Hobbes’ Philosophy of Science
Thomas Hobbes is rightly regarded as a monumental figure in the history of philosophy, especially for his masterpiece Leviathan (1651 in English; 1668 in Latin). The scholarly literature on Leviathan is voluminous and has been especially focused upon issues in political philosophy, such as representation and authorization, sovereignty and absolutism, contracts and covenants, and the relationship of civil authority to religion, among others. Since its printing the portrayal in Leviathan XIII of humans in their natural state—an existence that is “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short”—has struck the imagination of many of Hobbes’ readers, leaving many seeing Hobbes as pessimistic at best or hopelessly unrealistic at worst.
In Hobbes’ own time, however, he was also well-known, even if sometimes ridiculed, for his views in mathematics, natural philosophy, and optics. In A Minute or First Draught of the Optiques (1646), Hobbes’ own assessment of his work is laudatory:
…I shall deserve the Reputation of having been the first to lay the ground of two Sciences, this of Opticques, the most curious, and that other of natural Justice, which I have done in my book de Cive, the most profitable of all other. (Hobbes 1646 [1983: 622])
Although some contemporaries saw promise in Hobbes’ optics, such as Mersenne, who published Hobbes’ work in this area in 1644 in Ballistica, in the years following the publication of Leviathan Hobbes’ pursuits apart from political philosophy were taken less seriously. There are a number of possible explanations for this decline in the opinion of Hobbes’ competence in these areas, including his numerous attempts to square the circle, the association of his views with atheism by many critics, and the conflicts he had with Robert Boyle at the time of the rise of experimental philosophy. These all contributed to some extent to Hobbes’ exclusion from the Royal Society when it was founded.
If Hobbes’ mathematical and natural-philosophical endeavors failed to be taken seriously by his contemporaries near the end of his life, what purpose is served by understanding these failed attempts? Apart from interest in them on their own terms as episodes in the history of science and philosophy, there are several reasons why we may find these areas of Hobbes’ thought valuable for study. First, Hobbes himself understood his political philosophy, or as he called it “civil philosophy”, to be a science capable of demonstration. Thus, understanding his general views about the nature of scientific demonstration promises to shed light on the way in which he saw civil philosophy as scientific. Second, Hobbes understood natural-philosophical explanations in physics as needing to make use of mathematical principles to count, as he says, as “true physics”. This may seem like a banal claim to a twenty-first century reader, but it was not so to many in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Hobbes’ natural philosophy thus situates him within the shift from qualitative to quantitative physics. Third, Hobbes’ conflicts with the Royal Society show us not only his views of the role of experimentation but also contextualize the rise of experimentalism. After discussing Hobbes’ criteria for scientific knowledge, this entry will address each of these three areas.
- 1. The Criteria for Scientific Knowledge
- 2. The Use of Mathematics and Hypotheses in Scientific Explanations
- 3. Hobbes on Experimentation: Conflict with Robert Boyle and the Royal Society
- 4. The Prospects for a Science of Civil Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
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1. The Criteria for Scientific Knowledge
The fundamental aspects of Hobbes’ materialism are well known. Hobbes believed that everything that exists is a body, and that bodies are sometimes in motion and sometimes at rest. Furthermore, he held that the only essential property of body is extension, or magnitude. All other apparent properties of bodies, such as those of color, taste, and firmness, are the result of motions from bodies being continued through media to humans’ sense organs. These motions, when continued into the bodies of perceivers, are constitutive of conceptions, or ideas. Ideas of the objects of sense are caused by motions from things outside of perceivers and those continued motions constitute ideas and serve to individuate one idea from another. Thus, all ideas in the human mind are either from sense perception or derived from ideas gained from sense perception (Leviathan I; LEV 22).
This account of the origin and nature of ideas shows Hobbes’ clear empiricist leanings; however, Hobbes does not hold that knowers should uncritically accept what the ideas of sense objects seem to represent. Like many other philosophers in the seventeenth century, Hobbes held that our knowledge of the external world was not direct but was instead mediated by ideas. This recognition that “we compute nothing but our phantasms or ideas” (Hobbes 1642–43 [1973: 450]; cf. OL I.82) resulted in two worries about human knowledge.
First, knowers must examine what resemblance ideas in the mind have to objects in the outside world. This worry seems similar, at first glance, to the concerns of Descartes’ meditator in the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641), but Hobbes aimed to provide a solution that made no reference whatsoever to God or to anything at all immaterial, such as a soul. In the early work Elements of Law, composed in 1640 and published in 1650 (EL), Hobbes offered arguments that attempted to show that ideas are distinct from that which they purport to represent and he claimed that as a result we could know that the so-called secondary qualities, such as color, taste, and sound, were not in bodies. To do this, he used everyday experience to provide evidence for his claims:
Every man hath so much experience as to have seen the sun and other visible objects by reflection in the water and in glasses, and this alone is sufficient for this conclusion: that colour and image may be there where the thing seen is not. (Elements of Law II.5; EL 3)
He used similar considerations in Leviathan I, concluding that we can know, for example, that color and sound are not in bodies since if they were “they could not bee severed from them, as by glasses, and in Ecchoes by reflection” (LEV 24).
A second worry that follows from Hobbes’ view that we have only mediated access to bodies in the world relates to the possibility of gaining knowledge of the causes of natural events. Most of the ideas that knowers possess of bodies are received passively. When interested in the cause of some phenomenon, all one may examine are ideas caused by the motions of the bodies involved. However, when interested in, say, the cause of billiard ball B being put into motion after apparent contact with moving billiard ball A, one does not find an idea of A being the cause of B’s motion. Even if one were to look to a lower ‘level’, as it were, smaller than billiard balls by use of a microscope, one would not find any idea of A’s motion causing B’s motion. Hobbes diagnosed this lack of causal knowledge by highlighting that human agents are not the makers of natural phenomena. He seemed to think that makers gain this causal knowledge by attending to their constructions through the process of creating. Since we lack the ideas of the causes of individual phenomena from our experience, Hobbes claimed that we cannot know their actual causes at all. All that we may know are possible causes. Hobbes asserted in Six Lessons to the Professors of Mathematiques (1656) that because “of natural bodies we know not the construction but seek it from the effects” we can know “only of what [the causes] may be” (EW VII.184).
This second worry brings to the fore Hobbes’ condition for the possibility of scientific knowledge, namely, the possession of (actual) causal knowledge. He claimed that
we are said to know [scire] some effect when we know what its causes are, in what subject they are, in what subject they introduce the effect and how they do it. Therefore, this is the knowledge [scientia] τοῦ διότι or of causes. (OL I.59)
Having scientific knowledge required one to know the actual causes of a phenomenon, not its mere possible causes. However, the only way to possess such causal knowledge is to act as a maker, as God did in the case of natural things.
This restriction that Hobbes made allowed him to consider only geometry and civil philosophy as bodies of scientific knowledge, since in only these two disciplines do humans make the objects that they study. In Six Lessons to the Professors of Mathematiques, Hobbes distinguished these two disciplines from all others by connecting them to making:
Geometry therefore is demonstrable for the lines and figures from which we reason are drawn and described by ourselves and civil philosophy is demonstrable because we make the commonwealth ourselves. (EW VII.184)
In the three following sections, this entry will consider ways in which these two bodies of scientific knowledge are used within other disciplines to provide an epistemic grounding for the explanations therein. In natural philosophy, or physics, Hobbes borrowed geometrical principles to provide the cause—the reason ‘why’—for many phenomena, while the making of the commonwealth, and its laws, out of the state of nature was the genesis of civil philosophy.
2. The Use of Mathematics and Hypotheses in Scientific Explanations
There has been debate among scholars of Hobbes’ thought about the relationship of the different parts of his philosophy to one another. Much of the focus has been upon the methodological statements in Part I of De Corpore, and scholars have traditionally divided over whether Hobbes understood philosophy as unified or disunified. However, more recent scholarship has drawn attention to Hobbes’ practice of explanation, such as the explanations found in De Corpore Part IV, and has argued that aspects of both the unified and disunified views track Hobbes’ discussions and practice while those views on their own miss that Hobbes explicitly borrowed principles from mathematics to use in natural philosophy (and provided citations to show this activity). This section will discuss these three approaches to understanding how the parts of Hobbes’ system fit with one another and then provide an example of an explanation in Hobbes’ natural philosophy from De Corpore XXV.
First, the unified view. A significant number of scholars have argued that Hobbes understood his philosophy as unified by deductive connections between the different parts (for example, Martinich 2005; Peters 1967; Shapin & Schaffer 1985; Watkins 1965). A stronger version of this unified view understands Hobbes to be a type of reductionist, wherein descriptions of macroscopic bodies, such as humans and rocks, ultimately reduce to microscopic bodies responsible for all phenomena (for example, Hampton 1986; Ryan 1970). For example, Alan Ryan articulates the reductionist view as follows:
Hobbes believed as firmly as one could that all behaviour, whether of animate or inanimate matter, was ultimately to be explained in terms of particulate motion: the laws governing the motions of discrete material particles were the ultimate laws of the universe, and in this sense psychology must be rooted in physiology and physiology in physics, while the social sciences, especially the technology of statecraft, must be rooted in psychology. (1970: 102–103)
There is some textual support for understanding the parts of Hobbes’ system as either deductively or reductively linked together since he did at times talk of the parts of philosophy as beginning in first philosophy and leading from one to another. For example, he asserted in De Corpore VI.6 that by beginning at first principles, one will move from first philosophy to geometry, and from geometry to physics. He continued by claiming that “after physics we come to morals” and, indeed, Hobbes claims that moral philosophy must be studied after physics because the passions have “their causes in sense-experience and imagination” (CSL 299; OL I.64).
However, immediately following these statements that seem to indicate that Hobbes took his philosophy to be tightly knit together, he argued that “civil and moral philosophy do not so adhere to one another, but that they may be severed” (EW I.73). This separation is permissible, Hobbes claimed, because in addition to learning moral philosophy from first principles each individual could simply study the motions of their own mind and gain knowledge of the same principles. That such separation could occur is difficult to explain for a strong version of the unified view because it makes it appear that Hobbes thought that one could develop civil philosophy simply by introspecting, entirely independently of any work in moral philosophy, natural philosophy, and first philosophy.
A further difficulty for the unified view is that even if Hobbes did see the connection between, say, physics and moral philosophy as deductive, it is not obvious how that deduction would work because moral philosophy must add content about human passions (endeavors) that is not contained within—and thus not deducible from—physics. For example, although the concept ‘endeavor’ is introduced in physics, for it to be used in moral philosophy the concepts of ‘appetite’ and ‘aversion’, which are properties of human bodies, must be added to it for use (Malcolm 2002: 147). One way to avoid this difficulty for the unified view would be to provide evidence that Hobbes made explicit the reduction relationship between concepts like ‘appetite’ and ‘aversion’ and the concept of ‘endeavour’, showing how one can reduce claims about human bodies to claims about microscopic bodies. Hobbes does not appear to do this anywhere in the corpus. However, even if a strong version of the unified view faces this difficulty, the presence of ‘endeavor’ throughout Hobbes’ philosophy shows that it was a foundational concept (see Jesseph 2016).
The second major view of the relationship of the parts of Hobbes’ philosophy to one another is what we can call the disunified view (for example, see Robertson 1886; Taylor 1938; Warrender 1957). Some of the motivation behind the disunified account seems to be a desire to free Hobbes from what is prima facie a case of deriving normative claims relating to the commonwealth in civil philosophy from descriptive claims related to human psychology and, ultimately, more general claims in natural philosophy (especially Taylor 1938). However, in its attempts to rescue Hobbes from a version of the so-called naturalistic fallacy, the disunified account fails to take seriously Hobbes’ claims about the unity of his philosophy. Furthermore, it neglects that many of Hobbes’ contemporaries (for example, Bramhall) saw Hobbes’ views in natural philosophy as having far-reaching consequences for other areas of philosophy.
A third view has more recently been offered that seeks to carve a middle path between the unified and disunified interpretations. We can call this view the mixed-mathematics view (for example, Adams 2016, 2017; Biener 2016). This understanding of Hobbes’ system agrees with the worry raised above for the unified account that ‘higher’ levels, such as geometry, do not contain the concepts used in ‘lower’ level explanations. For example, although geometrical principles are used in Hobbes’ optical explanations those geometrical principles do not contain concepts such as ‘light’ or ‘color’. Some evidence for this lack of containment claim can be found on the well-known “Table of the Several Subjects of Science” in Leviathan IX. The “sciences” on this table are listed on the right-most section and their subjects are to the immediate left. The subject of the science of optics, for example, is all of the “consequences from vision”, and these stem from “Physics or consequences from qualities”. The science of geometry, however, has as its subject the “consequences from quantity, and motion determined… by figure” and these stem not from physics but from “consequences from the accidents common to all bodies natural; which are quantity and motion”.
Instead of seeing this “adding to” as evidence for the disunified view, the mixed-mathematics view understands Hobbes having seen certain disciplines as providing causal principles (what he called the ‘why’) while other disciplines provided the facts relevant to a given domain (what he called the ‘that’). Textual support for this understanding of Hobbes’ system can be found in Hobbes’ methodological statements about natural philosophy as well as in his practice of explanation.
As mentioned already, Hobbes identified scientific knowledge (scientia) with knowing causes, and in his discussions he used language germane to Aristotle’s distinction between the ‘why’ and the ‘that’. We have seen already Hobbes’ commitment to knowing through the causes, but the complete passage from De Corpore VI.1 provides further detail about Hobbes’ views on the two types of knowledge, as follows:
We are said to know [scire] some effect when we know what its causes are, in what subject they are, in what subject they introduce the effect and how they do it. Therefore, this is the knowledge [scientia] τοῦ διότι or of causes. All other knowledge [cognitio], which is called τοῦ ὅτι, is either sense experience or imagination remaining in sense experience or memory (De Corpore VI.1; CSL 287–289).
Two types of knowledge thus emerge. There is knowledge from sense experience, retained as imagination and eventually as memory, and there is scientific knowledge. When reflecting in De Homine on the status of claims in physics, Hobbes claims that what he calls “true physics” must be a mixture of both of these types of knowledge:
[…] since one cannot proceed in reasoning about natural things that are brought about by motion from the effects to the causes without a knowledge of those things that follow from that kind of motion; and since one cannot proceed to the consequences of motions without a knowledge of quantity, which is geometry; nothing can be demonstrated by physics without something also being demonstrated a priori. Therefore physics (I mean true physics) [vera physica], that depends on geometry, is usually numbered among the mixed mathematics [mathematicas mixtas]. [.] Therefore those mathematics are pure which (like geometry and arithmetic) revolve around quantities in the abstract so that work [in them] requires no knowledge of the subject; those mathematics are mixed, in truth, which in their reasoning some quality of the subject is also considered, as is the case with astronomy, music, physics, and the parts of physics that can vary on account of the variety of species and the parts of the universe. (MC 42; OL II.93)
These two statements concerning the status of different types of knowledge and the requirement to mix “quantities in the abstract” with “some quality of the subject” in physics can aid in making sense of Hobbes’ actual explanatory practice. What does it mean for physics to be “mixed mathematics”? For Hobbes it means that for many explanations one will first establish that some fact is the case by appealing to sense experience, but to give the reason why one must borrow a principle from geometry.
At several places in De Corpore, Hobbes appears to carry out the mixed-mathematics ideal by showing, with a citation, that he used a causal principle from geometry within an explanation that included details about the “quality of the subject”. For example, in De Corpore XXV, the chapter with which Hobbes began Part IV, Hobbes appears to have done just this when he explained sensation. In that explanation, he appealed both to “qualities of the subject”, such as the claim based upon experience that “we may observe… that our phantasms or ideas are not always the same” (EW I.389), and by citing and using causal principles from earlier in the work (see discussion of this explanation in Adams 2016).
Such behavior—borrowing and citing a principle within an explanation—would be difficult to explain on the picture offered by the unified view since Hobbes offers no justification for this practice other than phrases such as “I have shown besides…”. There is no deduction anywhere offered within Hobbes’ actual explanatory practice that would give reason to think that Hobbes understood the use of these principles from elsewhere in the work in that way. Likewise, it is difficult to make sense of this activity within Hobbes’ actual practice if we adopt the disunified view of Hobbes’ philosophy, since by using principles from elsewhere in the system, and especially by explicitly citing them, Hobbes is signaling that the parts of his system did fit together, even if not in the strong reductive sense of the unified view. The next section will describe Hobbes’ view that work in first philosophy and geometry must be done prior to experiments.
3. Hobbes on Experimentation: Conflict with Robert Boyle and the Royal Society
Hobbes’ conflict with Robert Boyle concerning the nature of natural philosophy in general, and the air-pump experiments in particular, took place over several years and in a series of publications. Hobbes wrote Dialogus Physicus (1661; a second version appeared in 1668) as a dialogue aimed at criticizing Boyle’s New Experiments Physico-Mechanical (1660). Boyle responded to various criticisms in works such as An Examen of Mr. T. Hobbes his Dialogus Physicus de Natura Aëris (1662), An Examen of Mr. Hobbes’ Doctrine about Cold (1665), and Animadversions upon Mr. Hobbes’ Problemata de Vacuo (1674). The most comprehensive and influential treatment of this period of Hobbes’ life is Shapin and Schaffer’s Leviathan and the Air-Pump (1985). This section will focus upon Hobbes’ criticisms of the air-pump experiments in the Dialogus Physicus with an aim of showing how they illuminate our understanding of Hobbes’ natural philosophy.
Most generally both Boyle and Hobbes viewed the natural world as composed of bits of matter in motion. Even if there were some points of agreement between the versions of mechanical philosophy offered by both Boyle and Hobbes, there are important differences. A crucial difference between the two relates to the status (or lack thereof) of Laws of Nature. While Boyle talked about the laws of nature as established by God (see entry on Boyle, section Laws of Nature), Hobbes restricted discussion of laws to the laws of human conduct discovered by those who escape the state of nature and create a commonwealth. In contrast to laws of the natural world, Hobbes articulated a priori principles of motion at the foundation of his physics in De Corpore VIII.19 and IX.7. Rather than being known as laws of motion, issued by some divine lawmaker, these Hobbesian principles of motion are explicated by thought experiments and seem to rely upon a version of the principle of sufficient reason (Jesseph 2006: 132). Although Hobbes held that they were true of all human experience, since Hobbes holds that we cannot know the actual causes of natural phenomena he would have to admit that nature might, unbeknownst to us, act otherwise. However, despite these differences, the primary dissimilarity that emerges between Hobbes and Boyle concerning the air-pump experiments is one of method as it relates to the status of experiments/experience (see entry on Boyle, section Philosophy of Experiment).
Given that Hobbes was convinced of the impossibility of knowing the actual causes of natural phenomena, he held that any phenomenon admits of multiple possible explanations. This should not be taken to imply that Hobbes saw all explanations, and thus all possible causes or suppositions, as standing on equal footing. Instead, Hobbes held that work in first philosophy and geometry must be completed prior to attempting to make any explanations in natural philosophy. This seems to be what Hobbes meant when he said that “nothing can be demonstrated by physics without something also being demonstrated a priori” (MC 42; OL II.93). When giving an explanation, Hobbes held that one should ideally appeal to those causes that are demonstrable from geometry when mixed with facts and rule out those that are not intelligible according to geometrical principles.
In contrast, Boyle’s method prescribed that instead of bringing causal principles to an experiment and expecting to explain some phenomenon by appeal to those principles, one should attempt to arrive at a supposition that would explain a phenomenon only after repeated, careful experiments. Thomas Sprat detailed the care taken in the design of experiments and the manner in which Royal Society members were formed into committees that shared parts of an experiment so that “[b]y this union of eyes, and hands” they were able to gain “a full comprehension of the object in all its appearances” (Sprat 1667: 85).
We can make sense of Hobbes’ direct criticisms of Boyle’s prioritization of experiment with this methodological difference in mind. Hobbes’ view of the foundational role played by first philosophy and mathematics over experiment/experience is clear when he claimed in Dialogus Physicus that
…ingenuity is one thing and method is another. Here method is needed. The causes of those things done by motion are to be investigated through a knowledge of motion, the knowledge of which, the noblest part of geometry, is hitherto untouched. (DP 347; OL IV.236)
According to Hobbes, then, one must have geometrical principles already in place to aid in choosing a supposition before engaging in experiments. Unlike the Royal Society’s aim to have multiple members examine the same object, Hobbes emphasized the need for individual conceptual clarity, something that could be accomplished from an armchair.
This criticism from Hobbes, and Boyle’s rebuttals relying upon evidence from experiments, could be seen as a conflict of Boyle’s experimental natural philosophy against a form of speculative natural philosophy. However, it is important to avoid taking Hobbes’ criticisms of Boyle’s method to imply that Hobbes completely eschewed experiment/experience while engaging in natural-philosophical explanations. Instead, Hobbes viewed experiment/experience as playing the role of establishing that some phenomenon occurs, what we have seen he called the ‘that’, but one should never hope, according to Hobbes, to glean a possible cause from mere observations, even if those observations were carefully documented and repeated many times.
Indeed, in the Dialogus Physicus Hobbes, speaking through speaker A, often granted the observational reports of the experimenters without question. For example, speaker A does not question what the experimenters claim they observed regarding a bladder that had been placed inside the air-pump and weighed, noting “They can be certain that the scale in which the bladder is, is more depressed than the other, their eyes bearing witness” (DP 369; OL IV.261). Instead of criticizing the experimenters’ reliance upon observations, speaker A argues that the experimenters cannot know, in the case of this explanation, what the cause of the scale being depressed is because their posited cause (the “natural gravity” of the air) does not allow them to explain why the scale is depressed after the air-pump is engaged. In contrast, speaker A offers a possible cause that is borrowed, with an explicit citation, from Hobbes’ geometrical account of “simple circle motion” and “fermentation” developed in De Corpore 21.5 (Adams 2017).
4. The Prospects for a Science of Civil Philosophy
Hobbes thought that he would be renowned as the founder of civil philosophy just as he saw Copernicus as having initiated the “beginning of astronomy”, Galileo as having opened the “gate of natural philosophy universal” with an account of the “nature of motion”, and William Harvey as having first discovered the “science of man’s body” (see the dedicatory epistle to De Corpore; EW I.viii). He asserted that while “Natural Philosophy is… young”, civil philosophy itself is “no older than… [his] own book De Cive” (EW I.ix). As a student of historical texts in their original languages, Hobbes was well aware of many works from antiquity to his own time addressing issues relevant to civil philosophy. By claiming civil philosophy was his invention, he intended to deny that any of those preceding works counted as philosophy.
What did Hobbes see as distinguishing his work in civil philosophy from all predecessors? As points of contrast, Hobbes mentioned the Sophists who “taught … [only how] to dispute” and Christian theologians who introduced “school divinity”, by which Hobbes meant the blending of teachings from Scripture with Aristotle’s philosophy. For the latter, Hobbes saw the best “exorcism” to be the distinction between the subject matters of religion, which were the “rules for honouring God”, and philosophy, which was concerned with the “opinions of private men” (EW I.xi). What distinguished religion from philosophy in this sense, Hobbes continued, is that philosophy provides either demonstrations from definitions or demonstrations from “suppositions not absurd”.
So far it seems that there are two criteria relevant to civil philosophy that Hobbes saw as setting his apart from all other attempts. First, Hobbesian civil philosophy is a science (scientia) because human makers have the ability to know the actual causes of the objects of study since they construct them. Second, to count as philosophy and not mere superstition or sophistry, Hobbesian civil philosophy must provide demonstrations.
How exactly Hobbes’ use of ‘demonstration’ should be understood as it relates to civil philosophy has been a subject of debate among Hobbes scholars over the past several decades. Much of the focus of this debate has been concerning the Laws of Nature in Leviathan XIV and XV. Why restrict the scope of demonstrable civil philosophy to two chapters of Leviathan? Why not include, for example, Leviathan Parts III (“Of A Christian Commonwealth”) and IV (“Of The Kingdom of Darkness”)? Alternatively, why not also include chapters from Part II (“Of Commonwealth”), especially chapter XVII (“Of the Causes, Generation, and Definition of a Commonwealth”)? One motivation for focus upon chapters XIV and XV is that in those chapters Hobbes seems to have indicated that he saw a deductive relationship between the laws of nature by using the language one might expect in a demonstration. For example, Hobbes described the second law of nature as being “derived from” the first law (LEV 200). The remainder of this section will focus on two ways of understanding Hobbes’ civil philosophy as a demonstration.
One way of understanding Hobbes’ claim that civil philosophy is demonstrable connects it to Euclidean geometry. This view has been called the “definitivist” or “definitional” view because of its emphasis on the importance of definitions in Hobbes’ philosophy. One articulation of the definitivist view understands Hobbes’ definition of ‘law of nature’ in Leviathan as playing a role similar to an axiom in Euclidean geometry (Deigh 1996). In Leviathan XIV, a law of nature is defined as
a Precept, or generall Rule, found out by Reason, by which a man is forbidden to do, that, which is destructive of his life, or taketh away the means of preserving the same; and to omit, that, by which he thinketh it may be best preserved. (LEV 198)
The definivist further claims that like Euclidean axioms Hobbes did not view this axiom—the definition of ‘law of nature’—as requiring demonstration; instead, he derived the first law of nature from it and then derived the others one from another. Why is Hobbesian civil philosophy a demonstrable science on this view? Simply put, it is a demonstrable science because it follows the method of Euclidean geometry, viewed by Hobbes and others as the model of scientific knowledge on account of its clarity and rigor.
A virtue of the definitivist view is that it takes seriously Hobbes’ claim that civil philosophy is demonstrable. However, a difficulty faced by the definitivist view, along with any other that understands Hobbes as drawing inspiration from Euclid, is that Hobbes himself harshly criticized Euclidean definitions, arguing that Euclid’s definitions “ought not be numbered among the principles of geometry” because they did not contain the causes of what was to be constructed (EW VII.184). Furthermore, Hobbes criticized the nature of the objects of Euclidean geometry. For example, Hobbes argued against understanding lines as being without breadth since there are no such bodies in nature (EW VII.202). Additionally, Hobbes himself did not ground his own geometry in undemonstrated axioms and held that even Euclidean axioms needed to be demonstrated (OL I.72; OL I.119).
A second difficulty for the definitivist view lies in its inability to accommodate the laws of nature as commands (Hoekstra 2003: 115). If the laws of nature were derived from the definition of ‘law of nature’, it would be difficult to see how they could then take the form of instructions to perform some action. Indeed, the laws of nature take the form of instructions to do this or that, such as the first law of nature
That every man, ought to endeavour Peace, as farre as he has of obtaining it; and when he cannot obtain it, that he may seek, and use, all helps, and advantages of Warre. (LEV 200)
Beyond the first and second laws of nature, the remaining laws contain instructions concerning what should be done to accomplish peace, that is, they command it, such as the third law of nature which commands “That men performe their Covenants made” (LEV 220).
An alternative account, what has been called the “maker’s knowledge” view of Hobbes’ civil philosophy, attempts to connect Hobbes’ demonstrations and definitions in geometry with civil philosophy. This view avoids the two difficulties faced by the definitivist account mentioned above and holds that Hobbesian civil philosophy is demonstrable by appealing to Hobbes’ own understanding of what constitutes a demonstration (Adams 2019). The remainder of this section will discuss two features of the “maker’s knowledge” account of Hobbesian civil philosophy.
First, a requirement for geometrical definitions, which Hobbes stressed in multiple contexts, is that they must provide the causes of the things being defined. For example, Hobbes claimed that the definition of ‘line’ should be as follows: “a line is made by the motion of a point” (OL I.63). Likewise, a plane is made by the motion of a line. Perhaps Hobbes understood all of the laws of nature to be like this type of geometrical definition, but instead of the definition of something like ‘line’ they served as the definition of (and thus how to make) peace. That is, when following all of the laws of nature one could make peace just as by following the generative instructions contained in the definition of ‘line’ one could make a line.
Second, a demonstration for Hobbes did not involve the derivation of features by means of deduction. Such deductions would provide one with knowledge of what was already contained in the starting proposition, making it difficult to see how commands could be derived from the definition of ‘law of nature’ in Leviathan XIV. However, Hobbes explicitly said that demonstrations should be synthetic, wherein one builds the complex thing to be demonstrated out of simpler constituent parts. A demonstration, Hobbes asserted, should be understood as a showing of some construction to someone else (OL I.76) and, as a result, he claimed that “entire method of demonstrating is synthetic” (OL I.71). By ‘synthesis’ Hobbes means that one shows how something is put together to reach the desired end, one shows how that thing is made.
The maker’s knowledge view of Hobbes’ civil philosophy draws insight from these two points and understands Hobbesian civil philosophy as demonstrable in the following way. Hobbes begins civil philosophy at a starting point in the “natural condition” of human bodies in Leviathan XIII, continues by considering how those bodies could be moved (by commands in the laws of nature) in ways that would be conducive of peace and, finally, are brought together to compose the commonwealth.
Primary LiteratureWorks by Hobbes
- [EW] 1839–1845, The English Works of Thomas Hobbes, 11 volumes, William Molesworth (ed.), London: John Bohn. [EW available online]
- [OL] 1839–1845, Thomæ Hobbes malmesburiensis opera philosophica, 5 volumes, William Molesworth (ed.), London: John Bohn.
- [EL] 1640/1650 , The Elements of Law, Ferdinand Tönnies (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- 1642–43 , Critique du de Mundo de Thomas White, Jean Jacquot and Harold W. Jones (eds.), Paris: Vrin.
- 1646 , Thomas Hobbes’ A Minute or First Draught of the Optiques: A Critical Edition, Elaine C. Stroud (ed.), PhD Dissertation, University of Wisconsin-Madison.
- [LEV] 1651 , Leviathan: The English and Latin Texts, (The Clarendon Edition of the Works of Thomas Hobbes 4), Noel Malcolm (ed.) Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/actrade/9780199602643.book.1
- [CSL] 1655 , Computatio, Sive, Logica: Logic, first part of De Corpore, A. P. Martinich (trans. and commentary) and I.C. Hungerland and G. R. Vick (eds), New York: Abaris Books.
- [DP] 1661 , Dialogus Physicus, translated by Simon Schaffer in Shapin and Schaffer 1985, 345–391.
- [MC] 1994, Man and Citizen: (De Homine and De Cive), Bernard Gert (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing. De Homine is 1658 and De Cive is 1642.
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Other Internet Resources
- Sommerville, Johann, 2015, Thomas Hobbes Bibliography