Biblioteca Antoniana, Manoscritti 407, fols. 26ra–30va [c. 1], fols. 51ra–54v [c. 2 incomplete].
- Padua: Biblioteca Universitaria di Padova 1123, fols. 50rb–65va.
- Padua: Biblioteca Universitaria di Padova 1434, fols. 1ra–20va.
- Praha: Národní knihovna ČR III.A.11, fols. 1ra–30ra.
- San Giminiano: Biblioteca e Archivo comunale 25, fols. 4r–73v.
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Chigi. E.V.161, fols. 68v–75v [c. 2].
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Chigi E.VI.193, fols. 35ra–50rb [c. 6 incomplete].
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Ottobon. lat. 662, fols. 121r–127v [ c. 5].
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Vat. lat. 2136, fols. 1ra–32rb.
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Vat. lat. 2138, fols. 89ra–109va.
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Vat. lat. 3144, fols. 39ra–45vb [c. 1–3, 4 incomplete].
- Venezia: Biblioteca Nazionale San Marco, lat. VIII. 38(3383), fols. 66va–72rb [c. 6].
- Verona: Biblioteca Civica 2881, fols. 6va–45va.
- Warszawa: Biblioteka Narodowa III. 8058, fols. 7ra–134vb [c. 1–5].
- Sophismata [Soph]:
- Paris: Bibliothèque nationale de France 16134, fols. 81ra–146ra.
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana Vat. lat. 2138, fols. 1ra–86va.
- Probationes conclusionum:
- Praha: Národní knihovna X.H.11, fols. 45ra–67ra.
- Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana Vat. lat. 2189, fols. 13vb–38vb.
- Venezia: Biblioteca Marciana Lat. Z. 277 (=1728), fols. 34r–46v
Early Prints of Heytesbury’s and Pseudo-Heytesbury’s Texts
- William Heytesbury, 1491, Regule solvendi sophismata, Venezia: Johannes and Gregorius de Forlivio.
- –––, 1491, Sophismata, Venezia: Johannes and Gregorius de Forlivio.
- –––, 1491, Tractatus de sensu composito et diviso, Venezia: Johannes and Gregorius de Forlivio.
- –––, 1494, Probationes conclusionum, Venezia: Bonetus Locatellus.
- –––, 1494, Regule solvendi sophismata, Venezia: Bonetus Locatellus.
- –––, 1494, Sophismata, Venezia: Bonetus Locatellus.
- –––, 1494, Tractatus de sensu composito et diviso, Venezia: Bonetus Locatellus.
- –––, 1500, Tractatus de sensu composito et diviso, Venezia: Jacobus Pentius de Leuco.
Modern Editions and Translations of Heytesbury’s Texts
- William Heytesbury, 1961, Regulae solvendi sophismata [Part VI. Local motion], in Marshall Clagett, The Science of Mechanics in the Middle Ages (Madison, WI: Wisconsin University Press), pp. 235–242 and 270–283 [partial edition with an English translation based on the 1494 printed edition and mss Bruges, Stadsbibliotheek 497; Bruges, Stadsbibliotheek 500; Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Vat. lat. 2136].
- –––, 1979, William of Heytesbury on “Insoluble” Sentences, Paul V. Spade (ed. and transl.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
- –––, 1987, “De insolubilibus Guilelmi Hentisbery”, in Lorenzo Pozzi (ed. and transl.), Il Mentitore e il Medioevo: il dibattito sui paradossi dell’autoriferimento: scelta di testi, commento, traduzione, Parma: Edizioni Zara, pp. 212–251 [based on the 1494 printed edition and mss Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Vat. lat. 2136 and 2138].
- –––, 1988a, “The Compounded and Divided Senses”, in Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump (ed. and transl.), The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Vol. 1: Logic and Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 413–434 [based on the 1494 printed edition and several manuscripts].
- –––, 1988b, “The Verbs ‘Know’ and ‘Doubt’”, in Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump (ed. and transl.), The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Vol. 1: Logic and Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 435–479 [based on the 1494 printed edition and several manuscripts].
- –––, 1994, Sophismata asinina: une introduction aux disputes médiévales, Fabienne Pironet (ed.), Paris: Libraire Philosophique J. Vrin.
- –––, Sophismata, edited by Fabienne Pironet [transcription of the 1494 edition]. Sophismata (Part I) available online and Sophismata (Part II) available online.
- –––, 2003, Les traites “Juxta hunc textum” de Guillaume Heytesbury et Robert Alyngton. Edition critique précédée d’une introduction historique et paléographique, Universite de Geneve, Projet Sophismata. available online
- –––, 2008, De insolubilibus, in Fabienne Pironet, “William Heytesbury and the treatment of Insolubilia in 14th-century England”, in Shahid Rahman, Tero Tulenheimo, and Emmanuel Genot (eds.), Unity, Truth and the Liar: The Modern Relevance of Medieval Solutions to the Liar Paradox, Berlin: Springer-Verlag, pp. 283–289 [partial transcription of the 1494 edition].
- –––, 2020, Regulae solvendi sophismata: De motu locali, in Elżbieta Jung, Robert Podkoński (eds.), Towards the Modern Theory of Motion. Oxford Calculators and the new interpretation of Aristotle, (Research on Science and Natural Philosophy, 4), Łódź: Wydawnictwo Uniwersytetu Łódzkiego, 267–296 [a critical edition using Erfurt, MS Amplon. F. 135 as the basic manuscript; the apparatus records nine mss, with 24 complete mss taken into consideration].
- –––, 2021, Casus obligationis, in Miroslav Hanke, “The Casus Obligationis Attributed to William Heytesbury”, Cahiers de l’Institut du Moyen-Âge Grec et Latin 90: 226–264. available online
Other Scholastic Sources
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Other Internet Resources
- Longeway, John, “William Heytesbury,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2017/entries/heytesbury/>. [This was the previous entry on Heytesbury in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]