Hobbes’ Philosophy of Science

First published Fri Mar 8, 2019; substantive revision Mon Jun 5, 2023

Thomas Hobbes is rightly regarded as a monumental figure in the history of philosophy, especially for his masterpiece Leviathan (1651 in English; 1668 in Latin). The scholarly literature on Leviathan is voluminous and has been especially focused upon issues in political philosophy, such as representation and authorization, sovereignty and absolutism, contracts and covenants, and the relationship of civil authority to religion, among others. Since its printing the portrayal in Leviathan XIII of humans in their natural state—an existence that is “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short”—has struck the imagination of many of Hobbes’ readers, leaving many seeing Hobbes as pessimistic at best or hopelessly unrealistic at worst.

In Hobbes’ own time, however, he was also well-known, even if sometimes ridiculed, for his views in mathematics, natural philosophy, and optics. In A Minute or First Draught of the Optiques (1646), Hobbes’ own assessment of his work is laudatory:

…I shall deserve the Reputation of having been the first to lay the ground of two Sciences, this of Opticques, the most curious, and that other of natural Justice, which I have done in my book de Cive, the most profitable of all other. (Hobbes 1646 [1983: 622])

Although some contemporaries saw promise in Hobbes’ optics, such as Mersenne, who published Hobbes’ work in this area in 1644 in Ballistica, in the years following the publication of Leviathan Hobbes’ pursuits apart from political philosophy were taken less seriously. There are a number of possible explanations for this decline in the opinion of Hobbes’ competence in these areas, including his numerous attempts to square the circle, the association of his views with atheism by many critics, and the conflicts he had with Robert Boyle at the time of the rise of experimental philosophy. These all contributed to some extent to Hobbes’ exclusion from the Royal Society when it was founded.

If Hobbes’ mathematical and natural-philosophical endeavors failed to be taken seriously by his contemporaries near the end of his life, what purpose is served by understanding these failed attempts?[1] Apart from interest in them on their own terms as episodes in the history of science and philosophy, there are several reasons why we may find these areas of Hobbes’ thought valuable for study. First, Hobbes himself understood his political philosophy, or as he called it “civil philosophy”, to be a science capable of demonstration. Thus, understanding his general views about the nature of scientific demonstration promises to shed light on the way in which he saw civil philosophy as scientific. Second, Hobbes understood natural-philosophical explanations in physics as needing to make use of mathematical principles to count, as he says, as “true physics” and to be useful for improving humans’ quality of life. This claim about the use of mathematics to explain natural phenomena may seem banal to a twenty-first century reader, but it was not so to many in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Hobbes’ natural philosophy thus situates him within the shift from qualitative to quantitative physics. Third, Hobbes’ conflicts with the Royal Society show us not only his views of the role of experimentation but also contextualize the rise of experimentalism. After discussing Hobbes’ criteria for scientific knowledge, this entry will address each of these areas.

1. The Criteria for Scientific Knowledge

The fundamental aspects of Hobbes’ materialism are well known. Hobbes believed that everything that exists is a body, and that bodies are sometimes in motion and sometimes at rest. Furthermore, he held that the only essential property of body is extension, or magnitude. All other apparent properties of bodies, such as those of color, taste, and firmness, are the result of motions from bodies being continued through media to humans’ sense organs. These motions, when continued into the bodies of perceivers, are constitutive of conceptions, or ideas.[2] Ideas of the objects of sense are caused by motions from things outside of perceivers and those continued motions constitute ideas and serve to individuate one idea from another. Thus, all ideas in the human mind are either from sense perception or derived from ideas gained from sense perception (Leviathan I; LEV 22).

This account of the origin and nature of ideas shows Hobbes’ clear empiricist leanings; however, Hobbes does not hold that knowers should uncritically accept what the ideas of sense objects seem to represent. Like many other philosophers in the seventeenth century, Hobbes held that our knowledge of the external world was not direct but was instead mediated by ideas. This recognition that “we compute nothing but our phantasms or ideas” (Hobbes 1642–43 [1973: 450]; cf. OL I.82)[3] resulted in two worries about human knowledge.

First, knowers must examine what resemblance ideas in the mind have to objects in the outside world. This worry seems similar, at first glance, to the concerns of Descartes’ meditator in the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641), but Hobbes aimed to provide a solution that made no reference whatsoever to God or to anything at all immaterial, such as a soul. In the early work Elements of Law, composed in 1640 and published in 1650 (EL), Hobbes offered arguments that attempted to show that ideas are distinct from that which they purport to represent, and he claimed that as a result we could know that the so-called secondary qualities, such as color, taste, and sound, were not in bodies. To do this, he used everyday experience to provide evidence for his claims:

Every man hath so much experience as to have seen the sun and other visible objects by reflection in the water and in glasses, and this alone is sufficient for this conclusion: that colour and image may be there where the thing seen is not. (Elements of Law II.5; EL 3)

He used similar considerations in Leviathan I, concluding that we can know, for example, that color and sound are not in bodies since if they were “they could not bee severed from them, as by glasses, and in Ecchoes by reflection” (LEV 24).

A second worry that follows from Hobbes’ view that we have only mediated access to bodies in the world relates to the possibility of gaining knowledge of the causes of natural events. Most of the ideas that knowers possess of bodies are received passively. When interested in the cause of some phenomenon, all one may examine are ideas caused by the motions of the bodies involved. However, when interested in, say, the cause of billiard ball B being put into motion after apparent contact with moving billiard ball A, one does not find an idea of A being the cause of B’s motion. Even if one were to look to a lower ‘level’, as it were, smaller than billiard balls by use of a microscope, one would not find any idea of A’s motion causing B’s motion. Hobbes diagnosed this lack of causal knowledge by highlighting that human agents are not the makers of natural phenomena. He thought that makers gain this causal knowledge by attending to their constructions through the process of creating something. Since we lack the ideas of the causes of individual phenomena from our experience, Hobbes claimed that we cannot know their actual causes at all. All that we may know are possible causes. Hobbes asserted in Six Lessons to the Professors of Mathematiques (1656) that because “of natural bodies we know not the construction but seek it from the effects” we can know “only of what [the causes] may be” (EW VII.184).

This second worry brings to the fore Hobbes’ condition for the possibility of scientific knowledge, namely, the possession of (actual) causal knowledge. He claimed that

we are said to know [scire] some effect when we know what its causes are, in what subject they are, in what subject they introduce the effect and how they do it. Therefore, this is the knowledge [scientia] τοῦ διότι or of causes. (OL I.59)

Having scientific knowledge required one to know the actual causes of a phenomenon, not its mere possible causes. However, the only way to possess such causal knowledge is to act as a maker, as God did in the case of natural things.

This restriction that Hobbes made allowed him to consider only geometry and civil philosophy as bodies of scientific knowledge, since in only these two disciplines do humans make the objects that they study. In Six Lessons to the Professors of Mathematiques, Hobbes distinguished these two disciplines from all others by connecting them to making:

Geometry therefore is demonstrable for the lines and figures from which we reason are drawn and described by ourselves and civil philosophy is demonstrable because we make the commonwealth ourselves. (EW VII.184)

In the three following sections, this entry considers ways in which these two bodies of scientific knowledge are used within other disciplines to provide an epistemic grounding for the explanations therein. In natural philosophy, or physics, Hobbes borrowed geometrical principles to provide the cause—the reason ‘why’—for many phenomena, while the making of the commonwealth, and its laws, out of the state of nature was the genesis of the science of civil philosophy.

2. The Use of Mathematics and Hypotheses in Scientific Explanations

There has been debate among scholars of Hobbes’ thought about the relationship of the different parts of his philosophy to one another. Much of the focus has been upon the methodological statements in Part I of De Corpore, and scholars have traditionally divided over whether Hobbes understood philosophy as unified or disunified. However, more recent scholarship has drawn attention to Hobbes’ practice of explanation, such as the explanations found in De Corpore Part IV, and has argued that aspects of both the unified and disunified views track Hobbes’ discussions and practice while those views on their own miss that Hobbes explicitly borrowed principles from mathematics to use in natural philosophy (and provided citations to show this activity). This section will discuss these three approaches to understanding how the parts of Hobbes’ system fit with one another and then provide an example of an explanation in Hobbes’ natural philosophy from De Corpore XXV.

First, the unified view. A significant number of scholars have argued that Hobbes understood his philosophy as unified by deductive connections between the different parts (for example, Martinich 2005; Peters 1967; Shapin & Schaffer 1985; Watkins 1965). A stronger version of this unified view understands Hobbes to be a type of reductionist, wherein descriptions of macroscopic bodies, such as humans and rocks, ultimately reduce to microscopic bodies responsible for all phenomena (for example, Hampton 1986; Ryan 1970). For example, Alan Ryan articulates the reductionist view as follows:

Hobbes believed as firmly as one could that all behaviour, whether of animate or inanimate matter, was ultimately to be explained in terms of particulate motion: the laws governing the motions of discrete material particles were the ultimate laws of the universe, and in this sense psychology must be rooted in physiology and physiology in physics, while the social sciences, especially the technology of statecraft, must be rooted in psychology. (1970: 102–103)

There is some textual support for understanding the parts of Hobbes’ system as either deductively or reductively linked together since he did at times talk of the parts of philosophy as beginning in first philosophy and leading from one to another. For example, he asserted in De Corpore VI.6 that by beginning at first principles, one will move from first philosophy to geometry, and from geometry to physics. He continued by claiming that “after physics we come to morals” and, indeed, Hobbes claims that moral philosophy must be studied after physics because the passions have “their causes in sense-experience and imagination” (CSL 299; OL I.64).

However, immediately following these statements that seem to indicate that Hobbes took his philosophy to be tightly knit together, he argued that “civil and moral philosophy do not so adhere to one another, but that they may be severed” (EW I.73). This separation is permissible, Hobbes claimed, because in addition to learning moral philosophy from first principles each individual could simply study the motions of their own mind and gain knowledge of the same principles. That such separation could occur is difficult to explain for a strong version of the unified view because it makes it appear that Hobbes thought that one could develop civil philosophy simply by introspecting, entirely independently of any work in moral philosophy, natural philosophy, and first philosophy.

A further difficulty for the unified view is that even if Hobbes did see the connection between, say, physics and moral philosophy as deductive, it is not obvious how that deduction would work because moral philosophy must add content about human passions (endeavors) that is not contained within—and thus not deducible from—physics. For example, although the concept ‘endeavor’ is introduced in physics, for it to be used in moral philosophy the concepts of ‘appetite’ and ‘aversion’, which are properties of human bodies, must be added to it for use (Malcolm 2002: 147). One way to avoid this difficulty for the unified view would be to provide evidence that Hobbes made explicit the reduction relationship between concepts like ‘appetite’ and ‘aversion’ and the concept of ‘endeavour’, showing how one can reduce claims about human bodies to claims about microscopic bodies. Hobbes does not appear to do this anywhere in the corpus. However, even if a strong version of the unified view faces this difficulty, the presence of ‘endeavor’ throughout Hobbes’ philosophy shows that it was a foundational concept (see Jesseph 2016).

The second major view of the relationship of the parts of Hobbes’ philosophy to one another is what we can call the disunified view (for example, see Robertson 1886; Taylor 1938; Warrender 1957). Some of the motivation behind the disunified account seems to be a desire to free Hobbes from what is prima facie a case of deriving normative claims relating to the commonwealth in civil philosophy from descriptive claims related to human psychology and, ultimately, more general claims in natural philosophy (especially Taylor 1938). However, in its attempts to rescue Hobbes from a version of the so-called naturalistic fallacy, the disunified account fails to take seriously Hobbes’ claims about the unity of his philosophy. Furthermore, it neglects that many of Hobbes’ contemporaries (for example, Bramhall) saw Hobbes’ views in natural philosophy as having far-reaching consequences for other areas of philosophy.

A third view has more recently been offered that seeks to carve a middle path between the unified and disunified interpretations. We can call this view the mixed-mathematics view (for example, Adams 2016, 2017; Biener 2016). This understanding of Hobbes’ system agrees with the worry raised above for the unified account that ‘higher’ levels, such as geometry, do not contain the concepts used in ‘lower’ level explanations. For example, although geometrical principles are used in Hobbes’ optical explanations those geometrical principles do not contain concepts such as ‘light’ or ‘color’. Some evidence for this lack of containment claim can be found on the well-known “Table of the Several Subjects of Science” in Leviathan IX. The “sciences” on this table are listed on the right-most section and their subjects are to the immediate left. The subject of the science of optics, for example, is all of the “consequences from vision”, and these stem from “Physics or consequences from qualities”. The science of geometry, however, has as its subject the “consequences from quantity, and motion determined… by figure” and these stem not from physics but from “consequences from the accidents common to all bodies natural; which are quantity and motion”.

Instead of seeing this “adding to” as evidence for the disunified view, the mixed-mathematics view understands Hobbes having seen certain disciplines as providing causal principles (what he called the ‘why’) while other disciplines provided the facts relevant to a given domain (what he called the ‘that’). Textual support for this understanding of Hobbes’ system can be found in Hobbes’ methodological statements about natural philosophy as well as in his practice of explanation.

As mentioned already, Hobbes identified scientific knowledge (scientia) with knowing causes, and in his discussions he used language germane to Aristotle’s distinction between the ‘why’ and the ‘that’. We have seen already Hobbes’ commitment to knowing through the causes, but the complete passage from De Corpore VI.1 provides further detail about Hobbes’ views on the two types of knowledge, as follows:

We are said to know [scire] some effect when we know what its causes are, in what subject they are, in what subject they introduce the effect and how they do it. Therefore, this is the knowledge [scientia] τοῦ διότι or of causes. All other knowledge [cognitio], which is called τοῦ ὅτι, is either sense experience or imagination remaining in sense experience or memory (De Corpore VI.1; CSL 287–289).

Two types of knowledge thus emerge. There is knowledge from sense experience, retained as imagination and eventually as memory (more below on how this can develop into prudence), and there is scientific knowledge. When reflecting in De Homine on the status of claims in physics, Hobbes claims that what he calls “true physics” must be a mixture of both of these types of knowledge:

[…] since one cannot proceed in reasoning about natural things that are brought about by motion from the effects to the causes without a knowledge of those things that follow from that kind of motion; and since one cannot proceed to the consequences of motions without a knowledge of quantity, which is geometry; nothing can be demonstrated by physics without something also being demonstrated a priori. Therefore physics (I mean true physics) [vera physica], that depends on geometry, is usually numbered among the mixed mathematics [mathematicas mixtas]. [.] Therefore those mathematics are pure which (like geometry and arithmetic) revolve around quantities in the abstract so that work [in them] requires no knowledge of the subject; those mathematics are mixed, in truth, which in their reasoning some quality of the subject is also considered, as is the case with astronomy, music, physics, and the parts of physics that can vary on account of the variety of species and the parts of the universe. (MC 42; OL II.93)

These two statements concerning the status of different types of knowledge and the requirement to mix “quantities in the abstract” with “some quality of the subject” in physics can aid in making sense of Hobbes’ actual explanatory practice. What does it mean for physics to be “mixed mathematics”? For Hobbes it means that for many explanations one will first establish that some fact is the case by appealing to sense experience, but to give the reason why one must borrow a principle from geometry.

At several places in De Corpore, Hobbes appears to carry out the mixed-mathematics ideal by showing, with a citation, that he used a causal principle from geometry within an explanation that included details about the “quality of the subject.” For example, in De Corpore XXV, the chapter with which Hobbes began Part IV, Hobbes appears to have done just this when he explained sensation. In that explanation, he appealed both to “qualities of the subject”, such as the claim based upon experience that “we may observe… that our phantasms or ideas are not always the same” (EW I.389), and by citing and using causal principles from earlier in the work (see discussion of this explanation in Adams 2016).[4]

Such behavior—borrowing and citing a principle within an explanation—would be difficult to explain on the picture offered by the unified view since Hobbes offers no justification for this practice other than phrases such as “I have shown besides…”. There is no deduction anywhere offered within Hobbes’ actual explanatory practice that would give reason to think that Hobbes understood the use of these principles from elsewhere in the work in that way. Likewise, it is difficult to make sense of this activity within Hobbes’ actual practice if we adopt the disunified view of Hobbes’ philosophy, since by using principles from elsewhere in the system, and especially by explicitly citing them, Hobbes is signaling that the parts of his system did fit together, even if not in the strong reductive sense of the unified view. The next section will describe Hobbes’ view that work in first philosophy and geometry must be done prior to experiments.

3. Hobbes on Experimentation: Conflict with Robert Boyle and the Royal Society

Hobbes’ conflict with Robert Boyle concerning the nature of natural philosophy in general, and the air-pump experiments in particular, took place over several years and in a series of publications.[5] Hobbes wrote Dialogus Physicus (1661; a second version appeared in 1668)[6] as a dialogue aimed at criticizing Boyle’s New Experiments Physico-Mechanical (1660). Boyle responded to various criticisms in works such as An Examen of Mr. T. Hobbes his Dialogus Physicus de Natura Aëris (1662), An Examen of Mr. Hobbes’ Doctrine about Cold (1665), and Animadversions upon Mr. Hobbes’ Problemata de Vacuo (1674). The most comprehensive and influential treatment of this period of Hobbes’ life is Shapin and Schaffer’s Leviathan and the Air-Pump (1985).[7] This section will focus upon Hobbes’ criticisms of the air-pump experiments in the Dialogus Physicus with an aim of showing how they illuminate our understanding of Hobbes’ natural philosophy.

Most generally both Boyle and Hobbes viewed the natural world as composed of bits of matter in motion. Even if there were some points of agreement between the versions of mechanical philosophy offered by both Boyle and Hobbes,[8] there are important differences. A crucial difference between the two relates to the status (or lack thereof) of Laws of Nature. While Boyle talked about the laws of nature as established by God (see the section on Laws of Nature in the entry on Boyle), Hobbes restricted discussion of laws to the laws of human conduct discovered by those who escape the state of nature and create a commonwealth. In contrast to laws of the natural world, Hobbes articulated a priori principles of motion at the foundation of his physics in De Corpore VIII.19 and IX.7. Rather than being known as laws of motion, issued by some divine lawmaker, these Hobbesian principles of motion are explicated by thought experiments and seem to rely upon a version of the principle of sufficient reason (Jesseph 2006: 132). Although Hobbes held that they were true of all human experience, since Hobbes holds that we cannot know the actual causes of natural phenomena he would have to admit that nature might, unbeknownst to us, act otherwise. However, despite these differences, the primary dissimilarity that emerges between Hobbes and Boyle concerning the air-pump experiments is one of method as it relates to the status of experiments/experience (see the section on Philosophy of Experiment in the entry on Boyle).

Given that Hobbes was convinced of the impossibility of knowing the actual causes of natural phenomena, he held that any phenomenon admits of multiple possible explanations. This should not be taken to imply that Hobbes saw all explanations, and thus all possible causes or suppositions, as standing on equal footing. Instead, Hobbes held that work in first philosophy and geometry must be completed prior to attempting to make any explanations in natural philosophy. This seems to be what Hobbes meant in the De Homine extended quotation provided above when he said that “nothing can be demonstrated by physics without something also being demonstrated a priori” (MC 42; OL II.93). When giving an explanation, Hobbes held that one should ideally appeal to those causes that are demonstrable from geometry when mixed with facts and rule out those that are not intelligible according to geometrical principles.

In contrast, Boyle’s method prescribed that instead of bringing causal principles to an experiment and expecting to explain some phenomenon by appeal to those principles, one should attempt to arrive at a supposition that would explain a phenomenon only after repeated, careful experiments. Thomas Sprat detailed the care taken in the design of experiments and the manner in which Royal Society members were formed into committees that shared parts of an experiment so that “[b]y this union of eyes, and hands” they were able to gain “a full comprehension of the object in all its appearances” (Sprat 1667: 85).

We can make sense of Hobbes’ direct criticisms of Boyle’s prioritization of experiment with this methodological difference in mind. Hobbes’ view of the foundational role played by first philosophy and mathematics over experiment/experience is clear when he claimed in Dialogus Physicus that

…ingenuity is one thing and method is another. Here method is needed. The causes of those things done by motion are to be investigated through a knowledge of motion, the knowledge of which, the noblest part of geometry, is hitherto untouched. (DP 347; OL IV.236)

According to Hobbes, then, one must have geometrical principles already in place to aid in choosing a supposition before engaging in experiments. Unlike the Royal Society’s aim to have multiple members examine the same object, Hobbes emphasized the need for individual conceptual clarity, something that could be accomplished from an armchair.

This criticism from Hobbes, and Boyle’s rebuttals relying upon evidence from experiments, could be seen as a conflict of Boyle’s experimental natural philosophy against a form of speculative natural philosophy.[9] However, it is important to avoid taking Hobbes’ criticisms of Boyle’s method to imply that Hobbes completely eschewed experiment/experience while engaging in natural-philosophical explanations. Indeed, Hobbes held that both natural history and civil history are “useful (no, indeed necessary) for philosophy” (CSL 189; OL I.9). Experiment/experience play the role of establishing that some phenomenon occurs, what we have seen Hobbes called the ‘that’, but one should never hope, according to Hobbes, to glean a possible cause from mere observations, even if those observations were carefully documented and repeated many times.

This is clear when in the Dialogus Physicus Hobbes, speaking through speaker A, often granted the observational reports of the experimenters without question. For example, speaker A does not question what the experimenters claim they observed regarding a bladder that had been placed inside the air-pump and weighed, noting “They can be certain that the scale in which the bladder is, is more depressed than the other, their eyes bearing witness” (DP 369; OL IV.261). Instead of criticizing the experimenters’ reliance upon observations, speaker A argues that the experimenters cannot know, in the case of this explanation, what the cause of the scale being depressed is because their posited cause (the “natural gravity” of the air) does not allow them to explain why the scale is depressed after the air-pump is engaged. In contrast, speaker A offers a possible cause that is borrowed, with an explicit citation, from Hobbes’ geometrical account of “simple circle motion” and “fermentation” developed in De Corpore 21.5 (Adams 2017).

4. Hobbes on the Value of Using Scientia in Natural Philosophy

The preceding sections have outlined Hobbes’s views concerning why principles from geometry can be used within explanations in natural philosophy and his claim that before engaging in experimentation one must have principles from geometry ready for use. Still one might wonder why Hobbes thought that this approach, inspired by “mixed mathematics”, would be more successful than the methods of Boyle and his colleagues in the Royal Society. Indeed, what was the aim of engaging in natural philosophy according to Hobbes? This section describes Hobbes’ view that the aim of natural philosophy is to bring positive benefits to humans’ quality of life and then contrasts Hobbes’s view on the usefulness and limitations of “prudence” with the usefulness of natural philosophy that employs scientia.

As mentioned already, Hobbes is well known for holding that all ideas in the mind are either from sense or derived from those that are (Leviathan I; LEV 22). Hobbes also linked “trains” of ideas in the mind to sense by asserting that just as “we have no Imagination, whereof we have not formerly had Sense, in whole, or in parts; so we have no Transition from one Imagination to another, whereof we never had the like before in our Sense” (Leviathan III; LEV 38). Hobbes divided these trains of ideas into those that are guided and those that are unguided. Unguided trains explain what happens when the human mind wanders from idea to idea, such as when daydreaming. Hobbes described these unguided trains as the “wild ranging of the mind”, and he noted that some might think that the connecting points in such trains are by chance even if they are not. He compared such unguided trains to a dialogue between conversants that began on one topic (the present civil war) but over time seemed to drift to other topics by chance (concluding with a question about the price of a Roman penny). Although the connecting points between these topics of conversation (and the trains of ideas they signify in each conversant’s mind) may not be immediately obvious, Hobbes suggested that there was a coherence to each transition. Hobbes traced this coherence in the example he provided as follows:

… the Thought of the warre, introduced the Thought of the delivering up the King to his Enemies; The Thought of that, brought in the Thought of the delivering up of Christ; and that again the Thought of the 30 pence, which was the price of that treason: and thence easily followed that malicious question; and all this in a moment of time; for Thought is quick. (Leviathan III; LEV 40).

Hobbes intended the comparison between this example of a conversation and the way that unguided trains of ideas move from idea to idea to have a general output: no matter how seemingly disconnected the links of any train of ideas may seem, there is always a coherent explanation, whether it is obvious or not, that would explain them.

In contrast to the seemingly disconnected wanderings of the mind that occur with unguided trains, Hobbes saw guided trains of ideas as transitions from idea to idea that were investigated by the mind with some end or goal in view. Say that someone desired to eat a delicious dish that incorporated a particular type of meat and certain spices and herbs. If they desired to bring about that result, they would search through the trains of ideas in their mind, received from past sense experiences, until they found trains that terminated in that goal. When they found a train that had the end result that they were seeking, they would trace back, idea by idea, until they found a “beginning” that was within their current ability to produce (Leviathan III; LEV 40). Continuing the example of a desired dish, say that the individual found that a prior train of ideas that termined with the desired end began with harvesting a particular herb at a particular time of year. They would attempt to bring that “beginning” about and, if successful, would move on to the next idea in the train. There are no guarantees that this would work, since the links in the train may be merely probablistically connected to one another. Hobbes held that humans and non-human animals shared this form of reasoning, which he identified as a type of causal inquiry: “…when of an effect imagined, wee seek the causes, or means to produce it” (Leviathan III; LEV 40). Given the limitations mentioned already related to knowing the causes of natural phenomena, Hobbes could only have meant that possible causes can be identified by this process.

Hobbes connects prudence with an ability to engage in this type of reasoning on a broader scale. Individuals who have acquired much experience, and thus have a large stock of trains of ideas at their disposal, can make predictions about future events that may occur. For example, on the basis of cooking hundreds of dishes with hundreds of ingredients, a prudent individual could look at a given list of ingredients and predict whether the outcome will likely be delicious or not. Hobbes thought that the more experience such an individual had, the better the prediction would be: “…by how much one man has more experiences of things past, than another; by so much also he is more Prudent” (Leviathan III; LEV 42). Prudence is valuable for the human knower, but no matter how useful prudence may be, Hobbes thought that it could never arise above being based upon mere associational connections between ideas. Instances of A have always been followed by B, so the prudent person would reason, thus the A that has presently occurred will likely be followed by B. Hobbes thought that this type of prediction by means of associations amounted to a mere presumption of what the future would look like (Leviathan III; LEV 44). In other words, this inference required “supposing like events will follow like actions” (Leviathan III; LEV 42), but that supposition might prove false and the inference would fail. Furthermore, any difference between prior antecedents and a current initial condition could result in a failure on the part of the prudent individual to predict successfully, as Hobbes noted: “…the omission of every little circumstance altering the effect, frustrateth the expectation of the most Prudent” (Leviathan XLVI; LEV 1052). While useful in many everyday situations, Hobbes thought that prudence showed its limitations when a knower encountered a novel situation.

If predictions made upon the basis of associations among ideas were the extent of human knowledge of natural phenomena, it would seem that Hobbes should have wholeheartedly endorsed the approach of the experimental philosophy championed by Boyle and others. What are Boylean experiments if not repeated experiences in which one tries to control for potential confounding variables, at least according to how Hobbes saw them (Boyle would not agree with this characterization; see the section on Philosophy of Experiment in the entry on Boyle)? Hobbes saw experienced-based prudence as useful, but he denied that it counted as true knowledge of the future, which he held was available only to the one by whose “will” an event happens (Leviathan III; LEV 44). Hobbes’s solution for moving beyond mere associations required knowers to play an active role by creating artificial objects (like the objects of geometry). Such knowledge (scientia) was more useful for predictions because it provided power to its holders, as he noted in De Corpore 1.6: “knowledge is the for the sake of power [Scientia propter potentiam]” (OL I.6).

Unlike association-based predictions, which are limited by the extent to which the prior antecedents resemble a current scenario and rest on a presumption that the future will resemble the past, knowing the causes of some event because one brought it about by one’s will allowed one to understand its true nature. Hobbes thought that this “power” provided direct benefits that improved the quality of human living, such as the marking of “moments in time” and “mapping the face of the earth” (OL I.6–7). Similarly, the science of civil philosophy (discussed more in the next section) could help prevent civil war and other calamities (OL I.8). Hobbes recognized that many citizens may not see the value of scientia because they fail to understand it: “For Science is of that nature, as none can understand it to be, but such as in good measure have attayned it” (Leviathan X; LEV 134). Furthermore, he admitted that many citizens would confuse the cause of success in the “arts of publique use”; although the reason why such arts produce effective fortifications and other “Instruments of War” lies in their use of principles from the science of geometry, many will think that the inventor of such instruments is responsible and because of this “the Midwife [the artificer] pass[es] with the vulgar for the Mother” when the “mother” is really mathematics (Leviathan X; LEV 134).

If the solution to moving beyond association-based prudence was to use geometrical principles within natural philosophy, why did Hobbes think this? As mentioned already, in Six Lessons (1656) Hobbes claimed that because “of natural bodies we know not the construction but seek it from the effects” we can know “only of what [the causes] may be” (EW VII.184). A claim like this might make it seem like the natural philosopher simply guesses cause might be responsible for a given phenomenon, but Hobbes held that not all possible causes are on equal epistemic footing. Hobbes’s method of natural philosophy that mixes mathematical principles (the ‘why’) with observations from experience (the ‘that’) rejected what Hobbes thought of as a merely passive approach to understanding nature. In contrast, in the Letter to the Reader of De Corpore Hobbes compares philosophizing to God’s act of the creation of the world:

If you are going to pay serious attention to philosophy, let your reason hover over the confused abyss of your thoughts and experiences. The confused things must be shaken violently, distinguished, and ordered, having been marked with their own names, that is, in method [Methodo] it must be according to the creation of things themselves. (OL I. Letter to Reader)

Unlike what Hobbes saw as the passive approach of conducting and observing experiments, which would provide associations in the form of trains of ideas and eventually prudence, Hobbes thought natural philosophy should imitate God’s activity. The only way for natural philosophy to provide the benefits that Hobbes saw following from it was for it to combine observations with certain knowledge from scientia. The result was that explanations in natural philosophy were epistemically between mere associational prudence and the certainty of scientia. We could thus characterize explanations in Hobbes’ natural philosophy as having hypothetical certainty. The natural philosopher cannot know with certainty that nature behaves as an explanation claims. However, given that they borrow causal principles from geometry, they can know that if nature behaved as they suppose, then certain consequences would follow of necessity.

5. The Prospects for a Science of Civil Philosophy

Hobbes thought that he would be renowned as the founder of civil philosophy just as he saw Copernicus as having initiated the “beginning of astronomy”, Galileo as having opened the “gate of natural philosophy universal” with an account of the “nature of motion”, and William Harvey as having first discovered the “science of man’s body” (see the dedicatory epistle to De Corpore; EW I.viii). He asserted that while “Natural Philosophy is… young”, civil philosophy itself is “no older than… [his] own book De Cive” (EW I.ix). As a student of historical texts in their original languages,[10] Hobbes was well aware of many works from antiquity to his own time addressing issues relevant to civil philosophy. By claiming civil philosophy was his invention, he intended to deny that any of those preceding works counted as philosophy.

What did Hobbes see as distinguishing his work in civil philosophy from all predecessors? As points of contrast, Hobbes mentioned the Sophists who “taught … [only how] to dispute” and Christian theologians who introduced “school divinity”, by which Hobbes meant the blending of teachings from Scripture with Aristotle’s philosophy. For the latter, Hobbes saw the best “exorcism” to be the distinction between the subject matters of religion, which were the “rules for honouring God”, and philosophy, which was concerned with the “opinions of private men” (EW I.xi). What distinguished religion from philosophy in this sense, Hobbes continued, is that philosophy provides either demonstrations from definitions or demonstrations from “suppositions not absurd”.

So far it seems that there are two criteria relevant to civil philosophy that Hobbes saw as setting his apart from all other attempts. First, Hobbesian civil philosophy is a science (scientia) because human makers have the ability to know the actual causes of the objects of study since they construct them. Second, to count as philosophy and not mere superstition or sophistry, Hobbesian civil philosophy must provide demonstrations.

How exactly Hobbes’ use of ‘demonstration’ should be understood as it relates to civil philosophy has been a subject of debate among Hobbes scholars over the past several decades. Much of the focus of this debate has been concerning the Laws of Nature in Leviathan XIV and XV. Why restrict the scope of demonstrable civil philosophy to two chapters of Leviathan? Why not include, for example, Leviathan Parts III (“Of A Christian Commonwealth”) and IV (“Of The Kingdom of Darkness”)? Alternatively, why not also include chapters from Part II (“Of Commonwealth”), especially chapter XVII (“Of the Causes, Generation, and Definition of a Commonwealth”)? One motivation for focus upon chapters XIV and XV is that in those chapters Hobbes seems to have indicated that he saw a deductive relationship between the laws of nature by using the language one might expect in a demonstration. For example, Hobbes described the second law of nature as being “derived from” the first law (LEV 200). The remainder of this section will focus on two ways of understanding Hobbes’ civil philosophy as a demonstration.

One way of understanding Hobbes’ claim that civil philosophy is demonstrable connects it to Euclidean geometry. This view has been called the “definitivist” or “definitional” view because of its emphasis on the importance of definitions in Hobbes’ philosophy. One articulation of the definitivist view understands Hobbes’ definition of ‘law of nature’ in Leviathan as playing a role similar to an axiom in Euclidean geometry (Deigh 1996). In Leviathan XIV, a law of nature is defined as

a Precept, or generall Rule, found out by Reason, by which a man is forbidden to do, that, which is destructive of his life, or taketh away the means of preserving the same; and to omit, that, by which he thinketh it may be best preserved. (LEV 198)

The definivist further claims that like Euclidean axioms Hobbes did not view this axiom—the definition of ‘law of nature’—as requiring demonstration; instead, he derived the first law of nature from it and then derived the others one from another. Why is Hobbesian civil philosophy a demonstrable science on this view? Simply put, it is a demonstrable science because it follows the method of Euclidean geometry, viewed by Hobbes and others as the model of scientific knowledge on account of its clarity and rigor.[11]

A virtue of the definitivist view is that it takes seriously Hobbes’ claim that civil philosophy is demonstrable. However, a difficulty faced by the definitivist view, along with any other that understands Hobbes as drawing inspiration from Euclid, is that Hobbes himself harshly criticized Euclidean definitions, arguing that Euclid’s definitions “ought not be numbered among the principles of geometry” because they did not contain the causes of what was to be constructed (EW VII.184). Furthermore, Hobbes criticized the nature of the objects of Euclidean geometry. For example, Hobbes argued against understanding lines as being without breadth since there are no such bodies in nature (EW VII.202). Additionally, Hobbes himself did not ground his own geometry in undemonstrated axioms and held that even Euclidean axioms needed to be demonstrated (OL I.72; OL I.119).

A second difficulty for the definitivist view lies in its inability to accommodate the laws of nature as commands (Hoekstra 2003: 115). If the laws of nature were derived from the definition of ‘law of nature’, it would be difficult to see how they could then take the form of instructions to perform some action. Indeed, the laws of nature take the form of instructions to do this or that, such as the first law of nature

That every man, ought to endeavour Peace, as farre as he has of obtaining it; and when he cannot obtain it, that he may seek, and use, all helps, and advantages of Warre. (LEV 200)

Beyond the first and second laws of nature, the remaining laws contain instructions concerning what should be done to accomplish peace, that is, they command it, such as the third law of nature which commands “That men performe their Covenants made” (LEV 220).

An alternative account, what has been called the “maker’s knowledge” view of Hobbes’ civil philosophy, attempts to connect Hobbes’ demonstrations and definitions in geometry with civil philosophy. This view avoids the two difficulties faced by the definitivist account mentioned above and holds that Hobbesian civil philosophy is demonstrable by appealing to Hobbes’ own understanding of what constitutes a demonstration (Adams 2019). The remainder of this section will discuss two features of the “maker’s knowledge” account of Hobbesian civil philosophy.

First, a requirement for geometrical definitions, which Hobbes stressed in multiple contexts, is that they must provide the causes of the things being defined. For example, Hobbes claimed that the definition of ‘line’ should be as follows: “a line is made by the motion of a point” (OL I.63). Likewise, a plane is made by the motion of a line. Perhaps Hobbes understood all of the laws of nature to be like this type of geometrical definition, but instead of the definition of something like ‘line’ they served as the definition of (and thus how to make) peace. That is, when following all of the laws of nature one could make peace just as by following the generative instructions contained in the definition of ‘line’ one could make a line.

Second, a demonstration for Hobbes did not involve the derivation of features by means of deduction. Such deductions would provide one with knowledge of what was already contained in the starting proposition, making it difficult to see how commands could be derived from the definition of ‘law of nature’ in Leviathan XIV. However, Hobbes explicitly said that demonstrations should be synthetic, wherein one builds the complex thing to be demonstrated out of simpler constituent parts. A demonstration, Hobbes asserted, should be understood as a showing of some construction to someone else (OL I.76) and, as a result, he claimed that “entire method of demonstrating is synthetic” (OL I.71). By ‘synthesis’ Hobbes means that one shows how something is put together to reach the desired end, one shows how that thing is made.

The maker’s knowledge view of Hobbes’ civil philosophy draws insight from these two points and understands Hobbesian civil philosophy as demonstrable in the following way. Hobbes begins civil philosophy at a starting point in the “natural condition” of human bodies in Leviathan XIII, continues by considering how those bodies could be moved (by commands in the laws of nature) in ways that would be conducive of peace and, finally, are brought together to compose the commonwealth.


Primary Literature

Works by Hobbes
  • [EW] 1839–1845, The English Works of Thomas Hobbes, 11 volumes, William Molesworth (ed.), London: John Bohn. [EW available online]
  • [OL] 1839–1845, Thomæ Hobbes malmesburiensis opera philosophica, 5 volumes, William Molesworth (ed.), London: John Bohn.
  • [EL] 1640/1650 [1928], The Elements of Law, Ferdinand Tönnies (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1642–43 [1973], Critique du de Mundo de Thomas White, Jean Jacquot and Harold W. Jones (eds.), Paris: Vrin.
  • 1646 [1983], Thomas Hobbes’ A Minute or First Draught of the Optiques: A Critical Edition, Elaine C. Stroud (ed.), PhD Dissertation, University of Wisconsin-Madison.
  • [LEV] 1651 [2012], Leviathan: The English and Latin Texts, (The Clarendon Edition of the Works of Thomas Hobbes 4), Noel Malcolm (ed.) Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/actrade/9780199602643.book.1
  • [CSL] 1655 [1981], Computatio, Sive, Logica: Logic, first part of De Corpore, A. P. Martinich (trans. and commentary) and I.C. Hungerland and G. R. Vick (eds), New York: Abaris Books.
  • [DP] 1661 [1985], Dialogus Physicus, translated by Simon Schaffer in Shapin and Schaffer 1985, 345–391.
  • [MC] 1994, Man and Citizen: (De Homine and De Cive), Bernard Gert (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing. De Homine is 1658 and De Cive is 1642.
Other Authors:
  • Sprat, Thomas, 1667, The History of the Royal-Society of London, For the Improving of Natural Knowledge, London: Printed by T. R. for J. Martyn. [Spratt 1667 available online]

Secondary Literature

  • Achbari, Azadeh, 2017, “The Reviews of Leviathan and the Air-Pump: A Survey”, Isis, 108(1): 108–116. doi:10.1086/691398
  • Adams, Marcus P., 2016, “Hobbes on Natural Philosophy as ‘True Physics’ and Mixed Mathematics”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 56(April): 43–51. doi:10.1016/j.shpsa.2015.10.010
  • –––, 2017, “Natural Philosophy, Deduction, and Geometry in the Hobbes-Boyle Debate”, Hobbes Studies, 30(1): 83–107. doi:10.1163/18750257-03001005
  • –––, 2019, “Hobbes’s Laws of Nature in Leviathan as a Synthetic Demonstration: Thought Experiments and Knowing the Causes”, Philosopher’s Imprint, 19(5). [Adams 2019 available online]
  • Anstey, Peter R., 2005, “Experimental Versus Speculative Natural Philosophy”, in The Science of Nature in the Seventeenth Century, (Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 19), Peter R. Anstey and John A. Schuster (eds.), Berlin/Heidelberg: Springer-Verlag, 215–242. doi:10.1007/1-4020-3703-1_9
  • Biener, Zvi, 2016, “Hobbes on the Order of Sciences: A Partial Defense of the Mathematization Thesis”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 54(3): 312–332. doi:10.1111/sjp.12175
  • Deigh, John, 1996, “Reason and Ethics in Hobbes’s Leviathan”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 34(1): 33–60. doi:10.1353/hph.1996.0001
  • Deigh, John, 2003, “Reply to Mark Murphy”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 41(1): 97–109. doi:10.1353/hph.2002.0094
  • Garber, Daniel, 2009, Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199566648.001.0001
  • Hampton, Jean, 1986, Hobbes and the Social Contract Tradition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hattab, Helen, 2011, “The Mechanical Philosophy”, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern England, Desmond Clarke and Catherine Wilson (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 71–96. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199556137.003.0005
  • Hoekstra, Kinch, 2003, “Hobbes on Law, Nature, and Reason”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 41(1): 111–120. doi:10.1353/hph.2002.0098
  • Jesseph, Douglas M., 1999, Squaring the Circle: The War Between Hobbes and Wallis, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2006, “Hobbesian Mechanics”, in Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, volume III, Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 119–152.
  • –––, 2016, “Hobbes on ‘Conatus’: A Study in the Foundations of Hobbesian Philosophy”, Hobbes Studies, 29(1): 66–85. doi:10.1163/18750257-02901004.
  • Lloyd, Sharon, 2009, Morality in the Philosophy of Thomas Hobbes: Cases in the Law of Nature, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511596759
  • Malcolm, Noel, 2002, Aspects of Hobbes, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199247145.001.0001
  • Martinich, Aloysius P., 2005, Hobbes, (Routledge Philosophers), New York/London: Routledge.
  • Murphy, Mark C., 2000, “Desire and Ethics in Hobbes’s Leviathan: A Response to Professor Deigh”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 38(2): 259–268. doi:10.1353/hph.2005.0078
  • Peters, Richard, 1967, Hobbes, Baltimore, MD: Penguin Books.
  • Robertson, George Croom, 1886, Hobbes, London: William Blackwood and sons.
  • Ryan, Alan, 1970, The Philosophy of the Social Sciences, London: Macmillan.
  • Shapin, Steven and Simon Schaffer, 1985, Leviathan and the Air-Pump: Hobbes, Boyle, and the Experimental Life, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Taylor, A. E., 1938, “The Ethical Doctrine of Hobbes”, Philosophy, 13(52): 406–424. doi:10.1017/S0031819100014194
  • Warrender, Howard, 1957, The Political Philosophy of Hobbes: His Theory of Obligation, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Watkins, John W. N., 1965, Hobbes’s System of Ideas: A Study in the Political Significance of Philosophical Theories, London: Hutchinson.

Other Internet Resources

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