Supplement to Imagination

Puzzles and Paradoxes of Imagination and the Arts

In investigating the nature of imagination, philosophers have developed and debated a number of puzzles and paradoxes related to imagination’s role in engagement with the arts, especially with fictional narratives. These puzzles and paradoxes have been used to clarify the relationship between imagination and more familiar folk psychological attitudes, namely belief and desire. Insofar as theories of imagination are partly assessed by their ability to explain imagination’s role in engagement with the arts, these puzzles and paradoxes also function as tests for those theories.

This supplement covers four prominent puzzles in the discussions of imagination’s role in engagement with the arts. First, the puzzle of imaginative resistance explores apparent limitations on what can be imagined during engagements with the arts and, relatedly, what can be made fictional in artworks. Second, the paradox of emotional response to fictions (sometimes known as the “paradox of fiction”) examines psychological and normative similarities between affective responses prompted by imaginings versus affective responses by reality-directed attitudes. Third, the paradox of tragedy and the paradox of horror examine psychological and normative differences between affective responses prompted by imaginings versus affective responses by reality-directed attitudes. Fourth, the puzzle of moral persuasion is concerned with real-world outputs of imaginative engagements with artworks; specifically, whether and how artworks can morally educate or corrupt.


1. Imaginative Resistance

Imaginative resistance occurs when an otherwise competent imaginer experiences a constraint in taking part in an imaginative activity (see Gendler & Liao 2016 and Miyazono & Liao 2016 for overviews). Philosophers have focused primarily on when people experience imaginative resistance in response to stories. Suppose, for example, that you were confronted with a variation of Macbeth where

the facts of [Duncan’s] murder remain as they are in fact presented in the play, but it is prescribed in this alternate fiction that this was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth’s sleep. (Moran 1994)

If you find it difficult to imaginatively engage with this story, then you would be experiencing imaginative resistance.

While early discussions of imaginative resistance tended to focus on examples (like the one above) involving “morally deviant” worlds, it is now widely agreed that this initial characterization was too restrictive (Walton 2006; Yablo 2002; but see Gendler 2006 for a partial dissent). For example, Brian Weatherson (2004) has argued that resistance puzzles arise not only for normative concepts (including thick and thin moral concepts, aesthetic judgments, and epistemic evaluations), but also for attributions of mental states, attributions of content, and claims involving constitution or ontological status.

As Kendall Walton (2006: 137) notes, the questions addressed under the rubric of imaginative resistance turn out to be a “tangled nest of importantly distinct but easily confused puzzles”. Indeed, it has been argued (Weatherson 2004) that there are at least four such puzzles, illustrated with Moran’s variation-of-Macbeth example:

  1. The imaginative puzzle is concerned with the audience’s difficulties with imagining that Duncan’s murder was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth’s sleep.
  2. The fictionality puzzle is concerned with the author’s failure of authorial authority (that is, what the implied author says is true in the story world) to make it true in the story world that Duncan’s murder was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth’s sleep.
  3. The phenomenological puzzle is concerned with the audience’s sense of jarring confusion with the story’s claim that Duncan’s murder was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth’s sleep.
  4. The aesthetic value puzzle is concerned with the audience’s sense that the story is aesthetically compromised by the story’s claim that Duncan’s murder was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth’s sleep.

The bulk of philosophical discussion has been devoted—often without distinguishing between them—to the imaginative and fictionality puzzles. Three types of responses dominate early discussions of this puzzle (Gendler 2006; Gendler & Liao 2016).

Cantian theories maintain that imaginative resistance at its core can be traced to the impossibility of engaging in some sort of prompted imaginative activity: one simply can’t imagine as one has been invited to (Walton 1990, 1994b; Weatherson 2004; Weinberg & Meskin 2006; Yablo 2002). Cantian theories typically take the fictionality puzzle to be fundamental, suggesting that one experiences the jarring phenomenology and the imaginative inability associated with imaginative resistance because the default position of authorial authority has broken down.

Wontian theories maintain that imaginative resistance can be traced to an unwillingness to engage in some sort of prompted imaginative activity: one simply won’t imagine as one has been invited to (Currie 2002a; Gendler 2000a, 2006; Stokes 2006). Wontian theories typically take the imaginability puzzle to be fundamental. According to them, the default position of authorial authority breaks down because the reader finds it improper to engage in the imaginative activity that is prompted, such as imaginatively taking on morally deviant attitudes.

Eliminativist theories maintain that there is no such a thing as imaginative resistance per se (Mothersill 2003; Stock 2005; Tanner 1994; Todd 2009). Rather, they maintain, the appearance of a philosophical problem arises from the bizarre so-called stories that philosophers have concocted. Nothing like the imaginative, fictionality, or phenomenological puzzles arises with narratives and imaginings in ordinary non-philosophical contexts.

Most recently, philosophers have built on one insight of eliminativist theories—the importance of context—to refine earlier cantian and wontian theories (Brock 2012; Clavel-Vazquez 2018; Liao 2016; Nanay 2010; Stear 2015). During the same period, philosophers and psychologists have also started to conduct experimental studies to clarify the contours of imaginative resistance (Black, Capps, & Barnes 2018; Kim, Kneer, & Stuart, forthcoming; Liao, Strohminger, & Sripada 2014).

2. Emotional Response to Fictions

The paradox of emotional response to fictions (sometimes known simply as the “paradox of fiction”) arises because people seem to routinely exhibit genuine emotional responses to characters, situations, and events that are merely imagined. Given the central role of imagination in engagement with fictions, this paradox has been used to clarify the cognitive architectural connection between imagination and emotions.

The paradox is typically formulated using the following three statements (Friend 2016; see also Radford 1975; Gendler & Kovakovich 2005):

  1. Response Condition: People experience (genuine, ordinary) emotions toward fictional characters, situations, and events.
  2. Belief Condition: People do not believe in the existence of fictional characters, situations, and events.
  3. Coordination Condition: People do not experience (genuine, ordinary) emotions when they do not believe in the existence of the objects of emotion.

Each of the three statements seem intuitively true, and yet they are jointly inconsistent. The descriptive version of the paradox (originating in Walton 1978) is concerned with the question of whether emotional responses to fictions are to be classified as the same kind of emotions we experience in other contexts. The normative version of the paradox (originating in Radford 1975) is concerned with the question of whether emotional responses to fictions are irrational or inappropriate.

The debate over the descriptive version of the paradox revolves around which of the statements to reject.

The Belief Condition is rarely challenged. Its rejection has few adherents among contemporary philosophers (a possible historical advocate is Coleridge 1817) and is generally discussed only to be subsequently dismissed (see Currie 1990; Radford 1975; Walton 1978). The Response Condition is also rarely rejected, though some follow Kendall Walton (1978, 1990, 1997), who argues that emotional responses to fictions are “quasi-emotions”, which differ from genuine emotions in their source (they are generated by beliefs about what is fictionally rather than actually true), and, typically, in their behavioral consequences (though we may pity Ophelia, we make no effort to console her in her sorrow.)

By far, the orthodoxy is to reject Coordination Condition. Broad cognitivists hold that emotions must be triggered by a cognitive mental state, but (cognitive) imagination can play that role as well as belief (Carroll 1990; Feagin 1996; Gendler 2008a, 2008b; Lamarque 1981; Matravers 1998; Meskin & Weinberg 2003; Moran 1994; Weinberg & Meskin 2006). Noncognitivists hold that emotions do not need to be triggered by any cognitive mental state (Robinson 2005).

The normative version of the paradox treats Coordination Condition as a norm governing emotional responses to fictions. Unlike the descriptive version of the paradox, the normative version concedes that people experience (genuine, ordinary) emotions toward fictional characters, situations, and events; but it alleges that they are irrational or inappropriate in doing so.

The resolution of the normative version of the paradox depends on the relevant conception of rationality or appropriateness. Tamar Szabó Gendler and Karson Kovakovich (2005) argue that emotions in response to the merely imagined are essential to rational decision making; so, emotional response to fictions might be instrumentally or evolutionarily rational. Others, however, appeal to fittingness norms of emotions (D’Arms & Jacobson 2000), distinctive norms for fictions (Friend 2010; Gilmore 2011), or even moral norms for engaging with fictional narratives (see Eaton 2016 for an overview; see also section 1 of this supplement).

3. Tragedy and Horror

While the paradox of emotional response to fictions focuses on the similarity between our reactions to the imaginary and the real, the paradox of tragedy (which arguably goes back to Aristotle’s Poetics) and the paradox of horror (Carroll 1990) focus on the difference between them. While people generally avoid real scenarios that make us sad, they seem to (sometimes) seek out imaginary scenarios that make us sad, such as those in works of tragedy. While people generally avoid real scenarios that make us fearful, they seem to (sometimes) seek out imaginary scenarios that make them fearful, such as those in works of horror. Again, given the central role of imagination in engagement with fictions, the paradoxes of tragedy and horror—along with the paradox of emotional responses to fictions—have been used to clarify the cognitive architectural connection between imagination and emotions.

Aaron Smuts (2009: 42) offers a generalization of the two paradoxes in terms of three statements that each seems true but are jointly inconsistent. Below is a slightly modified formulation of the paradox, focusing just on tragedy:

  1. Negative Emotion Condition: People experience negative emotions in response to tragedy.
  2. Negative Avoidance Condition: If people experience negative emotions in response to something, then they tend to avoid it.
  3. Non-Avoidance Condition: People do not tend to avoid tragedy.

No solution rejects Non-Avoidance Condition.

Solutions that reject Negative Emotion Condition deny that—properly understood—the emotion that tragedy evokes in us is negative. For example, David Hume (“Of Tragedy”) offers a conversion solution: in the context of imaginative engagement with the arts, such negative emotional responses are converted into something positive and pleasant.

Solutions that reject Negative Avoidance Condition deny that people tend to avoid things that evoke negative emotions in them. Aristotle (Poetics) is often attributed the cathartic solution, in which people seek out tragedy for its purification or purgation effects. While this is a popular folk view, Smuts (2009) offers forceful criticisms. Smuts (2007) defends a kind of compensation solution, in which people seek out tragedy for the valuable rich experience it provides. Susan Feagin (1983) defends a representative metacompensation solution, in which people experience pleasure—something like a self-congratulatory feeling—toward their emotional response to tragedy.

4. Moral Persuasion

Since ancient times, philosophers and others have argued that representational arts can play a role in moral persuasion. Plato famously warned against the power of poetry to morally corrupt its audience (Republic X; see also entry on Plato on rhetoric and poetry). Contemporary philosophers tend to focus more on the prospect of moral education (see, for example, Carroll 2002; Currie 1995; Jacobson 1996; Kieran 1996; Murdoch 1970; Nussbaum 1990; Robinson 2005).

A persistent puzzle of moral persuasion asks how imaginative representations can change moral perspectives that are applicable to the real world. This puzzle has been used to clarify the connections between imagination and other components of the cognitive architecture that figure more frequently in discussions of moral psychology—namely belief, desire, and emotions.

As Noël Carroll (2000) outlines, there are three broad approaches to this puzzle. The knowledge approach argues that engagement with the arts can give a person propositional knowledge of moral truths that are abstracted from the fictional representation. The acquaintance approach argues that engagement with the arts can give a person acquaintance knowledge with novel perspectives and novel circumstances. The cultivation approach, by contrast, does not claim that engagement with the arts can give a person any new knowledge; rather, the engagement allows the person to refine and practice their existing moral understandings and capabilities.

Martha Nussbaum (1990) provides an account that exemplifies an acquaintance-cultivation approach. Nussbaum maintains that one of the central moral skills is the ability to discern morally salient features of one’s situation. This skill, she contends, is one that must be developed, and one to which the engagement with literature might effectively contribute by providing “close and careful interpretative descriptions” of imagined scenarios that enable emotional involvement untainted by distorting self-interest (1990: 46–48). Jèmeljan Hakemulder (2000) reviews some empirical psychological evidence for this hypothesis.

Tamar Szabó Gendler (2000, 2006) suggests that there is a symmetric relation between what we import into an imaginative engagement and what we export from it. Indeed, it is this observation that underlies her account of imaginative resistance, which says that we resist imaginatively engaging with morally deviant fictional worlds because we do not want to export its moral perspective back to our own (see section 1 of this supplement). Shen-yi Liao (2013) draws on this observation to argue that the way that an artwork can change one’s moral perspective is, in part, dependent on its genre.

Copyright © 2018 by
Shen-yi Liao <liao.shen.yi@gmail.com>
Tamar Gendler <tamar.gendler@yale.edu>

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