# Hilbert’s Program

*First published Thu Jul 31, 2003; substantive revision Fri May 24, 2019*

In the early 1920s, the German mathematician David Hilbert (1862–1943) put forward a new proposal for the foundation of classical mathematics which has come to be known as Hilbert’s Program. It calls for a formalization of all of mathematics in axiomatic form, together with a proof that this axiomatization of mathematics is consistent. The consistency proof itself was to be carried out using only what Hilbert called “finitary” methods. The special epistemological character of finitary reasoning then yields the required justification of classical mathematics. Although Hilbert proposed his program in this form only in 1921, various facets of it are rooted in foundational work of his going back until around 1900, when he first pointed out the necessity of giving a direct consistency proof of analysis. Work on the program progressed significantly in the 1920s with contributions from logicians such as Paul Bernays, Wilhelm Ackermann, John von Neumann, and Jacques Herbrand. It was also a great influence on Kurt Gödel, whose work on the incompleteness theorems were motivated by Hilbert’s Program. Gödel’s work is generally taken to show that Hilbert’s Program cannot be carried out. It has nevertheless continued to be an influential position in the philosophy of mathematics, and, starting with the work of Gerhard Gentzen in the 1930s, work on so-called Relativized Hilbert Programs have been central to the development of proof theory.

- 1. Historical development of Hilbert’s Program
- 2. The Finitary Point of View
- 3. Formalism, reductionism and instrumentalism
- 4. Hilbert’s Program and Gödel’s incompleteness theorems
- 5. Revised Hilbert Programs
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Historical development of Hilbert’s Program

### 1.1 Early work on foundations

Hilbert’s work on the foundations of mathematics has its roots in
his work on geometry of the 1890s, culminating in his influential
textbook *Foundations of Geometry*
(1899)
(see
19th Century Geometry).
Hilbert believed that the proper way to develop
any scientific subject rigorously required an axiomatic approach. In
providing an axiomatic treatment, the theory would be developed
independently of any need for intuition, and it would facilitate an
analysis of the logical relationships between the basic concepts and
the axioms. Of basic importance for an axiomatic treatment are, so
Hilbert, investigation of the independence and, above all, of the
consistency of the axioms. For the axioms of geometry, consistency can
be proved by providing an interpretation of the system in the real
plane, and thus, the consistency of geometry is reduced to the
consistency of analysis. The foundation of analysis, of course, itself
requires an axiomatization and a consistency proof. Hilbert provided
such an axiomatization in
(1900b),
but it
became clear very quickly that the consistency of analysis faced
significant difficulties, in particular because the favored way of
providing a foundation for analysis in Dedekind’s work relied on
dubious assumptions akin to to those that lead to the paradoxes of set
theory and
Russell’s Paradox
in
Frege’s foundation of arithmetic.

Hilbert thus realized that a *direct* consistency proof of
analysis, i.e., one not based on reduction to another theory, was
needed. He proposed the problem of finding such a proof as the second
of his 23 mathematical problems in his address to the International
Congress of Mathematicians in 1900
(1900a)
and presented a sketch of such a proof in his Heidelberg talk
(1905).
Several factors delayed the further
development of Hilbert’s foundational program. One was perhaps the
criticism of
Poincaré (1906)
against
what he saw as a viciously circular use of induction in Hilbert’s
sketched consistency proof (see
Steiner 1975,
Appendix). Hilbert also realized that axiomatic investigations required
a well worked-out logical formalism. At the time he relied on a
conception of logic based on the algebraic tradition, in particular, on
Schröder’s work, which was not particularly suited as a formalism
for the axiomatization of mathematics. (See
Peckhaus 1990
on the early development of
Hilbert’s Program.)

### 1.2 The influence of *Principia Mathematica*

The publication of Russell and Whitehead’s
*Principia Mathematica*
provided the required logical basis for a renewed attack on
foundational issues. Beginning in 1914, Hilbert’s student Heinrich
Behmann and others studied the system of *Principia* (see
Mancosu 1999
on Behmann’s role in Hilbert’s
school). Hilbert himself returned to work on foundational issues in
1917. In September 1917, he delivered an address to the Swiss
Mathematical Society entitled “Axiomatic Thought”
(1918a).
It is his first published contribution
to mathematical foundations since 1905. In it, he again emphasizes the
requirement of consistency proofs for axiomatic systems: “The chief
requirement of the theory of axioms must go farther [than merely
avoiding known paradoxes], namely, to show that within every field of
knowledge contradictions based on the underlying axiom-system are
*absolutely impossible*.” He poses the proof of the consistency
of arithmetic (and of set theory) again as the main open problems. In
both these cases, there seems to be nothing more fundamental available
to which the consistency could be reduced other than logic itself. And
Hilbert then thought that the problem had essentially been solved by
Russell’s work in *Principia*. Nevertheless, other fundamental
problems of axiomatics remained unsolved, including the problem of the
“decidability of every mathematical question,” which also traces back
to Hilbert’s 1900 address.

These unresolved problems of axiomatics led Hilbert to devote
significant effort to work on logic in the following years. In 1917,
Paul Bernays joined him as his assistant in Göttingen. In a series
of courses from 1917–1921, Hilbert, with the assistance of Bernays and
Behmann, made significant new contributions to formal logic. The course
from 1917
(Hilbert, 1918b),
in particular,
contains a sophisticated development of first-order logic, and forms
the basis of Hilbert and Ackermann’s textbook *Principles of
Theoretical Logic*
(1928)
(see
Ewald and Sieg 2013,
Sieg 1999,
and
Zach 1999, 2003).

### 1.3 Finitism and the quest for consistency proofs

Within the next few years, however, Hilbert came to reject Russell’s logicist solution to the consistency problem for arithmetic. At the same time, Brouwer’s intuitionistic mathematics gained currency. In particular, Hilbert’s former student Hermann Weyl converted to intuitionism. Weyl’s paper “The new foundational crisis in mathematics” (1921) was answered by Hilbert in three talks in Hamburg in the Summer of 1921 (1922b). Here, Hilbert presented his own proposal for a solution to the problem of the foundation of mathematics. This proposal incorporated Hilbert’s ideas from 1904 regarding direct consistency proofs, his conception of axiomatic systems, and also the technical developments in the axiomatization of mathematics in the work of Russell as well as the further developments carried out by him and his collaborators. What was new was the way in which Hilbert wanted to imbue his consistency project with the philosophical significance necessary to answer Brouwer and Weyl’s criticisms: the finitary point of view.

According to Hilbert, there is a privileged part of mathematics, contentual elementary number theory, which relies only on a “purely intuitive basis of concrete signs.” Whereas the operating with abstract concepts was considered “inadequate and uncertain,” there is a realm of

extra-logical discrete objects, which exist intuitively as immediate experience before all thought. If logical inference is to be certain, then these objects must be capable of being completely surveyed in all their parts, and their presentation, their difference, their succession (like the objects themselves) must exist for us immediately, intuitively, as something which cannot be reduced to something else. (Hilbert 1922b, 202; the passage is repeated almost verbatim in Hilbert 1926, 376, Hilbert 1928, 464, and Hilbert 1931b, 267)

These objects were, for Hilbert, *signs*. The domain of
contentual number theory consists in the finitary numerals, i.e.,
sequences of strokes. These have no meaning, i.e., they do not stand
for abstract objects, but they can be operated on (e.g., concatenated)
and compared. Knowledge of their properties and relations is intuitive
and unmediated by logical inference. Contentual number theory developed
this way is secure, according to Hilbert: no contradictions can arise
simply because there is no logical structure in the propositions of
contentual number theory.

The intuitive-contentual operations with signs forms the basis of
Hilbert’s metamathematics. Just as contentual number theory operates
with sequences of strokes, so metamathematics operates with sequences
of symbols (formulas, proofs). Formulas and proofs can be syntactically
manipulated, and the properties and relationships of formulas and
proofs are similarly based in a logic-free intuitive capacity which
guarantees certainty of knowledge about formulas and proofs arrived at
by such syntactic operations. Mathematics itself, however, operates
with abstract concepts, e.g., quantifiers, sets, functions, and uses
logical inference based on principles such as mathematical induction or
the principle of the excluded middle. These “concept-formations” and
modes of reasoning had been criticized by Brouwer and others on grounds
that they presuppose infinite totalities as given, or that they involve
impredicative definitions (which were considered by the critics as
viciously circular). Hilbert’s aim was to justify their use. To this
end, he pointed out that they can be formalized in axiomatic systems
(such as that of *Principia* or those developed by Hilbert
himself), and mathematical propositions and proofs thus turn into
formulas and derivations from axioms according to strictly
circumscribed rules of derivation. Mathematics, so Hilbert, “becomes an
inventory of provable formulas.” In this way the proofs of mathematics
are subject to metamathematical, contentual investigation. The goal of
Hilbert’s program is then to give a contentual, metamathematical proof
that there can be no derivation of a contradiction, i.e., no formal
derivations of a formula \(A\) and of its negation
\(\neg A\).

This sketch of the aims of the program was fleshed out by Hilbert and his collaborators in the following 10 years. On the conceptual side, the finite standpoint and the strategy for a consistency proof were elaborated by Hilbert (1928); Hilbert (1923); Hilbert (1926) and Bernays (1928b); Bernays (1922); Bernays (1930), of which Hilbert’s article “On the infinite” (1926) provides the most detailed elaboration of the finitary standpoint. In addition to Hilbert and Bernays, a number of other people were involved in technical work on the program. In lectures given in Göttingen (Hilbert and Bernays, 1923; Hilbert, 1922a), Hilbert and Bernays developed the \(\varepsilon\)-calculus as their definitive formalism for axiom systems for arithmetic and analysis. Hilbert there also presented his approach to giving consistency proofs using his so-called \(\varepsilon\)-substitution method. Ackermann (1924) attempted to extend Hilbert’s idea to a system of analysis. The proof was, however, erroneous (see Zach 2003). John von Neumann, then visiting Göttingen, gave a corrected consistency proof for a system of the \(\varepsilon\)-formalism (which, however, did not include the induction axiom) in 1925 (published in 1927). Building on von Neumann’s work, Ackermann devised a new \(\varepsilon\)-substitution procedure which he communicated to Bernays (see Bernays 1928b). In his address “Problems of the grounding of mathematics” to the International Congress of Mathematicians in Bologna in 1928 (1929), Hilbert optimistically claimed that the work of Ackermann and von Neumann had established the consistency of number theory and that the proof for analysis had already been carried out by Ackermann “to the extent that the only remaining task consists in the proof of an elementary finiteness theorem that is purely arithmetical.”

### 1.4 The impact of Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorems

Gödel’s incompleteness
theorems showed that Hilbert’s optimism was undue. In September 1930,
Kurt Gödel announced his first incompleteness theorem at a
conference in Königsberg. Von Neumann, who was in the audience,
immediately recognized the significance of Gödel’s result for
Hilbert’s program. Shortly after the conference he wrote to
Gödel, telling him that he had found a corollary to Gödel’s
result. Gödel had found the same result already independently:
the second incompleteness theorem, asserting that the system
of *Principia* does not prove the formalization of the claim
that the system of *Principia* is consistent (provided it
is). All the methods of finitary reasoning used in the consistency
proofs up till then were believed to be formalizable in
*Principia*, however. Hence, if the consistency of
*Principia* were provable by the methods used in Ackermann’s
proofs, it should be possible to formalize this proof in
*Principia*; but this is what the second incompleteness theorem
states is impossible. Bernays also realized the importance of
Gödel’s results immediately after he studied Gödel’s paper in
January 1931, writing to Gödel that (under the assumption that
finitary reasoning can be formalized in *Principia*) the
incompleteness theorem show that a finitary consistency proof of
*Principia* is impossible. Shortly thereafter, von Neumann
showed that Ackermann’s consistency proof is flawed and provided a
counterexample to the proposed \(\varepsilon\)-substitution procedure (see
Zach 2003).

In
(1936),
Gentzen published a consistency
proof of first-order Peano Arithmetic (\(\PA\)). As Gödel had
shown was necessary, Gentzen’s proof used methods that could not be
formalized in \(\PA\) itself, namely, transfinite induction along
the ordinal \(\varepsilon_0\). Gentzen’s work marks the beginning
of post-Gödelian proof theory and work on Relativized Hilbert
Programs. Proof theory in the tradition of Gentzen has analyzed
axiomatic systems according to what extensions of the finitary
standpoint are necessary to prove their consistency. Usually, the
consistency strength of systems has been measured by the system’s
*proof-theoretic ordinal*, i.e., the ordinal transfinite
induction along which suffices to prove consistency. In the case of
\(\PA\), that ordinal is \(\varepsilon_0\). (For further
discussion, see the entry on
the development of proof theory.)

## 2. The Finitary Point of View

The cornerstone of Hilbert’s philosophy of mathematics, and the substantially new aspect of his foundational thought from 1922b onward, consisted in what he called the finitary standpoint. This methodological standpoint consists in a restriction of mathematical thought to those objects which are “intuitively present as immediate experience prior to all thought,” and to those operations on and methods of reasoning about such objects which do not require the introduction of abstract concepts, in particular, without appeal to completed infinite totalities.

There are several basic and interrelated issues in understanding Hilbert’s finitary standpoint:

- What are the objects of finitary reasoning?
- What are the finitarily meaningful propositions?
- What are the finitarily acceptable methods of construction and reasoning?

### 2.1 Finitary objects and finitist epistemology

Hilbert characterized the domain of finitary reasoning in a well-known paragraph which appears in roughly the same formulation in all of Hilbert’s more philosophical papers from the 1920s (1931b; 1922b; 1928; 1926):

[A]s a condition for the use of logical inferences and the performance of logical operations, something must already be given to our faculty of representation, certain extralogical concrete objects that are intuitively present as immediate experience prior to all thought. If logical inference is to be reliable, it must be possible to survey these objects completely in all their parts, and the fact that they occur, that they differ from one another, and that they follow each other, or are concatenated, is immediately given intuitively, together with the objects, as something that can neither be reduced to anything else nor requires reduction. This is the basic philosophical position that I consider requisite for mathematics and, in general, for all scientific thinking, understanding, and communication. (Hilbert, 1926, 376)

These objects are, for Hilbert, the *signs*. For the domain
of contentual number theory, the signs in question are numerals such
as

1, 11, 111, 11111

The question of how exactly Hilbert understood the numerals is
difficult to answer. They are not physical objects (actual strokes on
paper, for instance), since it must always be possible to extend a
numeral by adding another stroke (and, as Hilbert also argues in “On
the infinite”
(1926),
it is doubtful that the
physical universe is infinite). According to
Hilbert (1922b, 202),
their “shape can be
generally and certainly recognized by us—independently of space and
time, of the special conditions of the production of the sign, and of
the insignificant differences in the finished product.” They are not
mental constructions, since their properties are objective, yet their
existence is dependent on their intuitive construction (see
Bernays 1923,
226). What is clear in any case
is that they are logically primitive, i.e., they are neither concepts
(as Frege’s numbers are) nor sets. What is important here is not
primarily their metaphysical status (abstract versus concrete in the
current sense of these terms), but that they do not enter into logical
relations, e.g., they cannot be predicated of anything. In Bernays’s
most mature presentations of finitism
(Hilbert and Bernays, 1939;
Bernays, 1930),
the objects of finitism are
characterized as *formal objects* which are recursively
generated by a process of repetition; the stroke symbols are then
concrete representations of these formal objects.

The question of what Hilbert thought the epistemological status of
the objects of finitism was is equally difficult. In order to carry out
the task of providing a secure foundation for infinitistic mathematics,
access to finitary objects must be immediate and certain. Hilbert’s
philosophical background was broadly Kantian, as was Bernays’s, who was
closely affiliated with the neo-Kantian school of philosophy around
Leonard Nelson in Göttingen. Hilbert’s characterization of
finitism often refers to Kantian intuition, and the objects of finitism
as objects given intuitively. Indeed, in Kant’s epistemology, immediacy
is a defining characteristic of intuitive knowledge. The question is,
what kind of intuition is at play?
Mancosu (1998b)
identifies a shift in this regard. He argues that whereas
the intuition involved in Hilbert’s early papers was a kind of
perceptual intuition, in later writings (e.g.,
Bernays 1928a)
it is identified as a form of
pure intuition in the Kantian sense. However, at roughly the same
time
Hilbert (1928, 469)
still identifies the kind
of intuition at play as perceptual. In
(1931b,
266–267), Hilbert sees the finite mode
of thought as a separate source of *a priori* knowledge in
addition to pure intuition (e.g., of space) and reason, claiming that
he has “recognized and characterized the third source of knowledge that
accompanies experience and logic.” Both Bernays and Hilbert justify
finitary knowledge in broadly Kantian terms (without however going so
far as to provide a transcendental deduction), characterizing finitary
reasoning as the kind of reasoning that underlies all mathematical, and
indeed, scientific, thinking, and without which such thought would be
impossible. (See
Kitcher 1976
and
Parsons 1998
on the epistemology of finitism, and
Patton 2014 for historical and philosophical
context of Hilbert’s theory of signs.)

### 2.2 Finitarily meaningful propositions and finitary reasoning

The most basic judgments about finitary numerals are those about equality and inequality. In addition, the finite standpoint allows operations on finitary objects. Here the most basic is that of concatenation. The concatenation of the numerals 11 and 111 is communicated as “\(2 + 3\),” and the statement that 11 concatenated with 111 results in the same numeral as 111 concatenated with 11 by “\(2 + 3 = 3 + 2\).” In actual proof-theoretic practice, as well as explicitly in (Hilbert and Bernays, 1934; Bernays, 1930), these basic operations are generalized to operations defined by recursion, paradigmatically, primitive recursion, e.g., multiplication and exponentiation (see Parsons 1998 for philosophical difficulties in relation to exponentiation and 2007 for an extended discussion of intuitive mathematics and finitism). Similarly, finitary judgments may involve not just equality or inequality but also basic decidable properties, such as “is a prime.” This is finitarily acceptable as long as the characteristic function of such a property is itself finitary: For instance, the operation which transforms a numeral to 1 if it is prime and 11 otherwise can be defined by primitive recursion and is hence finitary. Such finitary propositions may be combined by the usual logical operations of conjunction, disjunction, negation, but also bounded quantification. (Hilbert, 1926) gives the example of the proposition that “there is a prime number between \(p + 1\) and \(p! + 1\)” where \(p\) is a certain large prime. This statement is finitarily acceptable since it “serves merely to abbreviate the proposition” that either \(p + 1\) or \(p + 2\) or \(p + 3\) or … or \(p! + 1\) is a prime.

The problematic finitary propositions are those that express general
facts about numerals such as that, for any given numeral \(n,
1+n = n+1\). It is problematic because, as Hilbert puts
it, it “is from the finitist point of view *incapable of being
negated*”
(1926,
378). By this he means
that the contradictory proposition that there is a numeral \(n\)
for which \(1+n \ne n+1\) is not finitarily meaningful.
“One cannot, after all, try out all numbers”
(1928,
470). For the same reason, a finitary
general proposition is not to be understood as an infinite conjunction
but “only as a hypothetical judgment that comes to assert something
when a numeral is given” (ibid.). Even though they are problematic in
this sense, general finitary statements are of particular importance to
Hilbert’s proof theory, since the statement of consistency of a formal
system \(S\) is of such a general form: for any given sequence of
formulas \(P, P\) is not a derivation of a contradiction
in \(S\).

### 2.3 Finitary operations and finitary proof

Of crucial importance to both an understanding of finitism and of Hilbert’s proof theory is the question of what operations and what principles of proof should be allowed from the finitist standpoint. That a general answer is necessary is clear from the demands of Hilbert’s proof theory, i.e., it is not to be expected that given a formal system of mathematics (or even a single sequence of formulas) one can “see” that it is consistent (or that it cannot be a genuine derivation of an inconsistency) the way we can see, e.g., that \(11 + 111 = 111 + 11\). What is required for a consistency proof is an operation which, given a formal derivation, transforms such a derivation into one of a special form, plus proofs that the operation in fact does this and that proofs of the special kind cannot be proofs of an inconsistency. To count as a finitary consistency proof, the operation itself must be acceptable from the finitist standpoint, and the proofs required must use only finitarily acceptable principles.

Hilbert never gave a general account of which operations and methods
of proof are acceptable from the finitist standpoint, but only examples
of operations and methods of inference in contentual finitary number
theory which he accepted as finitary. Contentual induction was accepted
in its application to finitary statements of the hypothetical, general
kind explicitly in
Hilbert (1922b).
He
(1923,
1139) said that intuitive thought
“includes recursion and intuitive induction for finite existing
totalities,” and used exponentiation in an example in
1928.
Bernays (1930)
explained how exponentiation may be understood as a finitary operation
on numerals.
Hilbert and Bernays (1934)
give the only general account of finitary contentual number
theory; according to it, operations defined by primitive recursion and
proofs using induction are finitarily acceptable. All of these methods
can be formalized in a system known as primitive recursive arithmetic
(\(\PRA\)), which allows definitions of functions by primitive
recursion and induction on quantifier-free formulas (ibid.). However,
neither Hilbert nor Bernays ever claimed that *only* primitive
recursive operations count as finitary, and they in fact did use some
non-primitive recursive methods in ostensibly finitary consistency
proofs already in 1923 (see
Tait 2002
and
Zach 2003).

The more interesting conceptual issue is which operations
*should* be considered as finitary. Since Hilbert was less than
completely clear on what the finitary standpoint consists in, there is
some leeway in setting up the constraints, epistemological and
otherwise, an analysis of finitist operation and proof must fulfill.
Hilbert characterized (see above) the objects of finitary number theory
as “intuitively given,” as “surveyable in all their parts,” and said
that their having basic properties must “exist intuitively” for us.
Bernays (1922, 216)
suggests that in finitary
mathematics, only “primitive intuitive cognitions come into play,” and
uses the term “point of view of intuitive evidence” in connection with
finitism
1930,
250. This characterization of
finitism as primarily to do with *intuition* and intuitive
knowledge has been emphasized in particular by
(Parsons, 1998)
who argues that what can count as
finitary on this understanding is not more than those arithmetical
operations that can be defined from addition and multiplication using
bounded recursion. In particular, according to him, exponentiation and
general primitive recursion are not finitarily acceptable.

The thesis that finitism coincides with primitive recursive reasoning has received a forceful defense by (Tait 1981; see also 2002 and 2005b). Tait, in contrast to Parsons, rejects the aspect of representability in intuition as the hallmark of the finitary; instead he takes finitary reasoning to be “a minimal kind of reasoning presupposed by all non-trivial mathematical reasoning about numbers.” and analyzes finitary operations and methods of proof as those that are implicit in the very notion of number as the form of a finite sequence. This analysis of finitism is supported by Hilbert’s contention that finitary reasoning is a precondition for logical and mathematical, indeed any scientific thinking Hilbert (1931b, 267). Since finitary reasoning is that part of mathematics which is presupposed by all non-trivial reasoning about numbers, it is, so Tait, “indubitable” in a Cartesian sense, and this indubitability as all that would be required of finitary reasoning to provide the epistemological grounding of mathematics Hilbert intended it for.

Another interesting analysis of finitary proof, which, however, does not provide as detailed a philosophical justification, was proposed by Kreisel (1960). It yields the result that exactly those functions are finitary which can be proved to be total in first-order arithmetic \(\PA\). It is based on the proof-theoretic concept of a reflection principle; see Zach (2006) for more detail and Dean (2015) for an analysis. Kreisel (1970, Section 3.5) provides another analysis by focusing on what is “visualizable.” The result is the same: finitary provability turns out to be coextensive with provability in \(\PA\).

Tait’s technical analysis yields that the finitistic functions are exactly the primitive recursive ones, and the finitistic number-theoretic truths are exactly those provable in the theory of primitive recursive arithmetic \(\PRA\). It is important to stress that this analysis is not carried out from within the finitist viewpoint itself. Since the general notions of “function” and “proof” are not themselves finitary, the finitist is unable to make sense of Tait’s thesis that everything provable in \(\PRA\) is finitistically true. According to Tait, a proper analysis of finitistic provability must not assume that finitism itself has access to such non-finitistic notions. Kreisel’s approach and some criticisms of Tait that rely on reflection principles or \(\omega\)-rules run afoul of this requirement (see Tait 2002, 2005b). On the other hand, one could argue that \(\PRA\) is too strong a theory to count as a formalization of what is “presupposed by all non-trivial mathematical reasoning about numbers”: there are weaker but non-trivial theories which are related to smaller classes of functions than the primitive recursive ones, such as \(\PV\) and \(\EA\), related to the polynomial-time and Kalmar-elementary functions respectively (see Avigad 2003 on how much mathematics can be carried out in \(\EA)\). Using an analysis along the same lines as Tait’s, Ganea (2010) has arrived at the corresponding class of Kalmar-elementary functions as those that are finitistic.

## 3. Formalism, reductionism and instrumentalism

Weyl (1925)
was a conciliatory reaction to
Hilbert’s proposal in
1922b
and
1923,
which nevertheless contained some
important criticisms. Weyl described Hilbert’s project as replacing
contentual mathematics by a meaningless game of formulas. He noted that
Hilbert wanted to “secure not *truth*, but the
*consistency* of analysis” and suggested a criticism that echoes
an earlier one by Frege: Why should we take consistency of a formal
system of mathematics as a reason to believe in the truth of the
pre-formal mathematics it codifies? Is Hilbert’s meaningless inventory
of formulas not just “the bloodless ghost of analysis”? Weyl suggested
a solution:

[I]f mathematics is to remain a serious cultural concern, then somesensemust be attached to Hilbert’s game of formulae, and I see only one possibility of attributing it (including its transfinite components) an independent intellectual meaning. In theoretical physics we have before us the great example of a [kind of] knowledge of completely different character than the common or phenomenal knowledge that expresses purely what is given in intuition. While in this case every judgment has its own sense that is completely realizable within intuition, this is by no means the case for the statements of theoretical physics. In that case it is ratherthe system as a wholethat is in question if confronted with experience. (Weyl, 1925, 140)

The analogy with physics is striking, and one can find similar ideas in Hilbert’s own writing—perhaps Hilbert was influenced in this by Weyl. Although Hilbert’s first proposals focused exclusively on consistency, there is a noticeable development in Hilbert’s thinking in the direction of a general reductivist project of a sort quite common in the philosophy of science at the time (as was pointed out by Giaquinto 1983). In the second half of the 1920s, Hilbert replaced the consistency program with a conservativity program: Formalized mathematics was to be considered by analogy with theoretical physics. The ultimate justification for the theoretical part lies in its conservativity over “real” mathematics: whenever theoretical, “ideal” mathematics proves a “real” proposition, that proposition is also intuitively true. This justifies the use of transfinite mathematics: it is not only internally consistent, but it proves only true intuitive propositions (and indeed all, since a formalization of intuitive mathematics is part of the formalization of all mathematics).

In
1926,
Hilbert introduced a distinction
between real and ideal formulas. This distinction was not present in
1922b
and only hinted at in
1923.
In the latter, Hilbert presents first a
formal system of quantifier-free number theory about which he says that
“The provable formulae we acquire in this way all have the character of
the finite” (1139). Then the transfinite axioms (i.e., quantifiers) are
added to simplify and complete the theory (1144). Here he draws the
analogy with the method of ideal elements for the first time: “In my
proof theory, the transfinite axioms and formulae are adjoined to the
finite axioms, just as in the theory of complex variables the imaginary
elements are adjoined to the real, and just as in geometry the ideal
constructions are adjoined to the actual” (ibid). When Hilbert, in
1926
explicitly introduces the notion of an
ideal proposition, and in
1928,
when he first
speaks of *real propositions* in addition to the ideal, he is
quite clear that the real part of the theory consists only of
decidable, variable-free formulas. They are supposed to be “directly
capable of verification”—akin to propositions derived from laws of
nature which can be checked by experiment
(1928,
475). The new picture of the program was
this: Classical mathematics is to be formalized in a system which
includes formalizations of all the directly verifiable (by calculation)
propositions of contentual finite number theory. The consistency proof
should show that all real propositions which can be proved by ideal
methods are true, i.e., can be directly verified by finite calculation.
(Actual proofs such as the \(\varepsilon\)-substitution had always been of
such a kind: provide finitary procedures which eliminate transfinite
elements from proofs of real statements, in particular, of \(0 = 1\).)
Indeed, Hilbert saw that something stronger is true: not only does a
consistency proof establish truth of real formulas provable by ideal
methods, but it yields finitary proofs of finitary general propositions
if the corresponding free-variable formula is derivable by ideal
methods
(1928,
474).

Hilbert suggested further restrictions on the theory in addition to
conservativity: simplicity, brevity of proofs, “economy of thought” and
mathematical productivity. The formal system of transfinite logic is
not arbitrary: “This formula game is carried out according to certain
definite rules, in which the *technique of our thinking* is
expressed. […] The fundamental idea of my proof theory is none other
than to describe the activity of our understanding, to make a protocol
of the rules according to which our thinking actually proceeds”
(Hilbert, 1928,
475). When
Weyl (1928)
eventually turned away from
intuitionism (for the reasons, see
Mancosu and Ryckman, 2002),
he emphasized this motivation of Hilbert’s
proof theory: not to turn mathematics into a meaningless game of
symbols, but to turn it into a theoretical science which codifies
scientific (mathematical) practice.

Hilbert’s formalism was thus quite sophisticated: It avoided two crucial objections: (1) If the formulas of the system are meaningless, how can derivability in the system generate any kind of belief? (2) Why accept the system of \(\PA\) and not any other consistent system? Both objections are familiar from Frege; both questions are (in part) answered by a conservativity proof for real statements. For (2), furthermore, Hilbert has a naturalistic criterion of acceptance: we are constrained in the choice of systems by considerations of simplicity, fecundity, uniformity, and by what mathematicians actually do; Weyl would add that the ultimate test of a theory would be its usefulness in physics.

Most philosophers of mathematics writing on Hilbert have read him as
an instrumentalist (including
Kitcher 1976,
Resnik 1980,
Giaquinto 1983,
Sieg 1990,
and in particular
Detlefsen 1986)
in that they read Hilbert’s
explanation that the ideal propositions “have no meaning in
themselves”
(Hilbert, 1926,
381) as claiming that
classical mathematics is a *mere* instrument, and that
statements of transfinite mathematics have no truth value. To the
extent that this is accurate, it must be understood as a methodological
instrumentalism: A successful execution of the proof-theoretic program
would show that one could pretend *as if* mathematics was
meaningless. The analogy with physics is therefore not: transfinite
propositions have no meaning just as propositions involving theoretical
terms have no meaning, but: transfinite propositions require no direct
intuitive meaning just as one does not have to directly see electrons
in order to theorize about them.
Hallett (1990),
taking into account the 19th century mathematical
background from which Hilbert came as well as published and unpublished
sources from Hilbert’s entire career (in particular
Hilbert 1992,
the most extensive discussion of
the method of ideal elements) comes to the following conclusion:

[Hilbert’s treatment of philosophical questions] isnotmeant as a kind of instrumentalist agnosticism about existence and truth and so forth. On the contrary, it is meant to provide a non-skeptical and positive solution to such problems, a solution couched in cognitively accessible terms. And, it appears, the same solution holds for both mathematical and physical theories. Once new concepts or “ideal elements” or new theoretical terms have been accepted, then they exist in the sense in whichanytheoretical entities exist. (Hallett, 1990, 239)

## 4. Hilbert’s Program and Gödel’s incompleteness theorems

There has been some debate over the impact of
Gödel’s
incompleteness theorems on Hilbert’s Program, and whether it was the
first or the second incompleteness theorem that delivered the *coup
de grâce*. Undoubtedly the opinion of those most directly
involved in the developments were convinced that the theorems did have
a decisive impact. Gödel announced the second incompleteness
theorem in an abstract published in October 1930: no consistency proof
of systems such as *Principia*,
Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, or
the systems investigated by Ackermann and von Neumann is possible by
methods which can be formulated in these systems. In the full version
of his paper,
Gödel (1931)
left open the
possibility that there could be finitary methods which are not
formalizable in these systems and which would yield the required
consistency proofs. Bernays’s first reaction in a letter to Gödel
in January 1931 was likewise that “if, as von Neumann does, one takes
it as certain that any and every finitary consideration may be
formalized within the system \(P\)—like you, I regard that in no
way as settled—one comes to the conclusion that a finitary
demonstration of the consistency of \(P\) is impossible”
(Gödel, 2003a,
87).

How do Gödel’s theorems impact Hilbert’s program? Through a careful (“Gödel”-) coding of sequences of symbols (formulas, proofs), Gödel showed that in theories \(T\) which contain a sufficient amount of arithmetic, it is possible to produce a formula \(Pr(x, y)\) which “says” that \(x\) is (the code of) a proof of (the formula with code) \(y\). Specifically, if \(\ulcorner 0 = 1\urcorner\) is the code of the formula \(0 = 1\), then \(Con_T = \forall x \neg Pr(x,\ulcorner 0 = 1\urcorner)\) may be taken to “say” that \(T\) is consistent (no number is the code of a derivation in \(T\) of \(0 = 1)\). The second incompleteness theorem (G2) says that under certain assumptions about \(T\) and the coding apparatus, \(T\) does not prove \(Con_T\). Now suppose there were a finitary consistency proof of \(T\). The methods used in such a proof would presumably be formalizable in \(T\). (“Formalizable” means that, roughly, if the proof uses a finitary operation \(f\) on derivations which transforms any derivation \(D\) into a derivation \(f (D)\) of a simple form; then there is a formula \(F(x, y)\) so that, for all derivations \(D,T \vdash F(\ulcorner D\urcorner ,\ulcorner f (D)\urcorner)\).) The consistency of \(T\) would be finitarily expressed as the general hypothetical that, if \(D\) is any given sequence of symbols, \(D\) is not a derivation in \(T\) of the formula \(0 = 1\). The formalization of this proposition is the formula \(\neg Pr(x,\ulcorner 0 = 1\urcorner)\) in which the variable \(x\) occurs free. If there were a finitary proof of the consistency of \(T\), its formalization would yield a derivation in \(T\) of \(\neg Pr_T (x,\ulcorner 0 = 1\urcorner)\), from which \(Con_T\) can be derived in \(T\) by simple universal generalization on \(x\). Yet, a derivation of \(Con_T\) in \(T\) is ruled out by G2.

As mentioned above, initially Gödel and Bernays thought that the difficulty for the consistency proof of \(\PA\) could be overcome by employing methods which, although not formalizable in \(\PA\), are nonetheless finitary. Whether such methods would be considered finitary according to the original conception of finitism or constitute an extension of the original finitist viewpoint is a matter of debate. The new methods considered included a finitary version of the \(\omega\)-rule proposed by Hilbert (1931b; 1931a). It is fair to say, however, that after about 1934 it has been almost universally accepted that the methods of proof accepted as finitary prior to Gödel’s results are all formalizable in \(\PA\). Extensions of the original finitist standpoint have been proposed and defended on broadly finitary grounds, e.g., Gentzen (1936) defended the use of transfinite induction up to \(\varepsilon_0\) in his consistency proof for \(\PA\) as “indisputable,” Takeuti (1987) gave another defense. Gödel (1958) presented another extension of the finitist standpoint; the work of Kreisel mentioned above may be seen as another attempt to extend finitism while retaining the spirit of Hilbert’s original conception.

A different attempt at providing a way around Gödel’s second
theorem for Hilbert’s Program was proposed by Detlefsen
(1986;
2001;
1979).
Detlefsen presents several lines of
defense, one of which is similar to the one just described: arguing
that a version of the \(\omega\)-rule is finitarily acceptable, although
not capable of formalization (however, see
Ignjatovic 1994).
Detlefsen’s other argument
against the common interpretation of Gödel’s second theorem
focuses on the notion of formalization: That the particular
formalization of “\(T\) is consistent” by Gödel’s formula
\(Con_T\) is not provable does not imply that there
couldn’t be other formulas, which *are* provable in \(T\),
and which have as much right to be called “formalizations of the
consistency of \(T\).” These rely on different formalizations of
the provability predicate \(Pr_T\) than the standard
ones. It is known that formalized consistency statements are unprovable
whenever the provability predicate obeys certain general derivability
conditions. Detlefsen argues that these conditions are not necessary
for a predicate to count as a genuine provability predicate, and indeed
there are provability predicates which violate the provability
conditions and which give rise to consistency formulas which
*are* provable in their corresponding theories. These, however,
depend on non-standard conceptions of provability which would likely
not have been accepted by Hilbert (see also
Resnik 1974,
Auerbach 1992
and
Steiner 1991).

Smorynski (1977)
has argued that already
the first incompleteness theorem defeats Hilbert’s Program. Hilbert’s
aim was not merely to show that formalized mathematics is consistent,
but to do so in a specific way by showing that ideal mathematics can
never lead to conclusions not in accord with real mathematics. Thus, to
succeed, ideal mathematics must be *conservative* over the real
part: whenever formalized ideal mathematics proves a real formula
\(P, P\) itself (or the finitary proposition it
expresses) must be finitarily provable. For Smorynski the real formulas
include not just numerical equalities and combinations thereof, but
also general formulas with free variables but without unbounded
quantifiers.

Now Gödel’s first incompleteness theorem (G1) states that for any sufficiently strong, consistent formal theory \(S\) there is a sentence \(G_S\) which is true but not derivable in \(S\). \(G_S\) is a real sentence according to Smorynski’s definition. Now consider a theory \(T\) which formalizes ideal mathematics and its subtheory \(S\) which formalizes real mathematics. \(S\) satisfies the conditions of G1 and hence \(S\) does not derive \(G_S\). Yet, \(T\), being a formalization of all of mathematics (including what is required to see that \(G_S\) is true), does derive \(G_S\). Hence, we have a real statement which is provable in ideal mathematics and not in real mathematics.

Detlefsen (1986, Appendix; see also
1990) has defended Hilbert’s Program
against this argument as well. Detlefsen argues that
“Hilbertian” instrumentalism escapes the argument from G1
by denying that ideal mathematics must be conservative over the real
part; all that is required is real-soundness. Hilbertian
instrumentalism requires only that the ideal theory not prove anything
which is in conflict with the real theory; it is not required that it
prove *only* real statements which the real theory also
proves. (See Zach 2006 for more on the issue of
conservativity and consistency, the relevant section in
the entry on Gödel
for further discussion, Franks 2009 for a
related defense and re-evaluation of Hilbert’s project, and McCarthy 2016 for an alternative approach to the provability of consistency and G2 due to Gödel himself.)

## 5. Revised Hilbert Programs

Even if no finitary consistency proof of arithmetic can be given, the question of finding consistency proofs is nevertheless of value: the methods used in such proofs, although they must go beyond Hilbert’s original sense of finitism, might provide genuine insight into the constructive content of arithmetic and stronger theories. What Gödel’s result showed was that there can be no absolute consistency proof of all of mathematics; hence work in proof theory after Gödel concentrated on relative results, both: relative to the system for which a consistency proof was given, and relative to the proof methods used.

Reductive proof theory in this sense has followed two traditions:
the first, mainly carried out by proof theorists following Gentzen and
Schütte, has pursued a program of what is called *ordinal
analysis*, and is exemplified by Gentzen’s first consistency proof
of \(\PA\) by induction up to \(\varepsilon_0 .
\varepsilon_0\) is a certain transfinite (though countable)
ordinal, however, “induction up to \(\varepsilon_0\)” in the sense
used here is not a genuinely transfinite procedure. Ordinal analysis
does not operate with infinite ordinal numbers, but rather with
*ordinal notation systems* which themselves can be formalized
in very weak (essentially, finitary) systems. An ordinal analysis of a
system \(T\) is given if: (a) one can produce an ordinal notation
system which mimics the ordinals less than some ordinal \(\alpha_T\)
so that (b) it can be proved finitarily that the formalization
\(TI(\alpha_T)\) of the principle of induction up to \(\alpha_T\)
implies the consistency of \(T\) (i.e., \(S \vdash
TI(\alpha_T)\rightarrow Con_T)\) and (c) \(T\) proves \(TI(\beta)\)
for all \(\beta \lt \alpha_T\) (\(S\) is a theory formalizing finitary
metamathematics and is generally a weak sub-theory of \(T)\). To have
any foundational significance it is also required that one can give a
constructive argument for transfinite induction up to \(\alpha_T\). As
mentioned above, this was done for by Gentzen and Takeuti for
\(\varepsilon_0\), the proof theoretic ordinal of \(\PA\), but becomes
more difficult and of progressively questionable philosophical
significance for stronger theories.

A philosophically more satisfactory continuation of Hilbert’s
Program in proof theoretic terms has been suggested by Kreisel
(1983;
1968)
and
Feferman
(Feferman, 1988;
Feferman, 1993a).
This work proceeds from a
wider conception of Hilbert’s Program as an attempt to justify ideal
mathematics by restricted means. In this conception, the aim of
Hilbert’s proof theory was to show that, at least as far as a certain
class of real propositions is concerned, ideal mathematics does not go
beyond real mathematics. A finitary consistency proof of the kind
envisaged by Hilbert would have accomplished this: if ideal mathematics
proves a real proposition, then this proposition is already provable by
real (i.e., finitary) methods. In a sense this *reduces* ideal
mathematics to real mathematics. A *proof-theoretic reduction*
of a theory \(T\) to a theory \(S\) shows that, as far as a
certain class of propositions is concerned, if \(T\) proves a
proposition, then \(S\) proves it too, and the proof of this fact
is itself finitary. Hilbert’s proof theoretic program can then be seen
to be a search for a proof theoretic reduction of all of mathematics to
finitary mathematics; in a relativized program one looks for reductions
of theories weaker than all of classical mathematics to theories often
stronger than finitary mathematics. Proof theorists have obtained a
number of such results, including reductions of theories which on their
face require a significant amount of ideal mathematics for their
justification (e.g., subsystems of analysis) to finitary systems.
(Feferman, 1993b)
has used such results in
combination with other results that show that most, if not all, of
scientifically applicable mathematics can be carried out in systems for
which such reductions are available to argue against the
indispensability argument
in the
philosophy of mathematics. The philosophical significance of such proof
theoretic reductions is currently the subject of debate
(Hofweber, 2000;
Feferman, 2000).

The program of so-called reverse mathematics developed by, in particular, Friedman and Simpson, is another continuation of Hilbert’s program. In the face of Gödel’s results showing that not all of classical mathematics can be reduced to the finitary, they seek to answer the question: how much of classical mathematics can be so reduced? Reverse mathematics seeks to give a precise answer to this question by investigating which theorems of classical mathematics are provable in weak subsystems of analysis which are reducible to finitary mathematics (in the sense discussed in the preceding paragraph). A typical result is that the Hahn-Banach theorem of functional analysis is provable in a theory known as \(WKL_0\) (for “weak König lemma”); \(WKL_0\) is conservative over \(\PRA\) for \(\Pi^{0}_2\) sentences (i.e., sentences of the form \(\forall x\exists yA(x, y)\). (See Simpson 1988 for an overview and Simpson 1999 for a technical treatment.)

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