Ibn Sina’s Metaphysics

First published Wed Dec 2, 2015; substantive revision Thu Mar 26, 2020

For Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā) metaphysics is a science (ʿilm), i.e., a perfectly rationally established discipline that allows human reason to achieve an authentic understanding of the inner structure of the world. Metaphysics is the science of being qua being and therefore the science that explains every being. In his interpretation, Avicenna fuses the Aristotelian tradition, which he intends to renew (Gutas 2014), with the Neo-Platonic idea of emanation, on which he builds his system: metaphysics thus includes theology, cosmology and angelology, and provides a foundation for physics, psychology, prophetology and eschatology. Indeed, metaphysics even demonstrates “the principles of the particular sciences” that investigate “the states of particular existent things” (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 2, 14, 18–15, 7) and are subordinate to it (Bertolacci 2006: Ch. 7). So metaphysics is “first” and “at the head” of all sciences (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 3, 18, 14–17; Houser 1999; Lizzini 2005) and is universal not only because it concerns being qua being (instead of just some aspects of it), but also because it comprehends reality—and the system of knowledge this implies—as a whole (instead of just some portions of it).

In this article, which has reference mainly, but not exclusively, to the Ilāhiyyāt of Kitāb al-Šifāʾ (known in English as the Metaphysics of the Book of the Healing or of the Book of the Cure), I shall start—after introducing Avicenna’s sources—with a brief discussion of the status of metaphysics as a science, and then illustrate Avicenna’s analysis of existence and the theology that arises from it. Thereafter I shall focus on Avicenna’s theory of emanation, highlighting its essential aspects.

1. Metaphysics: sources and importance

Avicenna reads his main reference—Aristotle’s Metaphysics—in the light of two interrelated traditions: that of the Late Ancient commentators (e.g., Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius, Ammonius of Hermias) and that of the Neo-Platonic writings known in the Arabic world—the so-called Plotiniana and Procliana arabica[1]—part of which were ascribed to Aristotle himself. He consequently reinterprets Aristotle’s Metaphysics and gives an original structure to his own text (Bertolacci 2006: Ch. 5; Menn 2013).[2] The Arabic-Islamic traditions of philosophy and theology (Yaḥyā ibn ʿAdī, al-Fārābī, the Kalām) are also essential to understanding Avicenna’s metaphysics: not only does Avicenna’s terminology often depend on his predecessors, but also some of the solutions he adopts are the result of the ongoing discussion about their positions. Yet Avicenna surpasses both his sources and his interlocutors. From a theoretical point of view, his metaphysics is, in fact, incredibly rich and refined. Many issues—such as being and universality, the God-world relationship, the problem of evil—receive a quite original treatment in Avicenna’s system. This clearly explains the paramount importance Avicenna’s metaphysics has for the history of philosophy, in both the West and the East. Indeed, thanks to the Toledo Latin version of the Ilāhiyyāt of Kitāb al-Šifāʾ (Liber de philosophia prima sive scientia divina), every Latin medieval philosopher from the late 12th century onwards encountered one or more of Avicenna’s interpretations (Hasse and Bertolacci 2011; Bertolacci 2013). In the East (and especially in the Persian area), Avicenna’s metaphysics not only profoundly influenced philosophy and theology, but also founded a centuries-old tradition which can be considered still extant (Endress 2006; Michot 1993; Wisnovsky 2004, 2011, 2014).

2. Metaphysics Between Ontology and Theology

2.1 Ontology and Theology

Avicenna’s definition of metaphysics as a science is rooted in a premise he elaborates on the basis of Aristotle (Post. Analytics I.10, 76b11–22) and al-Fārābī (On the aims of the Metaphysics[3]): a science must have a subject-matter (upokeimenon: mawḍūʿ) and an object of research (zetoumenon: maṭlūb; mabḥūṯ ʿan-hu). The former is assumed to be existent (it is a starting-point); the existence of the latter has to be established, which is the purpose (ġaraḍ) of the science or the aim towards which the science is oriented (maqṣūd). From this distinction a fundamental duality emerges: by virtue of its subject-matter (the existent and its properties), metaphysics is concerned with being and is ontology, whereas from the point of view of the question which it must answer, metaphysics establishes (iṯbāt) the existence of the First Principle and is theology.[4] So Avicenna retains the theological conception that al-Kindī highlighted (and Aristotle himself suggested);[5] at the same time, he develops the line al-Fārābī initiated by positing being—and not God—as the focus of metaphysics as a universal science (Bertolacci 2006: Ch. 2–3; Menn 2013). He thus gives his own solution to a traditional question (how should Aristotle’s metaphysics be defined?): metaphysics fits the definition given in Gamma 1, 1003a20–26, as the science of being qua being or, literally, of the existent qua existent: al-mawǧūd bi-mā huwa mawǧūd (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 1, 9, 8; 2, 13, 12–13). It is only in terms of the question it must answer (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 1, 5, 13–7, 2; 9, 6–10; 3, 19, 5–8; 21, 1–8; 23, 1–9), that the science of metaphysics is “divine” (al-ʿilm al-ilāhī; cf. Aristotle’s Metaphysics A.2, 982b28–983a11; E.1, 1026a16–21) or “of the divine things” (ʿilm al-ilāhiyyāt; cf. Metaph., 1026a13–16), as the title of the metaphysical sections of Avicenna’s philosophical summae indicate.

2.2 The Meaning of the Dual Definition

Avicenna’s dual characterization of metaphysics results in a profound connection between theology and ontology. Inasmuch as It exists, the First Principle partially coincides with the subject-matter of metaphysics, so that theology is included in ontology: the existence of God is part of existence (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 2, 14, 4–10: the Principle is the Principle of part of being). The dual definition of metaphysics reflects a twofold way of considering existence or being itself: when it is taken as set apart from any condition, and hence taken to be absolute, being is the subject-matter of metaphysical investigation. On the contrary, when it is identified as the being of the Principle, it is necessarily defined as uncaused. In fact, the definition of metaphysics as a science and its twofold denomination derive from a logical-predicative distinction: being is either not on condition of (min ġayr šarṭ)—and is hence an undetermined common being—or is on condition of not and requires that (non-relational) predications be excluded. In more technical terms (analogous distinctions define quiddity and genus in Ilāhiyyāt,V,1 and V,3) being is either not on the condition of adding a determination (lā bi-šarṭi al-ziyāda)—and can therefore be unconditionally predicated of everything—or is on the condition of not adding a composition (maʿa šarṭi lā ziyādati tarkīb; Ilāhiyyāt, I, 2, 13, 8–13; VIII, 4, 347, 10–16; Porro 2011b; Lizzini 2013). In the latter case, being constitutes the divine being which is the research object of metaphysics, i.e., the answer to the questions: does an uncaused principle exist? And if so, what are its properties?

2.3 The Theological Vocation of Metaphysics: The First Principle as Absolute Cause

According to Avicenna, metaphysics—and no other science—can (and must) establish the existence of a First absolute Principle. Physics, which deals with bodies and their movement, can explain no more than motion (its result is, in fact, a Prime Mover) and, unable to answer the fundamental ontological question about the origin of the world’s being, it simply anticipates the idea of the Principle that metaphysics demonstrates (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 1, 6, 17–7, 6; I,2,14–end).

From this perspective, Avicenna is not Aristotelian: metaphysics must explain the transition from non-being to being, an atemporal transition which does not exclude eternity from what is caused to be. His idea is entirely consistent with Greco-Arabic Neo-Platonism: both the pseudo-Theology of Aristotle (a re-elaboration of Enneads IV-VI) and the Book of the pure Good (a reworking of Proclus’ Elements of Theology) insist on an originated being. At the same time, Avicenna includes in his system the Aristotelian conception of a world eternally in movement: hence the notions of matter, form, potency and act are elaborated so as to answer the question of the origin of the world’s eternal existence. In keeping with Proclus (and against John Philoponus’s position: Davidison 1987; Chase 2012; McGinnis 2012, 2013), Avicenna considers the world to be “instaured” or absolutely created (mubdaʿ) and at the same time establishes that it is eternal and eternally in motion, as Aristotle’s physics and metaphysics teach. He therefore posits a Principle of the world’s existence (wuǧūd) that does not correspond to the prime unmoved mover (cf. Commentaire Lambda: 7–12; Taʿlīqāt, 62, 14–19; Janssens 2003). Indeed, according to Avicenna, in metaphysics the efficient cause is a cause of existence (Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 1, 257, 13–16). It is only in this sense that metaphysicians conceive the Principle as an agent. At the same time, since It is first and perfect (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 4, 343, 12–15; VIII, 7, 368, 2–3; 369, 4–5; in some passages Avicenna even accepts the Neo-Platonic idea of the Principle above perfection: fawqa al-tamām: Ilāhiyyāt, IV, 3, 186, 15; 188, 5–15; VIII, 6, 355, 9–10), the Principle must also be a final cause (Wisnovsky 2003a: 180–195). The idea of aim must then be (aporetically) shifted from the level of movement to that of being: the final cause is not a cause of movement but the same efficient cause that makes things exist (mūǧid). The First Principle is therefore a cause in every respect (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 1, 4, 14–17; VIII, 3). The prime unmoved mover—which is, in fact, the first caused Intelligence—justifies the movement of the world, but refers in its turn to the Principle, which is absolutely First (McGinnis 2010a: 151; cf. Physics of “The Healing” IV, 15).

2.4 Univocacy of Being and Ontological Distinction

The dual definition (and notion) of both being and metaphysics reveals the nuanced univocacy or univocity that rules both Avicenna’s ontology and his theology. If the uncaused Principle is itself part of being, then It is the principle of only part of being: of being insofar as it is caused, and not of all being or of being as such. Indeed, if the Principle were the principle of all being, it would, paradoxically, be Its own principle (while the “First” can be defined only as the being that Itself has no principle at all; the whole as such has no principle: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 2, 14, 1–16,20). Insofar as It is existent, the Principle is thus existent just as the world is. Hence the ontological distinction between the uncaused Principle and Its effect does not lie in existence as such, but in one of its modes: the uncaused Principle is necessary as regards existence, while everything else is always possible as regards existence: i.e., it exists insofar as it is necessitated and therefore necessary by virtue of something other. As a consequence, the existence of things that are in themselves possible is always conceived as related to a (possible) essence, while the being of the Principle is purely and necessarily existence: despite a certain unavoidable ambiguity in Avicenna’s language (see e.g., Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 363, 1–2; Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 5, 349, 11: “the reality of the First”), the Necessarily Existent has no essence or no quiddity that differs from existence (anniyya: Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 4, 344, 10–11; 346, 8–12; cf. Macierowski 1988) and is in that respect beyond essence. The first attribute of the Principle is “that It is and that It is existent” (inn wa-mawǧūd; Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 367, 12–13): existence is not what It “has”: It simply is.

This nuanced univocacy of being has been variously determined: scholars have adopted locutions like per prius and per posterius (Menn 2013: 163–167 on Categories, I, 2), “ambiguity of being’s univocity” (Druart 2014), “modulated univocity” (Treiger 2012) and gradual predication or predication according to an arrangement: “gradueller oder ordnungsbezogener Prädikationsmodus” (Koutzarova 2009: 211–258) or even “analogy” (De Haan 2015). Certainly Avicenna attributes existence both to the Principle and to things; he ascribes to existence differences in worth (Categories 10–11; Bertolacci 2011: 43–44)—there is in fact an evident hierarchy governing necessity and possibility (see Section 4.4); he modulates existence according to the absolute or relative necessity it expresses, clearly excludes the possibility that existence is a genus or that it is predicated equally (bi-l-tasāwī) of what is beneath it, openly speaks about its anteriority and posteriority within the same pattern of reference to be found in Aristotle (health: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 34, 15–35, 2; other passages suggest a different analogy; Menn 2013) and clearly establishes the starting-point of theology in the analysis of the existent. Existence as such has no graduations but has modes or statutes (Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 3, 276,12–14) and hierarchy is ascribed to reality (Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 3, 277,7–278,8). The necessary cause is more worthy of reality than the effect: the essence of the cause is not necessary in relation to the effect, whereas the essence of the effect is necessary only in relation to the cause.

3. Essence and Existence

3.1 The Existent as Primary

The first step in the analysis of the existent (al-mawǧūd)[6] is to acknowledge its absolute priority: the existent as such is indefinable (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 29, 5–31,9; cf. I, 2, 13, 8–13): everything implies the notion of the existent and cannot exist outside of it. In fact, whereas a definition serves to answer the question about the quiddity (māhiyya: what is it: mā huwa?) of a thing, the existent as such cannot have a quiddity (one cannot investigate its māhiyya: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 2,13, 8–13).[7] In order to ask what a thing is, one cannot avoid referring to being, which is exactly what allows us to conceive all things, whether they are sensible, imaginary or intelligible, as existent. According to Avicenna’s formula, which had a great impact on Thomas Aquinas (and on medieval Western philosophy in general), the existent is—together with the thing, the necessary and the one—one of the “intentions” (maʿānī; intentiones) that are “imprinted in the soul in a primary way” (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 29, 5–6; 30, 3–4).

The primacy of being (everything that is conceived of “is”) leads to an often unseen consequence: everything that is conceived of or simply mentally represented exists and hence has at least a mental existence (which means either intellectual or imaginary or estimative). Indeed, the existent as such is immaterial and only non-existence in the absolute sense does (obviously) not exist, since it cannot be either conceived or discussed (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 32, 6–16). Non-existent things are only relatively non-existent: resurrection, e.g., and possible and imaginary entities exist at least in the mind (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 33, 12–34, 9; cf. Arist., Metaph., 1006b10). Impossible things seem to be non-existent insofar as they are not properly conceived (intellectual existence is distinct from imaginative existence: Michot 1987; Black 1997, 1999).

Together with the distinction between mental and external existence (or existence in concrete individuals: fī l-ʿayān) Avicenna posits a distinction between the being of the thing and its existence. Clearly, then, the fundamental and primary character of being does not imply simplicity: to exist means to be a given entity in the world or—as Avicenna also uses it—a “thing” (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5). The existence of something must thus be distinguished from its being what it is.

In Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5 Avicenna summarizes the meanings of the term mawǧūd (“existent”) and of the locutions that are related to it: “thing” (šayʾ),[8] but also “what” (), “that” (allaḏī), “what is given” or “realized” (al-muḥaṣṣal) and “what is affirmed” or “established” (al-muṯbat). On the one hand, there are the existent and the thing as first notions: both indicate being as what cannot be known through anything other than itself, so that knowledge is built on it. On the other, there is what the word “thing” may also indicate in every language: “the reality whereby every thing (amr) is what it is” (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 31, 5–6; cf. VI, 5, 292, 1–5).

3.2 The Distinction Between Essence and Existence

So the analysis of being reveals two meanings of existence: the first affirms or establishes the existence of something; the second expresses, without affirming its existence, the reality by virtue of which something is what it is, namely, its essence. The first is what Avicenna calls “the existence related to the fact that [something] is established” (al-wuǧūd al-iṯbātī), the second identifies the “particular” or “proper existence” of the thing (al-wuǧūd al-ḫāṣṣ). As regards the latter, one is either not required to know whether the thing is or is not existent or else one ignores the whole question. In the first sense, then, the “existent” (or “existing”) thing stands for “what is established” (al-muṯbat) or “realized” (al-muḥaṣṣal) and affirms that something exists; in the second sense, which is expressed by “proper existence”, what is referred to is the “reality” (al-ḥaqīqa), “nature” (al-ṭabīʿa), “essence” (al-ḏāt) or—according to Avicenna’s technical terminology—“quiddity” (māhiyya) or “thingness” (šayʾiyya) of the thing. Here no existential judgment is implied (one does not know if the thing exists); what is expressed is an intentional note, independent of its existence, which necessarily accompanies it (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 31, 1–9).

The background of this distinction is Aristotelian. In a very broad sense its origin can be discovered in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (II Β 92b10)—where the question that asks “if a thing exists” is separate from the one that asks “what a thing is”—in the Metaphysics (Δ V.5, 1015a20–b15; 7, 1017a7–b10; but also Ε and Z)—where the various meanings of “being” are differentiated and the question of essence (ousia, to ti en einai) is posed—and in De interpretatione 11 21a25–8; Lizzini 2003; Menn 2013). Moreover, although original in its development Avicenna’s distinction uses terms and concepts that can be found in both the philosophical and the theological traditions of classical Islam: in al-Fārābī’s Book of Letters (K. al-Ḥurūf; cf. Menn 2008), in Yaḥyā ibn ʿAdī’s discussion of natures (Rashed 2004; Benevich 2018 and 2019; Janos 2020) and also in the distinctions of Muʿtazilite Kalām, in which a “thing” was conceived of as separate from existence (Jolivet 1984; Wisnovsky 2003a).

3.3 The Composition of Essence and Existence

If distinguishing between two areas of being—i.e., existence, which can be either mental or real, and the proper existence of the thing, i.e., its essence, quiddity, thingness (see Ilāhiyyāt I, 5 and VI, 2)—can be read as logical, its value is ontological, since the composition which is recognized in things concerns their being. Indeed, not only must the conceptual constituents that define the being of something be distinguished from the affirmation of its existence (as in gnoseology), but also the very essence of something must be metaphysically distinguished from its existence. Essence is not, so to speak, “ontologically neutral”. The essence or thingness of which Avicenna speaks is not simply the essence of the thing considered as such, regardless of its existence, but the thingness and hence the thing that, considered as such and regardless of its existence, reveals exactly the character or modality that its own existence has. If the analysis of a thing, i.e., of its quiddity or proper existence, does not inform me of its existence (by knowing what a thing is, I do not necessarily know if it is), this is because a thing is in itself only possible: it can be either existent or non-existent, and since it is in itself possibly existent, it is in itself non-existent. On the contrary, if the analysis of a thing—i.e., of its quiddity or proper existence—were to inform me positively of its existence (by knowing what a thing is, I also know that it is), this would be because a thing is in itself necessarily existent and therefore in itself existent (Lizzini 2003). Paradoxically, however, in the latter case, the “thing” in question is only necessary existence, it has no quiddity (or no quiddity beyond its existence) and is not, properly speaking, a “thing” (Bertolacci 2012a): in this case, in fact, what is revealed is the existence of the Necessary Principle, which is pure existence on condition of not and can therefore be conceived beyond essence and thingness.

The core of the distinction is that what is necessarily existent is purely existence (but not undetermined common existence) and is indeed the Necessarily Existent Principle. Conversely, everything that does not exist necessarily and therefore has a possible relation to existence is something that is possible, so that in order to exist it always and necessarily refers to a cause that makes it exist: a cause that justifies the fact that instead of being possible (mumkin) and therefore not already assigned to existence, the thing is qualified as existent. Non-determination to existence leads to non-existence (ʿadam, lays, laysa) and this is in fact what pertains to the thing in itself. Existence—or more precisely a determination of its relation to existence—pertains to the thing because of something else (the cause). In this respect, non-determination coincides with possibility, whereas determination coincides with necessity per aliud. In ontology, the logical notions of the possible and the necessary become the duo of what is “necessary in itself” and what is “necessary by virtue of another” (Naǧāt: 547–549; Lizzini 2011: 116–132).

The distinction between (or relation or composition of) quiddity and existence is a fundamental issue of Avicenna’s ontology. This holds too for the modal concepts that connote it in as much that quiddity could be said to refer to possibility, whereas existence would be necessity. Although problematic (especially as regards mental existence), it allows Avicenna to give an account of the so-called “ontological difference” between the uncaused Principle and the caused world: the First Principle is absolutely necessary and simply coincides with, or more exactly, is Its own existence: “that is” expresses a primary attribute of the Principle (all others are relations, either positive or negative: Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 367, 13–15; cf. 4, 343, 13–344, 5; 5, 354, 12–14), whereas in everything else there is a duality. In every thing the distinction between what the thing is and the fact that it is is inevitable. Existence can consequently be said to be external to essence, so that an existing thing, whose essence or quiddity is possible, can be said to be composed of essence and existence. Conversely, in that which is in itself necessary there is no need for such a composition (there is no essence: no being something, but only being). Necessity is an affirmation or more precisely a confirmation of existence (taʾakkud al-wuǧūd: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 36, 4–5). The idea of a distinction/composition thus has a precise theological function: not only does it distinguish everything from the Necessary Principle (everything except the Principle is twofold: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 47, 18–19); it also reveals the divine creative act: everything except the Principle receives (or obtains) existence (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 3, 342, 10; Taʿlīqāt, 175, 10–176, 7). The distinction also explains the derivation of celestial souls and bodies from supernal intelligences: in this respect emanation is nothing but the exposition of the dialectic between necessary existence and possible essence, which together constitute the intelligences’ being. This same distinction between a possible essence and its necessary existence can, finally, explain any causal relationship: a cause is ultimately nothing but that which allows the transition from the possible to the necessary, or that which makes possibility incline towards necessity. Certainly, a cause may, in its turn, be possible and so refer to a further cause, but every causal chain leads back to the First Cause, which is in Itself necessary and one (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 1–3).

3.4 Quiddity and Mental Existence

Nevertheless, composition is not the result of an addition. The quiddity or essence of a thing is not in its turn a “thing” with its own mental existence so that, once added to (real) existence, it could become a real thing (Lizzini 2014). This would not only lead to infinite division (in the quiddity one would again distinguish quiddity from existence), but also—as Avicenna notes—to Platonism (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 204, 4–5; cf. VII, 2–3; Marmura 2006; Porro 2002, 2011a). But here lies the problem: the distinction between essence and existence cannot obviously lead to the conclusion that essence is simply non-existent (no affirmative statement about the absolutely non-existent is possible: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 32, 12–13; cf. 15–16). What Avicenna states by distinguishing quiddity and existence in what exists either in the mind or in reality is that quiddity does not coincide with the existence of the thing: neither with its mental existence, which is related but does not correspond to universality, nor with its concrete existence (fī l-ʿayān), which implies individuality. On this point there are two fundamental if problematic sections of Ilāhiyyāt (V 1–2) where Avicenna outlines the so-called theory of the “indifference of essence”: in itself quiddity is only quiddity (equinity is only equinity: fa-l-farasiyya fī nafsi-hā farasiyya faqaṭ or, according to the celebrated Latin formula, equinitas ergo in se est equinitas tantum). The same logical consideration (iʿtibār) that Avicenna applies to the existence of God and existence in general serves here to explain the separation of quiddity from existence: the animal that is not on condition of something other is the animal in its reality or quiddity; it can exist either in the mind or in the concrete world but only if it is accompanied by some fulfilled conditions; the animal on condition of not (i.e., of not being accompanied by any other), is the abstract form that results from a mental consideration (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 203, 15–204, 13). Indeed, when it is considered either in intellectu or in re, quiddity is accompanied by existence and by the quantitative determination that belongs to it: it is then either universal or particular, although in itself it is neither universal nor particular and is nothing but quiddity. When it is considered with a quantitative determination, quiddity is thus no longer considered as it is in itself (Alexander of Aphrodisias’ Quaestiones I.3 and I.11 have been indicated as the source of this distinction: Menn 2013; cf. de Libera 1999; Benevich 2019). Every intention (maʿnā), that of universality—which is the inherent non-impossibility of a multiple predication (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 195, 4–196, 3)—and those of particularity or unity, accompanies quiddity in existence (mental or real); in Avicenna’s technical terminology they are attributes (ṣifāt) or necessary concomitants (lawāzim) of the quiddity of the thing, not identical with it. Quiddity (e.g., equinity) is not the universal (of horse):

the universal (al-kullī) insofar as it is universal, is one thing, but insofar as it is something accompanied by universality, it is another thing. (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 196, 6; Marmura 1992, slightly modified; see also The Metaphysics of the Healing, 149)

The indifference of quiddity to any kind of determination truly establishes the correspondence between reality and knowledge: it is exactly because quiddity is in itself neither real (i.e. extra-mental) nor mental that it can be present both in reality and in the mind, accompanied by the determinations of either individuality or universality: in concrete reality there is x in its particular existence, while in the mind there is x with its possible multiple predication. In this respect, the consideration of quiddity in itself—which corresponds to the thing in itself as expressed by its definition—transcends both levels of existence (external and mental) and in one passage is equated to the “divine existence” (wuǧūd ilāhī) of something that depends on God’s providence (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 204, 16–205, 4; for the possible reference to Yaḥyā ibn ʿAdī’s discussion of Alexander’s essentialism, see Rashed 2004; Menn 2013; Benevich 2018, 2019; cf. Black 1999). Quiddity is in fact the ‘reality’ of the thing and is always identical to itself (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 31,2–9, 36,4–6). Recently scholars have analyzed the question of the reality and the being of quiddity from both a logical (Benevich 2018) and an ontological perspective, highlighting the point that the discussion of the universals plays a crucial role in understanding Avicenna’s theory of quiddity in itself (Janos 2020; cf. de Libera 1999; Marmura 1992). The crux of the matter lies in the notion of mental existence. Clearly through consideration one ascribes properties to quiddity and in that respect quiddity is existent or realised (see e.g. Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 32,12). Consideration (iʿtibār) should therefore be conceived as grantinga kind of existence, although not as a composition of essence andexistence (for the mereological interpretations of quiddity, see DeHaan 2014 ; Benevich 2018 ; Janos 2020).

3.5 Ontology and Henology (Being and Oneness)

Clearly then, not only Avicenna’s ontology but also his henology should be understood in the light of the distinction between being and thing: the existent and the one are both primary indefinable concepts (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 30, 3–4) and necessary concomitants of a thing (if a thing is, it is one), but being a thing is different from existing and being one: in itself the quiddity of a thing is neither existent nor one. Indeed, even unity is an attribute or a concomitant added to quiddity as it exists (Ilāhiyyāt, V, 1, 200, 13–201, 3; 201, 8–13). So, while for Aristotle “being” and “one” are coextensive—being one is a per se attribute of being—(they are not identical in meaning, although Aristotle presents this possibility: Metaph. 1003b25), for Avicenna being and one are per se attributes of a thing, so that being and one are coextensive, although not identical in meaning, and this is so whenever we can speak of a “thing” (Druart 2001; Wisnovsky 2003a, esp. 158–60) i.e., always excepting the Principle. Consequently there is the difficulty of conceiving “one” as both univocal and transcendental: being and being one coincide only because they are both said of every category and do not indicate a substance (Ilāhiyyāt, III, 2, 103, 7–9). Unity—which is an accident in the category of quantity—is indivisibility; it is said in terms of priority and posteriority—with a certain ambiguity or modulation (bi-l-taškīk)—of several things (Ilāhiyyāt, III, 2, 97, 4–5; 99, 13–14; but cf. Averroes on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, 39–42; Menn 2013) and cannot coincide with being because otherwise multiplicity could not be (unity and multiplicity—which derives from unity—cannot be opposite: Ilāhiyyāt, III, 3, 104, 6–7; 6, 129, 11–130, 7).

4. Modality and Existence

4.1 Possibility and Necessity

The so-called distinction between essence and existence reveals an unavoidable modal characterization of being. The starting-point of Avicenna’s metaphysics is the existent, but the analysis Avicenna applies to it (see Ilāhiyyāt, I, 6) does not concern what exists insofar as it is existent (the existent is indefinable: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 2, 13, 8–13), but instead concerns the modality that explains the relation that what exists has to its own existence: an existent can be either necessary in itself (ḍarūrī; wāǧib: it is then also necessarily one) or possible (mumkin) in itself (this is the case of every existent with the exception of the First Principle: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 6, 37, 7–10). These distinctions thus reveal the inner complex of relations that explain existence: not only are the notions of existent and thing primary, but so are those of unity, necessity and—to some extent—possibility (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 5, 29, 5–6; 30, 3–4; 35, 3–4; 36, 4–5). If, on the one hand, the primacy of these notions ultimately leads to positing the transcendentals (de Libera 1994; Aertsen 2008; Bertolacci 2008a; Koutzarova 2009), on the other hand they reveal that, in the world, being is always the being of something, so that the notions of existence (unity and necessity), although separate from that of the thing, can never be isolated from the thing or from the relation that it has to existence itself. A crucial point is that the division between necessity and possibility regards something that exists. Avicenna speaks, in fact, precisely of what is “necessarily existent” or of what is “necessary as far as existence is concerned” (al-wāǧib al-wuǧūd), and of what is “possibly existent” or “possible as far as existence is concerned” (al-mumkin al-wuǧūd). What is considered is the quiddity (māhiyya) or essence (ḏāt) of what exists: the modality of existence depends, in fact, not on existence (which would be impossible), but on essence (although in the case of the Principle there is no essence different from its own existence; see Section 2.4).

Necessity (by virtue of another or in itself) defines the ways in which an existent exists: if an existent is necessary by virtue of another and therefore in itself possible, it establishes a relation ‘of being caused’ with something other than itself (its cause): it is precisely this relation that explains its existence. If an existent is necessary in itself, there is no causal relation at all (no cause). In this respect, possibility and necessity in existence are to be identified with the notion of need, dependence or link (the former) and with its negation (the latter; Ilāhiyyāt I, 6). Consequently, what is possible is always and inevitably an effect and answers the question why, while what exists necessarily does not refer to any cause and has no “why” (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 4, 348, 5–6; cf.VIII, 1, 327, 12–329,4). The Necessary Existent has no cause (cf. Taʿlīqāt, 80, 24–81, 2). It has relations in so far as it is existent (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 3, 343, 16–344, 5; cf. Lizzini 2013).

4.2 The Existence of the Necessary Principle

“Considered in themselves” (iḏā uʿtubira bi-ḏāti-hi), the things that find place in existence (al-umūr allatī tadḫulu fī l-wuǧūd) are subject to “two divisions in the intellect”: they are either “not necessarily existent”, and therefore possible, or “necessarily existent” (inherently impossible things do not exist and are excluded from the analysis: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 6, 37, 6–10).

On this basis, Avicenna deduces the properties of what is in itself necessarily existent. The first is being uncaused. It is in fact “evident” (ẓāhir: Ilāhiyyāt, I, 6, 38, 1) that the necessary has no cause: to have a cause means to exist by virtue of something else, and what exists by virtue of itself cannot exist by virtue of another, nor can it exist by virtue of itself and at the same time not exist by virtue of itself. The second property is uniqueness: the necessary has no “homologue”: there is nothing that—even if equivalent to it as regards its definition—could exist together with it and thus occupy the same rank of existence, without being either its cause or its effect. Two necessary beings would in fact either both be caused (and therefore both non-necessary), or refer to a cause that would make only one of them exist; but in the latter case, they could no longer be defined as equivalent or homologous (mutakāfī al-wuǧūd): one would be possible and caused, while the other—in the absence of another external cause—would be its cause (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 6, 39, 17–42, 7). Indeed, as shown by the discussion of the relations between form and matter (Ilāhiyyāt II, 4), and also soul and body (see the psychological part of the Book of the Healing, the Kitāb al-nafs; Avicenna’s De anima, V, 4), the co-existence of two things always implies the action of a cause that makes them exist (Lizzini 2004).

Other properties (see Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7) are attributable to a being necessary in itself: unity, simplicity and then non-relativity, immutability, non-multiplicity and non-association with anything other than itself (these properties, among others, are discussed in terms of negative attributes—ṣifāt—of the Principle in Ilāhiyyāt VIII (4, 347, 10–348, 6; 5, 354, 9–14). The various and complex justifications Avicenna uses in this respect are all reducible—as he himself observes (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 46, 4–5)—to a single general line of argumentation, which shows that two supposed necessary beings could not be distinguished one from the other: if they were to be distinguished by virtue of an essential property, they would be essentially different and therefore both not necessarily existent in themselves; if they were to be distinguished by virtue of an accidental property, they would imply the existence of an external cause and would be equally—each of them—not necessary (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 43, 4–46, 5; 46, 6–47, 5).

The Necessarily Existent is therefore absolutely one, indivisible and unique (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 47, 6–9; cf. VIII, 4, 5) and the properties of the possible are deducible as opposite to these (e contrario) (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 47, 10–19): the possible is caused and twofold (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 47, 18–19); in itself it does not exist and therefore always receives existence from something else. The hypothesis of a possible existent thing, which can both exist and not exist, leads necessarily to positing a cause that makes it necessary (by virtue of another). If the possible were not rendered necessary by its cause, but—given the cause and its relationship to it—were still possible, it would be continuously in a state in which it could exist and not exist. But since it exists (the analysis concerns existing things), its relation to the cause must be necessary. Analogously, if the cause were in its turn possible, it would refer to a further cause that would explain the existence of both the caused thing and its cause. If even this further cause were possible, it would perforce have recourse to a third one, and so on. One could not proceed ad infinitum (as an Aristotelian, Avicenna accepts only a potentially infinite series of causes) and could consequently not explain the actual existence of a thing: the thing would still be possible and therefore non-existent.

The arguments of Ilāhiyyāt I, 6–7—which are in part both reminiscent of and influential for those of the Kalām (Rudolph 1997; Alper 2004)—could be interpreted as an ontological proof of God’s existence (Hourani 1972; Morewedge 1979; Marmura 1980; Davidson 1987), especially when seen in relation to an earlier passage of Ilāhiyyāt I, where Avicenna attributes to metaphysics the power to establish the existence (iṯbāt) of God without recourse to sense data (Ilāhiyyāt I, 3, 21). Undeniably, Avicenna offers here a description of the status of necessary existence and a deduction of its properties.

4.3 The Results of the Analysis

In sum, the analysis of the thinkability of existence demonstrates that:

  1. existence and necessity are related or even coincident: every existent is necessary, either per se or per aliud;
  2. by virtue of this correlation existents are divided into two general categories: those that, considered in themselves require no (causal) connection with anything other than themselves, and those that, as they do need a (causal) link with something other, are not (in themselves) necessary;
  3. independence and dependence on some other correspond respectively to the necessity and non-necessity of “being” or the existent;
  4. everything that is not necessary in itself and is not made necessary by something other, is possible as regards both existence and non-existence: as such, without a necessitating cause it does not exist; the possible is thus exactly what must establish a causal relation as regards its own existence, which ultimately leads us back to a necessary and absolute cause;
  5. the ontological field of what is in itself necessary can comprehend only one being, simple and absolutely one and unique: the intellect can conceive of only one being whose existence is unrelated to a cause, while it conceives of things as multiple only by virtue of a relation or a connection to a cause;[9]
  6. the relationship between two things always implies a causal relation (of two separate things, either one is the cause of the other, or both are caused by a third entity), which clearly shows the need of a vertical causality (from a superior to an inferior level of being).

This general law governs Avicenna’s emanative theory: it is always a third and superior cause that accounts for two apparently correlated existing elements (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 39, 16–42).

4.4 The Kinds of Status of Existence

The significance of these determinations becomes clear if one considers the other kinds of status (aḥkām: literally “judgments, statutes, precepts”) Avicenna assigns to existence in addition to necessity and possibility (which in Ilāhiyyāt I, 1, 7, 16–19 are said to be among the proper accidents of being), namely priority and posteriority, on the one hand, and richness and poverty (or indigence), on the other (Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 3, 276, 13–277, 3).[10] These determinations explain the distinction between essence and existence (or “proper” and “affirmative” existence) and are, in turn, clarified by the notions of “nexus” and “need”. Indeed, what is necessary in itself is ontologically and axiologically prior to the possible because it is independent, whereas the possible is posterior precisely because it depends on a cause. Insofar as it is autonomous, the necessary is also rich, while the possible, which is posterior and secondary, is needy, poor or indigent. The necessary is “rich” because it is independent of any thing; the possible is “poor” because it cannot exist without something else (i.e., without the cause). From a theoretical point of view, these determinations immediately refer to a causal relation that is either negated (by what is prior, rich and necessary) or affirmed (by what is posterior, poor and possible). In other words, the determinations Avicenna calls the kinds of status of existence serve to establish a clear distinction between a kind of existence (i.e., one existent) that is necessarily uncaused and a kind of existence (i.e., of existent things) that is necessarily caused.[11] It is in fact in the light of the relationship between the absolute Principle and the world that they reveal their true significance. They have an absolute or a relative meaning according to the causal relation to which they refer. If the causal relation is relative and consequently concerns secondary causes, these determinations are relative, so that the cause is said to be necessary, prior and rich only with respect to its effect, not in itself. If the relation is absolute (if it refers to the First Cause), they are absolute: in this case, the cause is necessary, prior and rich in itself.

5. Causality and Cosmology

5.1 The Causal Relationship

The causal chain is the key idea of the argument by means of which Avicenna, in Ilāhiyyāt VIII, 1–3, posits a First Cause, in accordance with—at least partly—a cosmological scheme. Indeed, according to some scholars, this is the only place to track down a demonstration of the existence of the Principle in the Metaphysics of the Book of the Healing (Bertolacci 2007; De Haan 2016). As an Aristotelian, Avicenna establishes formal, material, efficient and final causes. Consequently, in order to demonstrate the existence of a First absolute Principle, he must show not only that “for every causal order there is a first principle” (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 1, 327, 9) but also that causal chains are all based on the same First Principle. The demonstration of the finiteness of the agent causes, from which every other series derives is an exemplar and serves as a general proof. Avicenna deduces the finiteness of all series (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 1, 329, 5–9) from the finiteness of an unqualified causal series: thus all series refer to a First Principle that is both an agent (ʿilla fāʿiliyya) and a final or completive (ʿilla tamāmiyya) cause (Ilāhiyyāt VIII, 1–3; Wisnovsky 2003a).

This argument has a general premise: “the cause of the existence of a thing exists along with it” (Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 2, 1, 264–265, 5; VIII, 1, 327, 11); its structure is taken directly, and almost verbatim, from Aristotle. The causal chain is composed—as in Metaph., α, 2, 994 a 1–19—of three elements: the cause (al-ʿilla), and then the effect (or what is caused: al-maʿlūl) and the intermediary or medium (al-mutawassiṭ), which both have a “relationship” to the cause “that consists in being caused” (nisba maʿlūlyya; see section 4.1). In a nutshell, the argument is simple: the existence of an effect (which is the cause of nothing) cannot be explained without evoking a First Cause; a cause that is cause and effect at the same time and therefore a medium, would in turn refer to a cause: therefore, no matter how many intermediate terms it includes, the series must always imply an absolutely First Cause: a cause that is a cause for each element of the series and exists together with them.

Defining the series on the basis of three elements (each with its own property: ḫāṣṣiyya), allows Avicenna to include the possibility of a multiplicity of intermediate terms (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 1, 327, 12–328, 3). In a series, in fact, the first term—the absolute cause—has the property of being the cause of all that is other than itself; however the middle term, which is a cause for one part of the series and an effect for the other, may repeat this relation in a multiplicity if not in an infinity of elements (in an eternal succession of causal relations); the effect that is simply caused, finally, has the property of being the cause of nothing. This proves to be the pattern of a causal series as such; and this is so not only because any series has its own first principle, but also because every causal series and then every causal relation finally refers to a Principle that provides its foundation by transcending it: every causal series implies a First absolute cause by which each of its elements is caused (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 1, 328, 4–329, 4). A causal chain without a primum is therefore impossible; if it is posited, this occurs “only through language” (bi-l-lisān; lingua tantum). The true causal series (i.e., the causes that always exist along with their effects) are themselves always finite (on infinity, see McGinnis 2010b).

5.2 The Causal Chain

These ideas—the series, its vertical pattern, the distinction between internal and external causes and a transcendent principle of the series—are also elaborated in the Kitāb al-Išārāt (see IV, 9–15; IV, 1–8 for its premises)— Remarks and Admonitions or Pointers—as the title of the work is known in English —, a work of extreme importance for the Eastern philosophical tradition. The Išārāt argument has been defined as a priori or ontological (Mayer 2001; cf. Marmura 1980). It originates from the general consideration of “every existent”: once examined in their essence (min ḥayṯu dāti-hi), or in isolation, without anything other than themselves, all existents either necessarily have or do not have existence in themselves: that which exists in itself is real or true (al-ḥaqq), it necessarily exists (al-wāǧib al-wuǧūd) and always subsists (al-qayyūm: an Islamic theological term); that which does not have existence in itself is always in need of a connection to something other, namely a condition (šarṭ) that will accompany it, both when it is conceived as existent and when conceived as non-existent. Thus, conceiving a causal chain means positing the existence of something that is prior and external to it. If the connection of the possible with something other than itself were continuously repeated, ad infinitum, each unit in the chain would be possible in itself, and the collection (ǧumla) that the units constitute would also, in itself, be unnecessary. In order to devise a collection of things, possible in themselves but existing, one must conceive of a collection rendered necessary by virtue of something external to it. The propensity to exist, which is necessity, is ascribed to the units of a collection, and hence to the collection itself, by something that, transcending it, is necessary in itself.

Thus Avicenna arrives at the idea of an absolute cause which is the cause of all things: the series, its units and the relations that bind them to one another. One might posit the existence of something that causes some units and not others, but this would certainly not be the absolute cause, which is a cause that cannot be caused in any way. It is an extreme (ṭaraf) and therefore neither an intermediate element nor an effect. So, every chain (silsila) needs a cause external to it: an extreme—the Necessary Existent Principle—which is not caused and therefore gives a foundation to the causal chain without being part of it. Indeed, in the Ilāhiyyāt of Kitāb al-Šifā Avicenna explicitly states that the flow of being is “distinct” (mubāyin) from the Principle (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 4, 403, 13).

5.3 Absolute creation

According to Avicenna the only way to conceive creation rationally is to conceive it as an ontological derivation outside of time. Hence the Aristotelian model of eternity must be elaborated: the world can be both eternal and created. It can, in fact, be continuously (dāʾiman) brought into existence, without any interruption or temporal precedence (it is possible and made eternally necessary per aliud by its cause). In this manner Avicenna not only develops Proclus’ idea of an eternal effect, but also integrates the theological concern for an absolute creation: indeed, he intends to ascribe to the divine action the same absoluteness that the idea of creation out of nothing is thought to imply. Using a terminology already applied by al-Kindī and distinctly reminiscent of Neo-Platonic texts (Janssens 1997), Avicenna states that the philosophers understand “creation” (ibdāʿ) as an act of bringing into existence that does not suppose a world preceded by non-existence (which would mean that creation was placed in time), but nonetheless absolutely excludes that same possibility of non-existence (Marmura 1984; Janssens 1987; Lizzini 2011):

This is the meaning that philosophers (al-ḥukamāʾ) term “instauration” (ibdāʿ): it is to make the thing be (taʾyīs al-šayʾ) after an absolute non-being (baʿda lays muṭlaq). In fact, it belongs to the effect in itself to be non-being (lays), while because of its cause it belongs to it to be “being” (ays). And what belongs to the thing in itself is prior in the mind (ḏihn)—as regards essence, not as regards time—to that which is because of something other than itself. Here then each caused [thing] “is” (ays) after “not being” (lays), according to a posteriority in essence (Ilāhiyyāt, VI, 2, 266, 12–15).

It is precisely on the basis of the problematic identification of possibility and non-existence (here lays elsewhere also ʿadam: Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 3, 342, 6–343, 6) that Avicenna shapes his idea of the divine flow in opposition to the theological conception of creation in time: for him non-existence is what the possible in itself deserves. Reworking the Aristotelian ideas of anteriority and agent causality, he ascribes to the creation by the First Principle (with the consequent non-existence of the effect) not a temporal but an essential anteriority (Marmura 1984). A non-existence that is prior in time would refute the absoluteness of creation because it would, contradictorily, posit non-existence. Moreover, this would explain a relative creation—a “certain causing to be” (taʾyīs mā)—but not an absolute instauration. The principle according to which Avicenna excludes time in the instaurative act of the First Principle is the same one that leads him to exclude any mediation: in order to be truly and absolutely that which makes things existent, the First Principle must perform an act that is free of any mediation; as Avicenna states in the Kitāb al-Išārāt (Dunyā, III vol., 95), creation is not conceivable in terms of time because a time before the creative act of God would end up being an intermediate between the First Principle and the world:

Instauration (ibdāʿ) [signifies that] from the thing [is derived] existence for [something] other than it, which depends on it alone, without an intermediary [such as] matter, or an instrument or a time. On the contrary, what is preceded by a temporal non-existence does not do without an intermediary. Instauration is of a higher rank than generation (takwīn) and than bringing [the thing] into being in time (iḥdāt).

The action of the First Cause must therefore be conceived as exempt from any mediation. Nothing (neither a matter, nor an act of will, nor even time) can be inserted between the Principle and Its effect (see also Ḥudūd: 42–43). An image often occurs in Avicenna’s writings: the causality of the First Principle is similar to that of the hand that moves the key in the lock of a door: the movement of the hand and that of the key—respectively the cause and the effect—are simultaneous, and yet one is prior to the other. Priority is essential, not temporal (Ilāhiyyāt, IV, 1, 165).

5.4 Emanation: Celestial Intelligences, Souls and Bodies

Avicenna explains the creation of the world with an idea he adopted from Arabic Neo-Platonic writings: emanation, in Arabic fayḍ (literally “flow”; cf. the Latin fluxus; Hasnawi 1990), which, like the Greek aporrein originally indicated the flow of water from a source. By virtue of an act of thought which is outside time and totally auto-reflective—the First Principle is Itself intelligence, as well as subject and object of intellection: ʿaql, ʿāqil and maʿqūl (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 6, 357, 3–12; cf. Arist., Metaph., XII (Λ) 7, 9)—a thinking entity is derived from the First Principle: an intellect or intelligence (ʿaql) which is both the objectification of the intellection of the Principle and an active subject of thought. To the extent that is possible for a caused entity (which is in itself relative), this first emanated intelligence is “one” (“from the one, insofar as it is one, comes only one”: ex uno non fit nisi unum; Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 4, 405, 13–14; cf. IX, 5, 411, 1, 5–6; Išārāt, III, ed. Dunyā, 95–102; cf. Taʿlīqāt, 97, 12–13). Nevertheless, unlike the Principle, which is absolutely simple, this first caused intelligence is already a complex existence. The reason for its existence lies in fact not only in itself—as in the case of the First Principle—but in itself (in its possibility) and in the First Principle’s act of thinking, which makes it necessary: this first created intelligence is therefore twofold.

Indeed the intrinsic duality of the first caused intelligence exhibits both the structure of the universe (Ilāhiyyāt, I, 7, 47, 18–19) and, at the same time, the reason the universe unfolds: if the First Principle’s thought can only be simple and auto-reflective, that of the first caused intelligence is already a complex thought. This first caused intelligence has not only two possible objects of thought (its Principle and itself); it also has a thought of itself, which is in turn complex: it reflects the duality of its own being, in which essence and existence (and therefore possibility and necessity) are to be distinguished. Hence the first caused intelligence thinks of the First Principle and then proceeds in its auto-intellection according to a descent which, as in a mirror, reflects (thus showing it in reverse), the ontological order of causality: the intelligence thinks first of all of its existence or actualization (its necessity per aliud) and then recognizes its potential foundation (its essence as possible). The effect of this articulation is consequently triple (“from every intelligence three things follow”: Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 4, 406 11–15):

  1. from the act by which the first caused intelligence thinks of the First Principle and aims at it, a further intelligence originates; from the act by which it thinks of itself and aims at itself, two entities originate:
  2. a soul, which is an intelligence bound to a body and which is, in some texts, equated to the practical intellect (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 387, 4–7); and
  3. the celestial body to which this intelligence is bound.

Clearly, the consequence of the immediacy of the divine act is the necessity of the series: only one caused element can derive directly from the absolutely unique Principle. Multiplicity is produced by mediation and the product of divine causality is divided between what is created directly (and is necessarily one) and what is created by way of mediation. With his emanative doctrine, Avicenna thus maintains the idea of the absolute causation of being and simultaneously establishes two distinct kinds of effects: those that correspond to the intermediate (mutawassiṭ), which is caused without mediation, and those that are like the last caused thing (maʿlūl), which is caused by virtue of the intermediate and is only an effect. In Avicenna’s emanative scheme, the first effects correspond to the celestial entities (and, strictly speaking, only to the first one, which is caused or “instaured” or absolutely created: al-mubdaʿ al-awwal); the following ones are, roughly speaking, all the effects (and, strictly speaking, the sublunary effects).

This pattern also explains the relations among the different causal series: as is the case in the Neo-Platonic tradition Avicenna divides the four Aristotelian causes into internal and external as regards the thing of which they are causes (Jolivet 1991; Bertolacci 2002; Wisnovsky 2003b); thus he inserts them in a hierarchy (cause-intermediate-caused) that places the intermediate term above the last effect, but below the absolute cause. In the sublunary world, for example, the form is part of the cause of matter and is superior to it, because it is an intermediate in the causal relation that binds matter (the last caused thing) to the intelligence—the dator formarum— from which both form and matter result (Ilāhiyyāt, II, 4, 87, 13–89, 15; VI, 1, 259, 7–10). Moreover, the effects that are caused without mediation are absolutely created (or “instaured”) and immaterial and consequently defined only by the ontological composition of the possibility of their essence and the necessity of their existence; those that are caused by virtue of a mediation are defined by virtue of their ontological composition (possibility and necessity; existence distinct from essence), but also by virtue of the composition that is consequent to the mediation: they are material entities, composed of matter and form. In this sense the whole of the cosmos is explained: the intelligences (al-ʿuqūl) that are caused directly by the Necessarily Existent (properly speaking only the first of them); the entities originated by virtue of the intellection of the first intelligences: the souls (al-nufūs) and the heavenly bodies (al-aǧrām al-samāwiyya). Both of these have an influence on the sublunary world and—like the celestial intelligences—are sometimes called “angels” in religious terms (Ilāhiyyāt, X, 1); they are followed by the world of simple effects: the beings of the sublunary world.

Indeed the intellectual process is welded to cosmology (in which the Ptolemaic system is painstakingly harmonized with Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Book Λ and De Caelo). The whole of the heavens is explained in terms of emanation or flow. In some texts, Avicenna mentions “ten intelligences after the First” (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 3, 401, 9–12): the Heavens—the outermost orb, and the orb of the fixed stars, and then Saturn, and so on, up to and including, according to the traditional scheme, the animated spheres of Jupiter, Mars, the Sun, Venus, Mercury and the Moon—are bound to the intelligences. The earth is at the center. Theology, metaphysics, cosmology and (celestial) noetic seem fused with one another.

The noetic process also explains the multiplicity of intelligibles: the Aristotelian idea of the First Principle as noesis noeseos is interpreted by means of Themistius’ idea of Its knowing all things through Itself (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 6, 359, 15–360, 10; Commentaire Lambda: 13; Pines 1987; Bertolacci 2006), but in the Principle’s thinking the multiple is intellected as a “whole” and “at once” and appears to be reduced to something unique (to one intelligible). Thus, its order (tartīb), the syllogistic concatenation of intellection that corresponds to reality, is a consequent of divine intellection and is in a sense relocated from the thought of the First Principle to that of its immediate effects (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 362, 17–366).

5.5 Celestial Movement

The explanation of celestial movement elaborates and alters some of Aristotle’s (and al-Fārābī’s) ideas. Intelligences and souls together explain—as remote and proximate causes respectively—the motion of the spheres, as they are at the root of the influence (taʾaṯṯur ) the spheres have on the sublunary world. Metaphysics explains cosmology—to which it is linked—but also adopts its data. Thus the circular movement of the spheres is explained by Avicenna not directly by means of nature—celestial bodies always leave the spot they have just attained only to return to occupy it again later, whereas through natural movement a body should come to rest in its locus naturalis—but by means of a principle which is both intellectual and psychic (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 382, 8–383, 13): the motion of the spheres is a reflection of the love and desire (ʿišq and tašawwuq; Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 387, 1–392, 3), common to both intelligences and souls, to resemble their principle (to realize their assimilation—tašabbuh—to it). It is because of this desired resemblance that celestial bodies actualize, by occupying all their possible positions in turn, the only potentiality they have (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 389, 13–390, 8; Hasnawi 1984; Janos 2011). In other words, celestial souls continuously move the bodies to which they are bound in order to realize this resemblance: each time they have before them the representation of a point they must reach by virtue of which imperfection will, however briefly, be eliminated; in a way that is in part irrational, each time every soul chooses one point rather than another (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 383, 10–11).

The movement of the spheres is thus explained by combining nature, soul and intelligence. Indeed, the soul follows nature (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 383, 7–13; in a sense, since it is not opposed to the potentiality of the body, celestial motion could be defined as natural), but is also thought and will. Only an intellectual discursive will, which is capable of a particular intellection, can explain the celestial movement by which the body is always located in a particularly determined position: the soul conceives and therefore elects and desires a movement whose status (to leave a point in order to return to it and then leave it again as in a cycle) is rightly expressed by a paradox: celestial movement is “persistence itself” (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 3, 398, 2–7). In fact, intelligences guarantee the infinity of motion because their thought is oriented towards the Principle; every intelligence moves because it looks to the Principle as to its object of love and assimilation and consequently receives from It an infinite light (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 2, 389, 10–13), while—as we have observed (see Section 2.3)—the First Principle is not a direct but a transcendent principle of motion: it is the ultimate horizon to which the intelligences look with their desire for resemblance.

6. Conclusion

6.1 The Ethical Dimension

The attribution of intellection and hence awareness to the Necessarily Existent (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 368, 6; Taʿlīqāt, 50, 23–52) allows Avicenna to connote the divine act in an ethical sense: according to Avicenna the flow explains the procession of being from the Principle—also called the Pure Good (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 3, 394, 4)—in different terms from those used of natural necessity (which is explicitly rejected together with its typical image of light: Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 363, 10–13). The atemporal act “at one blow” (dufʿatan wāḥidatan) of divine intellection—according to the formula already present in the pseudo-Theology of Aristotle—is interpreted as an act of will (irāda) and love (ʿišq). The First Necessarily Existent “creates” the world, because, having intellection of Itself, It comprehends, intends, wants and loves Its own intellection and the consequences that this entails (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 363, 14–17; 366, 8–17; Commentaire Lambda: 15, 23–24). Will and love—which Avicenna includes among the attributes of the Principle (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 366, 6–8; 370, 7)—explain the flow revealing its ethical dimension (Ilāhiyyāt, VIII, 7, 367, 7–11). The flow is the good (ḫayr) and generosity (ǧūd) and gives the world, or lets it acquire the good: indeed, the flow is good for the world, as it is generosity in itself (Lizzini 2005). Even evil (defined as non-existence or privation) is an object of divine will: it is willed accidentally, i.e., insofar as it is a necessary consequent of the good (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 6; Steel 2002). Will is also ascribed to the First Principle in terms of logical possibility: the Principle always wills (there is no time lag), but It could nevertheless have not willed to create (Ilāhiyyāt, IV, 2, 172, 13–173, 12). The very rejection of the temporal dimension which would allow an authentic conception of creatio ex nihilo, is also the condition of a true conception of the divine will, a will that coincides totally with the being of the Principle and aims at a good inherent in It, from which the good of the world follows as a consequence. The flow is indeed a communication or donation of existence: it explains the necessity per aliud of possible essences and, as a donation, connotes, in an ethical sense, the divine act (Lizzini 2011). At the same time, the definition of absolute good as the full realization of possibility is the very basis on which Avicenna ascribes an ethical dimension to the action of the First Principle; and this comes not without difficulty: it entails the First Principle’s having to create the world, because the realization of possibilities would be good (Lizzini 2014).

6.2 The Sublunary World: Matter and Evil

Without Avicenna’s attempting to provide a philosophical reason for it (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 4, 407, 4–8; Išārāt, ed. Dunyā, III, 228–230), the last intelligence does not lead to a further intelligence but instead looks after the sublunary world and human beings. Indeed, the last intelligence provides forms for the sublunary world. Called—with an expression that was to be in great favor in the Latin medieval world (which came to know it also through al-Ghazālī) “bestower” or “giver of forms” (dator formarum; Arabic: wāhib al-ṣuwar; but, for Avicenna, this name can be applied to all intelligences: Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 5, 411; 413), the last Intelligence or Agent Intellect (al-ʿaql al-faʿʿāl) represents the principle of the physical constitution of the world as well as the founding principle of human intellection (which at least in some texts Avicenna explains through the idea of donation). In general terms, the sublunary world is explained by means of the metaphysical structures used by Aristotle: matter and form, potentiality and act. These structures are nevertheless sustained by the emanative pattern which explains the world not only as regards its origin, but also as regards its “life”: generations and natural transformations are conceived as the result of a process by which matter becomes specifically prepared to receive the gift of forms from above. So to the active donation of forms by the Agent Intellect, Avicenna adds the influence of the spheres, the mutual interactions of the sublunary elements as preparatory causes and the reception of matter. The dynamic ideas of potency and act are thus elaborated and complicated: the idea of potency—quwwa—to which Avicenna adds those of preparation (istiʿdād) and specific or proper preparation (istiʿdād ḫāṣṣ)—is interpreted in the light of emanation: the potency of matter is reception in time and is in fact possibility in time. In the temporal dimension of the sublunary world—where what becomes is something after not having been it, possibility requires a substratum (matter) and becomes material potency: it thus explains a non-eternal thing, which is brought into existence “after being non-existent” (Ilāhiyyāt, IV, 2, 181, 7–12).

6.3 Concluding Remarks

Hence, through the concept of emanation, Avicenna explains the God-world relationship and, more generally, efficient causality. The causality of motion (taḥrīk) and of influence (taʾaṯṯur) are both added to and subsumed under the causality of emanation, which is sustained by the ideas of both donation and reception. With his metaphysics Avicenna provides a foundation for every level of his theory: physics and then psychology, gnoseology or epistemology, prophecy (Ilāhiyyāt, X, 2–3) and even eschatology (Ilāhiyyāt, IX, 7; Michot 1986) find their ultimate explanation in the metaphysical concept of the flow of forms. Consequently, if the Ilāhiyyāt of the Kitāb al-Šifāʾ and the metaphysical parts of the other summae (Salvation, Remarks, Science, Guidance) together with the Kitāb al-Taʿlīqāt (The Book of Notes) and other writings like the Kitāb al-Mabdaʾ wa-l-maʿād (The Book of Provenance and Destination), are essential to the study of metaphysics, it is no exaggeration to state that every work Avicenna devoted to philosophy can be relevant to the understanding of his metaphysical ideas and that metaphysical works clarify the other parts of Avicenna’s system: metaphysics is omni-comprehensive.


Roman ciphers after the title (e.g., Ilāhiyyāt) indicate the treatise/book; Arabic ciphers indicate the section/chapter, then the pages and finally the lines:

  • so Ilāhiyyāt I, 4, 26, 6–10 means: Ilāhiyyāt, treatise, I, section 4, page 26, lines 6–10.
  • Taʿlīqāt, 62, 14–19 means: page 62, lines 14–19.
  • Išārāt, III, ed. Dunyā, 95–102 means: part III, pages 95–102.

Editions and translations of Avicenna’s metaphysical texts

  • K. al-Šifāʾ, Ilāhiyyāt: Ibn Sînâ, K. al-Šifāʾ. Al-Ilāhiyyāt (Al-Shifāʾ. La Métaphysique), t. I, traités I–V, éd. par G.C. Anawati / S. Zayed, révision et introduction par I. Madkour. t. II, traités VI–X, texte établi et édité par M.Y. Mousa / S. Dunyā / S. Zayed, revu et précédé d’une introduction par le dr. I. Madkour, à l’occasion du millenaire d’Avicenne, Le Caire: Ministère de la Culture et de l’Orientation, 1960 [Iranian reprint, 1404 h./1984–85].
  • Al-Ilāhiyyāt min Kitāb al-Šifāʾ, [ed. by], H. al-Āmūlī, Maktab al-Iʾlām al-Islāmī, Qum: Markaz al-Našr, 1418 H.q./1376 H. š [1997–8].
  • Liber de philosophia prima sive scientia divina, 1. [livres I–IV]. 2. [livres V–X ]. 3. [Lexiques]. Édition critique de la traduction latine médiévale par S.Van Riet, introduction doctrinale par G. Verbeke, Louvain—Leiden: Peeters—Brill, 1977, 1980, 1983.
  • The Metaphysics of “The Healing”. A parallel English-Arabic text translated, introduced, and annotated by M.E. Marmura, Brigham Young University Press, Provo, Utah 2005.
  • La Métaphysique du Shifāʾ, 1 [Livres 1 à V ] et 2 [Livres de VI à X], traduction française du texte arabe de l’édition du Caire, introduction, notes et commentaires par G.C. Anawati, Paris: Vrin, 1978, 1985 (2).
  • Metafisica. La scienza delle cose divine dal Libro della guarigione (Kitāb al-Šifāʾ), Testo arabo a fronte, testo latino in nota. Traduzione dall’arabo, introduzioni, note e apparati di O. Lizzini. Prefazione e cura editoriale di P. Porro, Milano: Bompiani, 20062 (I ed. 2002).
  • [Le cose divine] Libro della guarigione. Le cose divine, a cura di A. Bertolacci, Torino: Utet, 2007.
  • [Naǧāt/Salvation] K. al-Naǧāt min al-ġaraq fī baḥr al-ḍalālāt (Salvation of the Immersion in the Sea of Errors), [ed. and introduction by] M. Dānišpazūh (Daneshpazhuh), Tehran: Dānišga (Daneshga) Tehran, 1985/1405.
  • [Išārāt] K. al-Išārāt wa-l-Tanbīhāt li-Abī ʿAlī ibn Sīnā maʿa šarḥ Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī, edited by S. Dunyā, al-Qāhira [Cairo]: Dār al-Maʿārif, 1957, IV voll.
  • [Remarks] Ibn Sina’s Remarks and Admonitions: Physics and Metaphysics. An Analysis and Annotated Translation, New York: Columbia University Press, 2014.
  • Livre des directives et remarques (Kitāb al-Ishārāt wa-l-Tanbīhāt). Traduction avec introduction et notes par A.M. Goichon, Paris: Vrin, 1951 [reprint Paris: Vrin—Unesco, 1999].
  • K. al-Taʿlīqāt, A. Badawī,al-Qāhira: al-hayʾa l-miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1973.
  • K. al-Taʿlīqāt, edited with Introduction and notes by S.H. Mousavian, Tehran: Iranian Institute of Philosophy, 2013.
  • K. al-Hidāya, M. ʿAbduh (ed.), Maṭbaʿ al-Qāhira: al-Qāhira al-ḥadītha, 19742.
  • K. al-Mabdaʾ wa al-Maʿād, A. Nūrānī, Muʾassasa Matalʿat Daneshga Mc Gīl, Tehran 1342h/1984.
  • Livre de la Genèse et du Retour, Traduction française intégrale par Y. Michot, Oxford 2002. http://www.muslimphilosophy.com/sina/works/AN195.pdf.
  • [Science] Le livre de Science: I (Logique, Métaphysique), II (Science naturelle, Mathématiques), trad. par M. Achena et H. Massé, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1955–1958 [2. éd. revue et corrigée 1986].
  • The “Metaphysica” of Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā): A Critical Translation-Commentary and Analysis of the Fundamental Arguments in Avicenna’s “Metaphysica” in the “Dānish Nāma-i ʿalāʾi” (The Book of Scientific Knowledge), P. Morewedge (ed.), London: Routledge and Kegan, 1973.
  • Liber de anima, 1. [livres I–III]. 2. [livres IV–V]. Édition critique de la traduction latine médiévale par S.Van Riet, introduction sur la doctrine psychologique d’Avicenne par G. Verbeke, Louvain—Leiden: Peeters—Brill, 1972, 1968.
  • [Avicenna’s De anima] Avicenna’s De Anima. Being the Psychological Part of K. al-Shifāʾ, F. Rahman (ed.), London—New York—Toronto: Oxford University Press, 1959.
  • Epistola sulla vita futura, [ed. by] F. Lucchetta [Arabic Text, Italian translation and notes], Padova: Antenore, 1969.

Other cited sources

  • [Commentaire Lambda] Avicenne, Commentaire sur le Livre Lambda de la Métaphysique d’Aristote (Ch. 6–10), éd. critique, traduction et notes par M. Geoffroy, J. Janssens, and M. Sebti, Paris: Vrin 2014.
  • [Physics of “The Healing”] –––, The Physics of “The Healing” (Books I & II): A parallel English-Arabic text, Jon McGinnis (ed. and trans.), Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2010.
  • [Ḥudūd] –––, Kitāb al-Ḥudūd: Le livre des définitions, (Kitāb al-Ḥudūd), édité, traduit et annoté par A.M. Goichon, Le Caire: Institut Français d’Archéologie Orientale, 1963.
  • [Gohlman 1974] –––, The Life of Ibn Sīnā: A Critical Edition and Annotated Translation, W.E. Gohlman, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1974.
  • [Averroes on Aristotle’s “Metaphysics”] Averroes, Averroes on Aristotle’s “Metaphysics”: An Annotated Translation of the So-called “Epitome”, by R. D. Arnzen, Berlin: De Gruyter, 2010.
  • [Badawi] Arīsṭū ʿinda al-ʿArab (Aristoteles apud Arabes). Dirāsāt wa-nuṣūṣ ġayr manšūra, A. Badawi (ed.),al-Qāhira: Maṭbaʿa Miṣr, 1947. Reprinted al-Kuwayt: Wikālat al-maṭbūʿāt, 1978.
  • Pormann, P. and P. Adamson (eds.), The Philosophical Works by al-Kindī, Karachi: Oxford University Press, 2012.
  • [Dieterici 1890] al-Fārābī, Maqāla fī aġrāḍ al-ḥakīm fī kulli maqālatin min al-kitāb al-mawsūm bi-l-ḥurūf, F. Dieterici (ed.), (Alfarabis philosophische Abhandlungen), Leiden 1890.

Secondary Literature

Other important references can be found in the works cited.

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Olga Lizzini <o.l.lizzini@vu.nl>

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