Notes to Ibn Sina’s Metaphysics

1. Avicenna devotes a commentary to the ps.-Theology of Aristotle, a reworking of Plotinus’ Enneads IV–VI. This, in the incomplete form that has come down to us (see Badawi, Arisṭū ʿinda al-ʿArab, 37–74), concerns mainly psychological issues (see Gardet 1951; Vajda 1951; Bertolacci 2006: 455–457; Gutas 2014: 152–153). The influence of the Book on the Pure Good on Avicenna is less clear since many of the doctrinal elements Avicenna could have found in this text are also present in other Neo-Platonic texts as well (on this, see D’Ancona 2000 and Bertolacci 2006: 143–144, 256–257, 453–457).

2. According to Bertolacci (2006: Ch. 5) Avicenna’s Metaphysics can be divided into the following parts:

  • preliminary remarks (I, 1–4);
  • epistemological foundations (I, 5–8);
  • the species of being (II–III);
  • the properties of being (IV–VI);
  • the causes of being (VIII–X, 3);
  • a sort of appendix to theoretical philosophy (X, 4–5), dealing with ethics, social and political life.

To the anatomization of metaphysics conceived as a science of being, should be added that of metaphysics seen as an investigation of unity:

  • III, 2–6, 9 are concerned with the species of unity and multiplicity;
  • VII considers the properties of unity and multiplicity.

Menn (2013: 144–147) highlights the points that Avicenna and Aristotle have in common: Avicenna’s Metaphysics begins with an account of being and unity and their attributes, proceeds to examine the different kinds of cause, and then argues that the first cause of being is a single first being (God); this could be said to correspond in a very broad sense to the structure of Aristotle’s Metaphysics: Α, Β, Γ discuss being and unity; Δ deals with general concepts such as the kinds of cause, the kinds of priority, and the different senses and attributes of being and unity, ΕΖΗΘ discuss being and describe kinds of being such as substance (ΖΗ) and potentiality and actuality (Θ); Book I describes unity and plurality and related attributes; the conclusions reached in previous books are used to argue for the existence of a divine First Principle and Its attributes (Λ). (Κ repeats other material, ΜΝ argue against Academic theories of forms and numbers); Lambda considers God, primarily as a first cause of motion, whereas for Avicenna the First Principle is a cause of being. In addition to these detailed divisions there is a more general one: in his Metaphysics Avicenna first presents his ontology and the founding elements of the analysis of being (existence, the species and the properties of being, the causes), then builds up his system using the Neo-Platonic idea of emanation: VII discusses the idea of separation, VIII–IX deal with the Principle and Its emanation and X (which might be read as a treatise on human being, in which the descending moment of procession and the ascending moment to the Principle coincide), deals with social, political and religious issues in the light of metaphysics and of the necessity that the human species be permanent. X (especially X 4–5) has its ultimate source in Plato’s Republic and it is clearly reminiscent of the metaphysical-political ideas al-Fārābī expresses in his Virtuous City (Kitāb fī ārāʾ ahl al-Madīna al-fāḍila) and in his The Principles of beings or The Book of the Political Government (K. al-Siyāsa al-madaniya). For the project of a critical edition of the Ilāhiyyāt of K. al-Šifā, see Bertolacci 2008a,b.

3. Maqāla […] fī agrād al-ḥakīm fī kulli maqālatin min al-Kitāb al-mawsūm bi-l-ḥurūf in Dieterici 1890. Avicenna declares in his Autobiography (Gohlman 1974: 32–35) that he understood the purpose Aristotle had in writing his Metaphysics only after reading this short work by al-Fārābī. See Bertolacci 2006; Gutas 2014; Koutzarova 2009: 13–30.

4. Avicenna refers to the Principle in various ways, e.g., as First Principle, First Cause, the First, Pure Good (VIII, 6, 355, 11), First Good (IX, 3, 401, 6), the Necessary Existent; one occurrence (I, 1, 4, 16)—if one accepts Bertolacci’s correction (Le cose divine and the new edition project)—refers to “the cause of the causes” and “the Principle of the principles”. One must consider not only these philosophical determinations, but also the religious ones: God (see here below note 9) and the “Lord of the world” (rabb al-ʿalāmīna) as in IX, 7, 424, 14–15 or “the Lord who is a knower” (al-ʿālim al-rububī: VIII, 7, 364,13), a locution which is reminiscent of the pseudo-Theology of Aristotle.

5. See Aristotle’s Metaphysics A.1, 981b28–29; A.2, 982b9–10: metaphysics investigates the causes and the first principles; A.2, 982b28–983a11; E.1, 1026a16–21: metaphysics is the science of what is divine (E.1 suggests it investigates causes insofar as they are divine); 1026a13–16: metaphysics is the science of what is separate; the arguments of book Lambda establish a divine Prime Mover, the final cause of the world. For al-Kindī, see On First Philosophy (Pormann and Adamson 2012); cf. Bertolacci 2006: Ch. 2.

6. Arabic does not have any copulative function for the verb “to be” and the proper meaning of wuǧūd is “to be found” and therefore “to exist”. In the Arabic philosophical tradition the vocabulary of being is very rich. In Avicenna’s Metaphysics existence/being is expressed by different terms like wuǧūd, anniyya, huwiyya, aysa (cf. taʾyīs); to these one must add the terms that indicate the existent (mawǧūd/al-mawǧūd), the existent thing (šayʾ, and the terms Avicenna presents as synonymous in I, 5), and those listed here that indicate essence/quiddity (ḏāt, māhiyya, šayʾiyya, ṭabīʿa, ḥaqīqa). Each term really merits an analysis of its own; on terminology see at least Jolivet 2006: 217–227; Bertolacci 2003, 2012c).

7. Thus the existent as such and God seem to share the absence of quiddity (see section 5); for a different interpretation, see Janos 2020, e.g. 447.

8. The question of the meanings of thing and existent (their intension) necessarily implies that of their extension. This question has been variously discussed by scholars; Wisnovsky (2003a: Ch. 7 and 8–9) highlighted the fact that Avicenna, in Ilāhiyyāt I, 5, presents thing and existent as extensionally identical yet intensionally different, while in other passages (Ilāhiyyāt V, 1, 196, 6–13 and VII, 1, 303, 6–12) thing seems to be more basic and hence prior to existent. This position is not universally accepted (Druart 2001; Bertolacci 2012a: 275–277; De Haan 2014). It is clear that since the Necessary Existent has no quiddity (and no definition), the Principle is not a thing and it is also clear that the priority of quiddity cannot be understood as if an existence were being ascribed to quiddity independently of the consideration of it. Wisnovsky’s remarks nevertheless deserve attention. In order to provide a definitive solution to the question, a detailed distinction between the various uses Avicenna makes of the terms in his metaphysical and logical works would be necessary; it should include an analysis of the term amr (e.g., in Ilāhiyyāt, I, 6, 37, 8–9) and would help us to distinguish technical from non-technical usages of Avicenna’s terminology (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 196, 6 could be read in this sense).

9. The main conceptual reference here is the Neo-Platonic theme of the one and the manifold effect; nonetheless, the Islamic assertion of divine oneness (tawḥīd) is also confirmed: Avicenna equates the Necessary Existent to God in several passages: e.g., Ilāhiyyāt, I, 1, 5, 13–7, 6; VIII, 6, 362, 4–11 (the First); 359 (the Necessary Existent); IX, 6, 418, 12–15 (the First Ruler); 7, 424, 14–15 (the Lord of the Worlds); 431, 8 (God); X, 2, 3; cf. Taʿlīqāt, 80, 81; 175–176; Janssens 2004, 2006. Nevertheless, this identification is obviously problematic (Adamson 2013a).

10. In Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 3, 276, 12–14 one reads fī ʿiddat aḥkām; Marmura (The Metaphysics of “The Healing”, 213) translates it as «in terms of a number of [modes]»; a possible correction is fī ṯalāṯati aḥkām (see Avicenna, Metafisica, 613; Le cose divine, 121 and 535); the Latin text (Liber de philosophia prima, 317) has: «tribus modis»; cf. also Išārāt, III, ed. Dunyā, 118–127; Michot 1997: 186. The question cannot be resolved without a comparative examination of Avicenna’s writings (see e.g., the Epistle on the divisions of the rational sciences). To some extent, these distinctions are traditional; see al-Fārābī, who in his Aims (or Scopes, Arabic Aġrāḍ) in each Book of the Treatise Designated by Letters (Maqāla… fī aġrāḍ, see Dieterici 1890: 35, 8–11), asserts that metaphysics (the universal science) investigates existence and oneness, which are common to all beings, together with priority and posteriority (al-taqaddum wa-l-taʾaḫḫur), potency and act (or potentiality and actuality: al-quwwa wa-l-fiʿl), and perfection and deficiency (literally: the perfect and the deficient or defective: al-tāmm wa-l-nāqiṣ); these three are defined as both types (anwāʿ) and concomitants (lawāḥiq) of existence and oneness; on this, see Wisnovsky 2003a: Ch. 5, pp. 108 et seq.; and in chap. 11 Wisnovsky notes that necessity and possibility do not appear in al-Fārābī’s analysis.

11. Each status combines Neo-Platonic and religious usage. Anteriority and posteriority—which legitimate the idea of hierarchy—are clearly Neo-Platonic but also evoke some of the divine names of the Islamic tradition (the First—al-awwal—and the anterior or pre-eternal : qadīm, mutaqaddim); the term “rich” (ġanī) is to be found in both the Neo-Platonic texts and in the Qurʾanic lexicon.

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