Notes to Hobbes’ Philosophy of Science

1. Despite lack of widespread acceptance, Hobbes’ natural philosophy did have some influence, for example, upon the early Leibniz (for discussion, see Garber 2009: 13ff.).

2. Hobbes most often used the term ‘conception’ rather than ‘idea’, but he also frequently used ‘phantasm’.

3. I cite Hobbes’ Latin Works and English Works as OL and EW, respectively, followed by volume number and page number. So, for example, OL I.82 refers to page 82 in volume I of Hobbes’ Latin Works.

4. Additional examples where Hobbes explicitly cites the use of a principle from geometry within an explanation include De Corpore XXVI.6 (OL I.349), XXVI.8 (OL I.353), and XXVI.10 (OL I.357), De Homine 2.2 (OL II.8), and Dialogus Physicus, sive De natura Aeris Conjectura sumpta ab Experimentis nuper Londini habitis in Collegio Greshamensi (1661, 1668). Regarding the latter, see Adams (2017) for discussion of the use of geometrical principles within that work.

5. This period overlaps with Hobbes’ public embarrassment concerning attempts to square the circle even in the face of repeated criticisms from John Wallis (for discussion of the Hobbes-Wallis debate, see Jesseph 1999).

6. For details regarding the publication of this work, see Shapin and Schaffer (1985: 345–346). I cite Simon Schaffer’s translation of the 1661 edition of Dialogus Physicus from Shapin and Schaffer (1985) as DP followed by the page number (I also provide the corresponding citation to the Latin Works edition).

7. For a discussion of some of the many reviews by philosophers and historians of science of this influential work, see Achbari (2017).

8. See Hattab (2011) for discussion of differences and commonalities among those who self-identified as or have been categorized by scholars as advancing some form of mechanical philosophy.

9. On the distinction between speculative and experimental natural philosophy, see Anstey (2005).

10. For example, Hobbes’ translations of Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War and Aristotle’s Rhetoric.

11. For discussion and criticisms of the definitivist view, see Deigh (2003), Hoekstra (2003), Lloyd (2009: 151–210), and Murphy (2000).

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