Medieval Theories of Obligationes
Obligationes (literally, “obligations”) or disputations de obligationibus were a medieval disputation format that became very widespread in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Although their name might suggest they had something especially to do with ethics or moral duty, they did not. The purpose of these disputations was strictly logical. Several kinds of disputations de obligationibus were distinguished in the medieval literature. The most widely studied kind to date was called “positio” (= positing). It is difficult or even impossible to map the genre to the genres modern logic, but issues involved include at least counterfactual and per impossibile reasoning, and dynamic commitment to remain logically consistent. Disputations de obligationibus appear to lay at the background of the modern practice of the academic “thesis defense.”
- 1. Disputations de obligationibus
- 2. Origins
- 3. Positio
- 4. The purpose of the disputations
- 5. Other kinds of obligatio
- 6. Conclusion
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The medieval disputation de obligationibus was a highly stylized academic disputation form between two parties, an “opponent” (opponens) and a “respondent” (respondens). From at least the early thirteenth century, a literature began to appear, in independent treatises as well as discussions as part of larger works, on how to conduct such disputations. This literature was regarded as belonging to logic, and the study of obligationes became part of the logic curriculum followed by undergraduates. Treatises on obligationes are however not early works in deontic logic. The name “obligationes” means in Latin as much as in English obligation in the sense of “duty,” but what is “obligatory” is strictly limited to the general logical obligation not to contradict oneself in a disputation and to a specific logical obligation that the opponent gives to the respondent in the beginning of the disputation. Even the general moral duty to be honest and accept what one believes to be true is limited to a very marginal role in these highly technical disputations.
Some late-medieval authors claimed that the theoretical basis for obligationes came from two passages in Aristotle (Prior Analytics I.13.32a18–20, Metaphysics IX.4.1047b10–12), both of which say merely that when something possible is posited, nothing impossible results. But these Aristotelian texts may be the historical origin of the obligationes literature only in a very indirect manner. The first treatises on obligationes are earlier than the ready availability of the Metaphysics in Latin translation, and do not mention either passage. Moreover, while it is certainly true that obligational disputations never require an impossibility to follow when a possibility is posited, that fact does not by itself account for some of the most characteristic features of obligationes. Indeed, some of the earliest discussions concern what happens not when a possibility is posited, but when an impossibility is posited. 
It is precisely this feature, in fact, that at least two early treatises attribute to Aristotle:
And Aristotle says this. For he says, “The impossible is to be posited so that it may be seen what follows on that basis.”
That impossible positing has to be maintained is proved as follows: For just as we say that the possible is to be conceded so that it may be seen what follows on that basis, likewise we have it from Aristotle that the impossible is to be conceded so that it may be seen what happens on that basis.
It seems thus more probable to connect obligational disputations to Aristotle's per impossibile arguments, which had been discussed by at least Boethius and Ibn Rushd.
In any event, the prehistory of the obligationes literature cannot be fully explained in terms of these possible sources. For there were several other kinds or “species” of obligationes besides “positing.” The early Obligationes Parisienses, for example, distinguishes six kinds; the same six are found also in Walter Burley and William of Ockham: positing (positio), counterpositing (depositio), “let it be doubted” (dubitetur), institution (institutio), the truth of the matter (rei veritas), and petition (petitio). Apart from “positing,” most of these kinds of obligationes have been little studied in the modern literature.
The most widely discussed kind of obligatio, both in the medieval literature and in recent scholarship, is no doubt positio or “positing.” In a positio the “opponent” begins by saying “I posit that p.” The proposition p is called the “positum.” The “respondent” then says either “I admit it” or “I deny it,” depending on certain conditions. For example, the treatises by Roger Swyneshed, Robert Fland, and Richard Lavenham all stipulate that in order for the positum to be “admissible,” it must be a contingent proposition. Other authors, as we have seen above, allow the positum to be an impossible proposition, provided that its impossibility is not “manifest,” so that the proposition can be entertained and believed. We shall not consider such cases here.
If the respondent denies the positum, the disputation is over before it really gets started. If he admits the positum, the disputation is under way: The opponent then “proposes” to the respondent a series of propositions, one after another. To each such propositum the respondent must reply by saying “I concede it,” “I deny it,” or “I doubt it,” according to certain rules. The rules stipulate that the correct response depends in part on whether the propositum is “relevant” or “irrelevant” (pertinens/impertinens), and if it is relevant whether it is “sequentially relevant” or “incompatibly relevant” (pertinens sequens/pertinens repugnans). The specification of these notions and of how they affect the correct response to the propositum constitutes the kernel of the theory of positio, and varied from author to author.
- For each step n of the disputation, beginning with the first propositum as step 1, the propositum is “sequentially relevant” at step n if and only if it logically follows from the conjunction of the positum together with any proposita that have been conceded at earlier steps of the disputation, and together with the contradictories of any proposita that have been denied at earlier steps. The propositum is “incompatibly relevant” at step n if and only if its contradictory follows from that same conjunction. It is “irrelevant” at step n if and only if it is neither sequentially relevant nor incompatibly relevant there.
- For each step n of the disputation, and for each propositum p, the respondent must concede p at step n if it is sequentially relevant at n, and must deny it if it is incompatibly relevant at n. If p is irrelevant at step n, the respondent must reply according to his knowledge of the actual facts (independent of what is posited in the disputation). Thus, if p is irrelevant at n and the respondent knows it is true in fact, he must concede it; if p is irrelevant at n and the respondent knows it is false in fact, he must deny it; if p is irrelevant and the respondent does not know whether it is true or false, he must doubt it.
The disputation continues until the opponent says “Cedat tempus,” which can either mean “Time is up!” (the disputation is over) or “Time out!” In the latter case the disputation is interrupted temporarily while the opponent points out some mistake in the respondent's replies or makes some other observation. In both senses, the point is the same: the respondent is not “obligated” by the rules of positio except when the “game clock” is running.
An example will help clarify the rules.
|I posit that Atlanta is the capital of Pennsylvania.||I admit it.|
Comments: Atlanta is not in fact the capital of
Pennsylvania. But that does not prevent the opponent from positing that
|Step 1:||Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I concede it.|
Comments: From the positum it follows neither that
Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line nor that it isn't. (The
positum says nothing at all about the location of the
Mason-Dixon Line or of Atlanta.) Hence step 1 is irrelevant. Nevertheless, since the
respondent knows that step 1 is in fact true, he must concede it.
|Step 2:||The capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I concede it.|
Comments: From the positum and the already conceded
step 1, step 2 follows. Hence it is sequentially relevant and must be
|Time is up!|
Several peculiar things should be noted about these rules. First, the burden of the rules falls almost entirely on the respondent. As long as he picks an “admissible” positum to begin with, the opponent is otherwise free to propose anything he pleases at any step of the disputation.
Second, note the role of the respondent's epistemic state. It is a factor in determining the correct replies, but only when the propositum is irrelevant.
Third, note that order counts. That is, depending on the order in which proposita are proposed, different replies to them may be required. Thus if steps 1 and 2 were reversed in the above example, both would have to be denied:
|I posit that Atlanta is the capital of Pennsylvania.||I admit it.|
Comments: As before.
|Step 1:||The capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I deny it.|
Comments: From the positum it follows neither that
the capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line nor that
it isn't. (As before, the positum says nothing about the
location of the Mason-Dixon Line or of the capital of Pennsylvania.)
Hence step 1 is irrelevant. Nevertheless, since the respondent knows
that step 1 is in fact false, he must deny it.
|Step 2:||Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I deny it.|
Comments: From the positum
and the contradictory of step 1 (step 1 was denied, recall),
the contradictory of step 2 follows. Hence step 2 is incompatibly
relevant and must be denied.
|Time is up!|
This set of rules guarantees that positio is “consistent” in each of the following three, progressively stronger senses:
- (1) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to concede an impossibility at any one step.
- (2) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to concede proposita of the form p and not-p at different steps.
- (3) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to concede at different steps each member of an inconsistent set of proposita.
Yet on Burley's theory positio fails to be “consistent” in another sense:
- (4) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to give different replies to the same propositum at different steps.
As an example of this failure, let p and q be contingent propositions neither of which logically implies the other, and let the respondent know that q is false whereas he does not know the truth value of p. Then:
|I posit that p or
||I admit it.|
|Step 1:||p||I doubt it.|
Comments: The positum implies neither p nor
not-p. Step 1 is therefore irrelevant. Thus, since the
respondent does not know its truth value, he must doubt it.
|Step 2:||q||I deny it.|
Comments: The positum implies neither q nor
not-q. Step 2 is therefore irrelevant. (Since step 1 was
neither conceded nor denied, it does not affect whether step 2 is
relevant or irrelevant.) Since the respondent knows that q
is in fact false, it must be denied.
|Step 3:||p||I concede it.|
Comments: Step 3 follows from the positum and the
contradictory of step 2 (step 2 was denied, recall). Hence it
must be conceded, even though the same propositum was doubted in step
|Time is up!|
Clearly, positio on Burley's theory is a very peculiar kind of disputation.
Burley's theory of positio was not the only one. Another account seems to have originated with a certain Roger Swyneshed, who wrote an Obligationes probably sometime after 1330 and certainly before 1335 (Spade ). This alternative theory was recognized by Robert Fland, a mid-fourteenth century author about whom very little is known. Fland reports both Burley's theory and Swyneshed's theory, calling them the “old response” and the “new response,” respectively. He does not choose between them, but simply tells the respondent to pick whichever one he likes (Spade , §20). Richard Lavenham, on the other hand, a later-fourteenth century author contemporary with John Wyclif, accepts Swyneshed's version of positio outright. A certain John of Wesel from mid-fourteenth century Paris also shows knowledge of Swyneshed's views (John of Wesel ). Nevertheless, Swyneshed's views seem to have generated some controversy. For instance, Ralph Strode, in the later-fourteenth century (roughly contemporary with John Wyclif), heatedly rejected features of Swyneshed's theory, as did Peter of Candia and the Logica magna attributed to Paul of Venice (Spade [1982a], pp. 337–39).
Swyneshed's theory of positio is in many respects like Burley's, but differs in one major respect. For Swyneshed, in assessing whether a propositum is relevant or irrelevant, the responses to previous proposita do not matter. That is, for him, a propositum is “sequentially relevant” if and only if it logically follows from the positum alone; it is “incompatibly relevant” if and only if its contradictory opposite follows from the positum alone; it is “irrelevant” if and only if it is neither sequentially nor incompatibly relevant.
Swyneshed's “new response” greatly simplifies the task of the respondent. He no longer has to keep track of what has previously been conceded or denied in the disputation. The order in which proposita are proposed no longer matters. All the respondent has to do is to make sure he responds appropriately whenever the propositum either follows from or is inconsistent with the positum alone, and otherwise just respond according to his knowledge of the actual facts. As long as he does that, he has performed correctly.
Unlike Burley's theory, Swyneshed's guarantees that positio is consistent in sense 4 above. On the other hand, while for Swyneshed positio is consistent in sense 1 and sense 2 above, it fails to be consistent in sense 3. For example, suppose you know you are sitting somewhere in Oxford, and then consider the following positio (Spade , §100):
|I posit that you are in Rome or you are running.||I admit it.|
Comments: The fact that both disjuncts are false
does not prevent the proposition's being “admissible.”
|Step 1:||You are in Rome or you are running.||I concede it.|
Comments: This is just a repetition of the positum,
except that here it is not being posited but proposed. It is obviously
sequentially relevant, and so must be conceded.
|Step 2:||You are not in Rome.||I concede it.|
Comments: Neither step 2 nor its contradictory follows from the
positum alone. Hence it is irrelevant. Since (by hypothesis)
it is also known to be true, it has to be conceded.
|Step 3:||You are not running.||I concede it.|
|Time is up!|
The proposita in steps 1–3 form an inconsistent triad, and yet each of them has to be conceded in accordance with Swyneshed's rules.
Burley's and Swyneshed's were not the only theories of positio, although they seem to have been the most widely discussed. Other theories were suggested too, but they are not yet thoroughly studied or understood.
What was the purpose of positio? The question is not an easy one. For, oddly, although medieval authors themselves speak of positio as a kind of “disputation,” there seems at first to be nothing really in dispute! Look back at the preceding examples. They do not settle, or even try to settle, anything whatever about the capital of Pennsylvania, the location of the Mason-Dixon Line, whether you are sitting or running in Rome or in Oxford, or anything else. Unlike the medieval quaestio format, where there was a real issue being pursued and a real conflict of opposing views, there seems to be nothing like that going on in a positio. What then was its purpose?
Some scholars have suggested that these disputations were meant as “exercises” or perhaps “examinations” of students' skills. But skills at doing what? We have just seen that it would not be their purely logical skills that would be exercised or examined. What other skills were they? Skills at arguing according to the rules of obligatio? No doubt, but without some further explanation, why would anyone want to do that?
One suggestion is that positio might be viewed as something like a theory of counterfactual reasoning. On this account, a positio would explore “what would happen” if the positum were true but everything else stayed as much as possible the same as it really is. This suggestion provides some rationale for the otherwise mysterious treatment of irrelevant proposita, where one looks away from the posited situation back to reality to guide one's responses. In similar fashion, where a counterfactual hypothesis does not require otherwise, counterfactual reasoning typically tries to stay as close as possible to reality.
Furthermore, theories of positio bear striking formal similarities to modern theories of counterfactuals. Transitivity, contraposition and strengthening the antecedent all fail, and several other characteristics of counterfactuals seem to be mirrored in the theory of positio.
This suggestion has met considerable resistance (Stump  and , Martin ). One objection is that, at least on Burley's “standard” theory of positio, if a positum is possible but nevertheless known to be false, the opponent can maneuver the respondent into having to concede any proposition whatever consistent with the positum. Let p be such a positum, and let q be consistent with p. Then:
|I posit that p.
||I admit it.|
|Step 1:||Not-p or q.||I concede it.|
Comments: If p logically implies q, then step
1 is sequentially relevant, and so has to be conceded. If p
does not logically imply q, step 1 is irrelevant, since
q is by hypothesis consistent with p. In that case,
since p is known to be false, not-p is known to be
true, and step 1 has to be conceded as an irrelevant truth.
|Step 2:||q||I concede it.|
Comments: The propositum q follows from the
positum and the conceded proposition in step 1. Hence it is
sequentially relevant and must be conceded.
|Time is up!|
This is a very bad result if positio is a form of counterfactual reasoning. For it means that, starting from any known falsehood, one could reason counterfactually to anything whatever consistent with it.
Another objection might be that counterfactual reasoning, at least as we are thinking of it today, does not incorporate epistemic factors in the way the theory of positio does. It is one thing to say that we do not know what would happen under a given counterfactual hypothesis; it is quite another thing to say, as the “counterfactual”-interpretation has it that the theory of obligationes does say, that what would happen depends in part on what we do know in fact.
4.2 Positio and consistency maintainance
In more recent research (e.g. Yrjönsuuri ; Catarina Dutilh Novaes ), scholars have thought that unlike twentieth century theories of counterfactual reasoning, obligationes are characteristically dynamic and dialectical. The core of the art is that the respondent must use logical skills to keep the general commitment to consistency. A particular bend to the art comes from the fact that at least in the late medieval context there was no clear universally accepted definition what it means to keep consistent in a dynamic situation. There was, from the viewpoint of this interpretation, agreement that the consistency at issue in obligationes is connected to inferential validity. In the early Obligationes Parisienses the art is explicitly connected to “knowledge of consequences” (scientia de consequentiis). Even more generally, it is clear that the kinds of inferences employed in obligationes are in most cases strictly logical.
Another suggestion is that positio might lie at the background of the modern academic practice of the “thesis defense.” ‘Positio’, after all, is just Latin for the Greek ‘thesis’. Furthermore, to this day, the characteristic terminology of “opponent” and “respondent” is preserved in some European academic thesis-defenses. Moreover, despite our earlier sense that there is, oddly, nothing really “in dispute” in a positio, it is relatively easy to find medieval discussions—not in treatises or other passages devoted specifically to the theory of obligationes, but in other texts—where the characteristic vocabulary and procedures of positio are appealed to in a context where some substantive view is being argued. That view, however, is not to be found in the positum or in any of the subsequent proposed steps of the positio. It is rather a view that the respondent takes himself to know (and so is prepared to “defend”), and that will therefore affect the responses he gives to irrelevant proposita. The view being “defended,” therefore, is not a view explicitly stated anywhere in the disputation, but a kind of background assumption that underlies the respondent's replies. This suggestion has some promise, but has not yet been thoroughly explored. One objection might be that, despite the initial attractiveness of the fact that Latin ‘positio’ is the same as Greek ‘thesis,’ this view ends up divorcing the “thesis” being defended by the respondent from the positum in the disputation.
The jury is still out. It must be admitted that no one has yet explained positio, much less the obligationes-literature in general, in a fully satisfactory way. An adequate account would have to accommodate
- the variety of views of positio one finds in the medieval literature;
- the characteristic treatment of irrelevant proposita, which brings non-logical factors into play;
- in particular, the epistemic factors incorporated into most treatments.
It may be that any adequate account would in effect reproduce the genre with the terminology of modern logic. That is, perhaps obligationes are best understood as a logical genre of its own kind.
Apart from positio, the other kinds of obligatio recognized in the medieval literature have not been studied nearly so much. One kind that perhaps needs little separate study is “counterpositing” (depositio). In effect, if “positing” requires the respondent to uphold the positum as true (by conceding what follows from it, etc.), “counterpositing” requires the respondent to uphold the depositum as false (by denying what implies it, etc.). In other respects, counterpositing seems, mutatis mutandis, to be a trivial variation on positing. This itself raises an interpretive problem: why treat counterpositing as a separate kind of obligatio at all?
Another kind that that probably needs only cursory recognition is “doubting.” Doubting (dubitatio), like counterpositing, is a variation on positing. In this case, the respondent is required to uphold the dubitatum as doubtful. (Recall the role of doubtful irrelevant proposita in a positio.) Again, while the complications can get get confusing in practice, theoretically this seems a trivial variation on positing. One wonders again why some authors singled it out as a separate kind of obligatio.
A few words should be said about other kinds of obligatio. Even apart from the context of obligationes, “institution” (or “imposition”) was regarded as the assigning of meaning to expressions of language. Within the context of obligationes, the issue seems to have revolved around how institution or imposition affected the correct responses in an obligational disputation. Suppose we call a tail a leg (that is, “impose” the word ‘leg’ to include tails). How many legs does a lion have? Should we say five, on the grounds that we are calling tails legs? Or should we continue to say four, on the grounds that our replies are to be given according to the meanings words actually have, quite apart from whatever meanings they might (counterfactually) be assumed to have in the context of a disputation? (See Spade [1982a], pp. 339–40.)
“Petition” (petitio) has been completely ignored in the recent literature, and little can be said that is informative about it. Somewhat more has been said about “the truth of the matter” (rei veritas), but not much (Spade [1994–1997]).
The vocabulary of medieval obligationes-literature (“positing,” “conceding,” “admitting,” “relevance/irrelevance”) appears ubiquitously in late medieval scholastic writings. If not otherwise, for this reason there is need for more study of the literature and its role in medieval logic.
The most complete bibliography of primary and secondary material on obligationes up to 1994 may be found in:
- Ashworth, E. J. 1994. “Obligationes Treatises: A Catalogue of Manuscripts, Editions and Studies,” Bulletin de Philosophie Médiévale 36, pp. 118–47.
The items listed below include only those explicitly cited above and in the notes, together with a few other items published updating the information in Ashworth .
- Ashworth, E. J . 1992. “The Obligationes of John Tarteys: Edition and Introduction,” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 3: 653–703.
- Boehner, Philotheus. 1952. Medieval Logic: An Outline of Its Development from 1250 to c. 1400. Manchester: Manchester University Press.
- De Rijk, Lambert M. 1974. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. I,” Vivarium, 12: 94–123.
- ––– 1975. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. II,” Vivarium, 13: 22–54.
- ––– 1976. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. III,” Vivarium, 14: 26–42.
- Dumitriu, Anton. 1977. History of Logic. Duiliu Zamfirescu et al., trans. 4 vols. Tunbridge Wells, Kent: Abacus Press.
- Dutilh Novaes, Catarina. 2011. “Medieval Obligationes as a Theory of Discursive Commitment Management,” Vivarium, 49: 240–257.
- Gelber, Hester Goodenough. 2004. It Could Have Been Otherwise: Contingency and Necessity in Dominican Theology at Oxford, 1300–1350, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
- Green, Romuald. 1963. “An Introduction to the Logical Treatise De obligationibus, with Critical Texts of William of Sherwood [?] and Walter Burley,” 2 vols. Doctoral dissertation. Katholieke Universiteit Leuven. A revised version of this essential but unpublished dissertation has been widely circulated in manuscript form under the title The Logical Treatise ‘De obligationibus': An Introduction with Critical Texts of William of Sherwood and Walter Burley.
- John of Wesel . “Three Questions by John of Wesel on Obligationes and Insolubilia,” [Latin edition available online in PDF, with introduction and notes, by Paul Vincent Spade.]
- King, Peter. 1991. “Mediaeval Thought-Experiments: The Metamethodology of Mediaeval Science,” in T. Horowitz and G. Massey (eds.) 1991. Thought Experiments in Science and Philosophy. Savage, Md: Rowman & Littlefield, pp. 43–64.
- Kilvington, Richard. 1990a. The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington. Norman Kretzmann and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann, ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press. (“Auctores Brittanici Medii Aevi,” vol. 12.) Latin edition. Translated in Kilvington [1990b].
- –––, ed. 1990b. The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington. Norman Kretzmann and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann, ed. and trans. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Translation of Kilvington [1990a], with commentary.
- Kukkonen, Taneli. 2002. “Alternatives to Alternatives: Approaches to Aristotle's Arguments per impossibile,” Vivarium, 40: 137–173.
- Kukkonen, Taneli. 2005. “The impossible, insofar as it is possible: Ibn Rushd and Buridan on logic and natural theology,” in D. Perler & U. Rudolph (eds.), Logik und Theologie: Das Organon im Arabischen und im Lateinischen Mittelalter, Leiden: Brill, pp. 447–467.
- Kretzmann, Norman, et al., ed. 1982. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Kretzmann, Norman, and Stump, Eleonore. 1985. “The Anonymous De arte obligatoria in Merton College MS. 306,” in E. P. Bos (ed.), Medieval Semantics and Metaphysics: Studies Dedicated to L. M. de Rijk, Ph.D., Professor of Ancient and Mediaeval Philosophy at the University of Leiden on the Occasion of His 60th Birthday, Nijmegen: Ingenium, pp. 239–80. (“Artistarium,” Supplementa, vol. 2.)
- Martin, Christopher J. 1990. “Bradwardine and the use of Positio as a Test of Possibility,” in Simo Knuuttila, Reijo Työrinoja and Sten Ebbesen (eds.), Knowledge and the Sciences in Medieval Philosophy: Proceedings of the Eighth International Congress of Medieval Philosophy, vol. 2. Helsinki: Publications of the Luther-Agricola Society, pp. 574–85.
- ––– 1993. “Obligations and Liars,” in S. Read (ed.), 1993, Sophisms in Mediaeval Logic and Grammar: Acts of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, held at St Andrews, June 1990, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 357–81. (“Nijhoff International Philosophy Series,” vol. 48.) (Revised version in Martin .)
- ––– 1997. “Impossible Positio as the Foundation of Metaphysics or, Logic on the Scotist Plan?” in Constantino Marmo (ed.), Vestigia, Imagines, Verba: Semiotics in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIIth–XIVth Century), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 255–77. (Revised version in Martin .)
- ––– 1999. Theories of Inference and Entailment in the Middle Ages. Vol. I. Princeton University: Ph.D. dissertation. (UMI #9948627.) (Includes revised versions of Martin , .)
- Mullally, Joseph P., trans. 1964. Peter of Spain: Tractatus Syncategorematum and Selected Anonymous Treatises. Milwaukee: Marquette University Press. (“Mediaeval Philosophical Texts in Translation,” vol. 13.)
- Paul of Venice. 1988. Logica Magna: Secunda Pars. Tractatus de obligationibus. (= Part II, Fascicule 8.) E. Jennifer Ashworth, ed. and trans. Oxford: Oxford University Press for the British Academy. (“The British Academy: Classical and Medieval Logic Texts,” vol. 5.)
- Spade, Paul Vincent. 1977. “Roger Swyneshed's Obligationes: Edition and Comments,” Archives d'histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 44: 243–85. Reprinted with the same pagination in Spade 1988, item XVI.
- ––– 1978. “Richard Lavenham's Obligationes: Edition and Comments,” Rivista critica di storia della filosofia, 33: 225–42.
- ––– 1980. “Robert Fland's Obligationes: An Edition,” Mediaeval Studies, 42: 41–60.
- ––– 1982a. “Obligations: Developments in the Fourteenth Century,” in N. Kretzmann, et al. (eds.) 1982, Chap. 16, Part B, pp. 335–41.
- ––– 1982b. “Three Theories of Obligationes: Burley, Kilvington and Swyneshed on Counterfactual Reasoning,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 3: 1–32. Reprinted with the same pagination in Spade 1988, item XVII.
- ––– 1988. Lies, Language and Logic in the Late Middle Ages. London: Variorum Reprints.
- ––– 1992. “If Obligationes Were Counterfactuals,” Philosophical Topics, 20: 171–88.
- ––– 1993. “Opposing and Responding: A New Look at Positio,” Medioevo: Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale, 19: 233–70.
- ––– 1994–97. “The Logic of ‘Sit verum’ in Richard Brinkley and William of Ockham,” Franciscan Studies, 54: 227–50.
- Spade, Paul Vincent, and Stump, Eleonore. 1983. “Walter Burley and the Obligationes Attributed to William of Sherwood,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 4: 9–26.
- Spade, Paul Vincent, and Wilson Gordon A., ed. 1995. Richard Brinkley's Obligationes: A Late Fourteenth Century Treatise on the Logic of Disputation. Münster i. W.: Aschendorff. (Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters, neue Folge, Bd. 43.)
- Stump, Eleonore. 1981. “Rober Swyneshed's Theory of Obligations,” Medioevo: Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale 7, pp. 135–74. Reprinted in Stump , pp. 215–49.
- ––– 1982. “Obligations: From the Beginning to the Early Fourteenth Century,” in N. Kretzmann, et al. (eds.) 1982, Chap. 16, Part A, pp. 315–34.
- ––– 1985. “The Logic of Disputation in Walter Burley's Treatise on Obligations,” Synthese 63, pp. 335–74. Reprinted under the title “Walter Burley on Obligations” in Stump , pp. 195–213.
- ––– 1989. Dialectic and Its Place in the Development of Medieval Logic. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- ––– 1982. “Obligations: From the Beginning to the Early Fourteenth Century,” in N. Kretzmann et al. (eds.) 1982, Chap. 16, Part A, pp. 315–34.
- Weisheipl, James A. 1966. “Developments in the Arts Curriculum at Oxford in the Early Fourteenth Century,” Mediaeval Studies, 28: 151–75.
- William of Ockham. 1974. Summa logicae. Philotheus Boehner, Gedeon Gál and Stephen Brown, ed. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute. (“Opera philosophica,” vol. 1.)
- Yrjönsuuri, Mikko. 1998. “The Compossibility of Impossibilities and Ars obligatoria,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 19: 235–48.
- ––– 2000. “Disputations, Obligations and Logical Coherence,” Theoria, 66: 205–23.
- ––– 2001. Consequences, Obligations and Insolubles. Dordrecht: Kluwer. (“New Synthese Historical Library,” vol. 49.)
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