To imagine is to form a mental representation that does not aim at things as they actually, presently, and subjectively are. One can use imagination to represent possibilities other than the actual, to represent times other than the present, and to represent perspectives other than one’s own. Unlike perceiving and believing, imagining something does not require one to consider that something to be the case. Unlike desiring or anticipating, imagining something does not require one to wish or expect that something to be the case.
Imagination is involved in a wide variety of human activities, and has been explored from a wide range of philosophical perspectives. Philosophers of mind have examined imagination’s role in mindreading and in pretense. Philosophical aestheticians have examined imagination’s role in creating and in engaging with different types of artworks. Epistemologists have examined imagination’s role in theoretical thought experiments and in practical decision-making. Philosophers of language have examined imagination’s role in irony and metaphor.
Because of the breadth of the topic, this entry focuses exclusively on contemporary discussions of imagination in the Anglo-American philosophical tradition. For an overview of historical discussions of imagination, see the sections on pre-twentieth century and early twentieth century accounts of entry on mental imagery; for notable historical accounts of imagination, see corresponding entries on Aristotle, Thomas Hobbes, David Hume, Immanuel Kant, and Gilbert Ryle; for a more detailed and comprehensive historical survey, see Brann 1991; and for a sophisticated and wide-ranging discussion of imagination in the phenomenological tradition, see Casey 2000.
- 1. The Nature of Imagination
- 2. Imagination in Cognitive Architecture
- 3. Roles of Imagination
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
1. The Nature of Imagination
A variety of roles have been attributed to imagination across various domains of human understanding and activity (section 3). Not surprisingly, it is doubtful that there is one component of the mind that can satisfy all the various roles attributed to imagination (Kind 2013). Nevertheless, perhaps guided by these roles, philosophers have attempted to clarify the nature of imagination in three ways. First, philosophers have tried to disambiguate different senses of the term “imagination” and, in some cases, point to some core commonalities amongst the different disambiguations (section 1.1). Second, philosophers have given partial taxonomies to distinguish different types of imaginings (section 1.2). Third, philosophers have located norms that govern paradigmatic imaginative episodes (section 1.3).
1.1 Varieties of Imagination
There is a general consensus among those who work on the topic that the term “imagination” is used too broadly to permit simple taxonomy. Indeed, it is common for overviews to begin with an invocation of P.F. Strawson’s remarks in “Imagination and Perception”, where he writes:
The uses, and applications, of the terms “image”, “imagine”, “imagination”, and so forth make up a very diverse and scattered family. Even this image of a family seems too definite. It would be a matter of more than difficulty to identify and list the family’s members, let alone their relations of parenthood and cousinhood. (Strawson 1970: 31)
These taxonomic challenges carry over into attempts at characterization. In the opening chapter of Mimesis as Make-Believe—perhaps the most influential contemporary monograph on imagination—Kendall Walton throws up his hands at the prospect of delineating the notion precisely. After enumerating and distinguishing a number of paradigmatic instances of imagining, he asks:
What is it to imagine? We have examined a number of dimensions along which imaginings can vary; shouldn’t we now spell out what they have in common?—Yes, if we can. But I can’t. (Walton 1990: 19)
Leslie Stevenson (2003: 238) makes arguably the only recent attempt at a somewhat comprehensive inventory of the term’s uses, covering twelve of “the most influential conceptions of imagination” that can be found in recent discussions in “philosophy of mind, aesthetics, ethics, poetry and … religion”.
1.2 Taxonomies of Imagination
To describe the varieties of imaginings, philosophers have given partial and overlapping taxonomies.
Some taxonomies are merely descriptive, and they tend to be less controversial. For example, Kendall Walton (1990) distinguishes between spontaneous and deliberate imagining (acts of imagination that occur with or without the one’s conscious direction); between occurrent and nonoccurrent imaginings (acts of imagination that do or do not occupy the one’s explicit attention); and between social and solitary imaginings (episodes of imagining that occur with or without the joint participation of several persons).
One notable descriptive taxonomy concerns imagining from the inside versus from the outside (Williams 1973; Wollheim 1973; see Ninan 2016 for an overview). To imagine from the outside that one is Napoleon involves imagining a scenario in which one is Napoleon. To imagine from the inside that one is Napoleon involves that plus something else: namely, that one is occupying the perspective of Napoleon. Imagining from the inside is essentially first-personal, imagining from the outside is not. This distinction between two modes of imagining is especially notable for its implications for thought experiments about the metaphysics of personal identity (Nichols 2008; Ninan 2009; Williams 1973).
Some taxonomies aim to be more systematic—to carve imaginings at their joints, so to speak—and they, as one might expect, tend to be more controversial.
Gregory Currie and Ian Ravenscroft (2002) distinguishes creative imagination (combining ideas in unexpected and unconventional ways); sensory imagination (perception-like experiences in the absence of appropriate stimuli); and what they call recreative imagination (an ability to experience or think about the world from a perspective different from the one that experience presents). Neil Van Leeuwen (2013, 2014) takes a similar approach to delineate three common uses of “imagination” and cognate terms. First, these terms can be used to refer to constructive imagining, which concerns the process of generating mental representations. Second, these terms can be used to refer to attitude imagining, which concerns the propositional attitude one takes toward mental representations. Third, these terms can be used to refer to imagistic imagining, which concerns the perception-like format of mental representations.
Amy Kind and Peter Kung (2016b) pose the puzzle of imaginative use—on the seeming irreconcilability between the transcendent uses of imagination, which enables one to escape from or look beyond the world as it is, and the instructive uses of imagination, which enables one to learn about the world as it is. Kind and Kung ultimately resolve the puzzle by arguing that the same attitude can be put to these seemingly disparate uses because the two uses differ not in kind, but in degree—specifically, the degree of constraint on imaginings.
Finally, varieties of imagination might be classified in terms of their structure and content. Consider the following three types of imaginings, each illustrated with an example. When one imagines propositionally, one represents to oneself that something is the case. So, for example, Juliet might imagine that Romeo is by her side. To imagine in this sense is to stand in some mental relation to a particular proposition (see entry on propositional attitude reports). When one imagines objectually, one represents to oneself a real or make-believe entity or situation (Yablo 1993; see also Martin 2002; Noordhof 2002; O’Shaughnessy 2000). So, for example, Prospero might imagine an acorn or a nymph or the city of Naples or a wedding feast. To imagine in this sense is to stand in some mental relation to a representation of an (imaginary or real) entity or state of affairs. When one imagines X-ing, one simulatively represents to oneself some sort of activity or experience (Walton 1990). So, for example, Ophelia might imagine seeing Hamlet or getting herself to a nunnery. To imagine in this sense is to stand in a first-personal mental relation to some (imaginary or real) behavior or perception.
1.3 Norms of Imagination
There are general norms that govern operations of imagination (Gendler 2003).
Mirroring is manifest to the extent that features of the imaginary situation that have not been explicitly stipulated are derivable via features of their real-world analogues, or, more generally, to the extent that imaginative content is taken to be governed by the same sorts of restrictions that govern believed content. For example, in a widely-discussed experiment conducted by Alan Leslie (1994), children are asked to engage in an imaginary tea party. When an experimenter tips and “spills” one of the (empty) teacups, children consider the non-tipped cup to be “full” (in the context of the pretense) and the tipped cup to be “empty” (both within and outside of the context of the pretense). In fact, both make-believe games and more complicated engagements with the arts are governed by principles of generation, according to which prompts or props prescribe particular imaginings (Walton 1990).
Quarantining is manifest to the extent that events within the imagined or pretended episode are taken to have effects only within a relevantly circumscribed domain. So, for example, the child engaging in the make-believe tea party does not expect that “spilling” (imaginary) “tea” will result in the table really being wet, nor does a person who imagines winning the lottery expect that when she visits the ATM, her bank account will contain a million dollars. More generally, quarantining is manifest to the extent that proto-beliefs and proto-attitudes concerning the imagined state of affairs are not treated as beliefs and attitudes relevant to guiding action in the actual world.
Although imaginative episodes are generally governed by mirroring and quarantining, both may be violated in systematic ways.
Mirroring gives way to disparity as a result of the ways in which (the treatment of) imaginary content may differ from (that of) believed content. Imagined content may be incomplete (for example, there may be no fact of the matter (in the pretense) just how much tea has spilled on the table) or incoherent (for example, it might be that the toaster serves (in the pretense) as a logical-truth inverter). And content that is imagined may give rise to discrepant responses, most strikingly in cases of discrepant affect—where, for example, the imminent destruction of all human life is treated as amusing rather than terrifying.
Quarantining gives way to contagion when imagined content ends up playing a direct role in actual attitudes and behavior (see also Gendler 2008a, 2008b). This is common in cases of affective transmission, where an emotional response generated by an imagined situation may constrain subsequent behavior. For example, imagining something fearful (such as a tiger in the kitchen) may give rise to actual hesitation (such as reluctance to enter the room). And it also occurs in cases of cognitive transmission, where imagined content is thereby “primed” and rendered more accessible in ways that go on to shape subsequent perception and experience. For example, imagining some object (such as a sheep) may make one more likely to “perceive” such objects in one’s environment (such as mistaking a rock for a ram).
2. Imagination in Cognitive Architecture
One way to make sense of the nature of imagination is by drawing distinctions, giving taxonomies, and elucidating governing norms (section 1). Another, arguably more prominent, way to make sense of the nature is by figuring out, in a broadly functionalist framework, how it fits in with more well-understood mental entities from folk psychology and scientific psychology (see entry on functionalism).
There are two related tasks involved. First, philosophers have used other mental entities to define imagination by contradistinction (but see Wiltsher forthcoming for a critique of this approach). To give an oversimplified example, many philosophers hold that imagining is like believing except that it does not directly motivate actions. Second, philosophers have used other mental entities to understand the inputs and outputs of imagination. To give an oversimplified example, many philosophers hold that imagination does not output to action-generating systems.
Amongst the most widely-discussed mental entities in contemporary discussions of imagination are belief (section 2.1), desire (section 2.2), mental imagery (section 2.3), memory (section 2.4), and supposition (section 2.5). The resolution of these debates ultimately rest on the extent to which the imaginative attitude(s) posited can fulfill the roles ascribed to imagination from various domains of human understanding and activity (section 3).
2.1 Imagination and Belief
To believe is to take something to be the case or regard it as true (see entry on belief). When one says something like “the liar believes that his pants are on fire”, one attributes to the subject (the liar) an attitude (belief) towards a proposition (his pants are on fire). Likewise, when one says something like “the liar imagines that his pants are on fire”, one attributes to the subject (the liar) an attitude (imagination) towards a proposition (his pants are on fire). The similarities and differences between the belief attribution and the imagination attribution point to similarities and differences between imagining and believing.
Imagining and believing are both cognitive attitudes that are representational. They take on the same kind of content: representations that stand in inferential relationship with one another. On the single code hypothesis, it is the sameness of the representational format that grounds functional similarities between imagining and believing (Nichols & Stich 2000, 2003; Nichols 2004a). As for their differences, there are two main options for distinguishing imagining and believing (Sinhababu 2016).
The first option characterizes their difference in normative terms. While belief aims at truth, imagination does not (Humberstone 1992; Shah & Velleman 2005). If the liar did not regard it as true that his pants are on fire, then it seems that he cannot really believe that his pants are on fire. By contrast, even if the liar did not regard it as true that his pants are on fire, he can still imagine that his pants are on fire. While the norm of truth is constitutive of the attitude of belief, it is not constitutive of the attitude of imagination. In dissent, Neil Sinhababu (2013) argues that the norm of truth is neither sufficient nor necessary for distinguishing imagining and believing.
The second option characterizes their difference in functional terms. One purported functional difference between imagination and belief concerns their characteristic connection to actions. If the liar truly believes that his pants are on fire, he will typically attempt to put out the fire by, say, pouring water on himself. By contrast, if the liar merely imagines that his pants are on fire, he will typically do no such thing. While belief outputs to action-generation system, imagination does not (Nichols & Stich 2000, 2003). David Velleman (2000) and Tyler Doggett and Andy Egan (2007) point to particular pretense behaviors to challenge this way of distinguishing imagining and believing. Velleman argues that a belief-desire explanation of children’s pretense behaviors makes children “depressingly unchildlike”. Doggett and Egan argue that during immersive episodes, pretense behaviors can be directly motivated by imagination. In response to these challenges, philosophers typically accept that imagination can have a guidance or stage-setting role in motivating behaviors, but reject that it directly outputs to action-generation system (Van Leeuwen 2009; O’Brien 2005; Funkhouser & Spaulding 2009; Everson 2007; Kind 2011; Currie & Ravenscroft 2002).
Another purported functional difference between imagination and belief concerns their characteristic connection to emotions. If the liar truly believes that his pants are on fire, then he will be genuinely afraid of the fire; but not if he merely imagines so. While belief evokes genuine emotions toward real entities, imagination does not (Walton 1978, 1990, 1997; see also related discussion of the paradox of fictional emotions in Supplement on Puzzles and Paradoxes of Imagination and the Arts). This debate is entangled with the controversy concerning the nature of emotions (see entry on emotion). In rejecting this purported functional difference, philosophers also typically reject narrow cognitivism about emotions (Nichols 2004a; Meskin & Weinberg 2003; Weinberg & Meskin 2005, 2006; Kind 2011; Spaulding 2015; Carruthers 2003, 2006).
Currently, the consensus is that there exists some important difference between imagining and believing. Yet, there are two distinct departures from this consensus. On the one hand, some philosophers have pointed to novel psychological phenomena in which it is unclear whether imagination or belief is at work—such as delusions (Egan 2008a) and immersed pretense (Schellenberg 2013)—and argued that the best explanation for these phenomena says that imagination and belief exists on a continuum. In responding to the argument from immersed pretense, Shen-yi Liao and Tyler Doggett (2014) argue that a cognitive architecture that collapses distinctive attitudes on the basis of borderline cases is unlikely to be fruitful in explaining psychological phenomena. On the other hand, some philosophers have pointed to familiar psychological phenomena and argued that the best explanation for these phenomena says that imagination is ultimately reducible to belief. Peter Langland-Hassan (2012, 2014) argues that pretense can be explained with only reference to beliefs—specifically, beliefs about counterfactuals. Derek Matravers (2014) argues that engagements with fictions can be explained without references to imaginings.
2.2 Imagination and Desire
To desire is to want something to be the case (see entry on desire). Standardly, the conative attitude of desire is contrasted with the cognitive attitude of belief in terms of direction of fit: while belief aims to make one’s mental representations match the way the world is, desire aims to make the way the world is match one’s mental representations. Recall that on the single code hypothesis, there exists a cognitive imaginative attitude that is structurally similar to belief. Is there a conative imaginative attitude—call it desire-like imagination (Currie 1997, 2002a, 2002b, 2010; Currie and Ravenscroft 2002), make-desire (Currie 1990; Goldman 2006), or i-desire (Doggett & Egan 2007, 2012)—that is structurally similar to desire?
The debates on the relationship between imagination and desire is, not surprisingly, thoroughly entangled with the debates on the relationship between imagination and belief. One impetus for positing a conative imaginative attitude comes from behavior motivation in imaginative contexts. Tyler Doggett and Andy Egan (2007) argue that cognitive and conative imagination jointly output to action-generation system, in the same way that belief and desire jointly do. Another impetus for positing a conative imaginative attitude comes from emotions in imaginative contexts (see related discussions of the paradox of fictional emotions and the paradoxes of tragedy and horror in Supplement on Puzzles and Paradoxes of Imagination and the Arts). Gregory Currie and Ian Ravenscroft (2002) and Doggett and Egan (2012) argue the best explanation for people’s emotional responses toward non-existent fictional characters call for positing conative imagination. Currie and Ravenscroft (2002), Currie (2010), and Doggett and Egan (2007) argue that the best explanation for people’s apparently conflicting emotional responses toward tragedy and horror too call for positing conative imagination.
Given the entanglement between the debates, competing explanations of the same phenomena also function as arguments against conative imagination (Nichols 2004a, 2006b; Meskin & Weinberg 2003; Weinberg & Meskin 2005, 2006; Spaulding 2015; Kind 2011; Carruthers 2003, 2006; Funkhouser & Spaulding 2009; Van Leeuwen 2011). In addition, another argument against conative imagination is that its different impetuses call for conflicting functional properties. Amy Kind (2016b) notes a tension between the argument from behavior motivation and the argument from fictional emotions: conative imagination must be connected to action-generation in order for it to explain pretense behaviors, but it must be disconnected from action-generation in order for it to explain fictional emotions. Similarly, Shaun Nichols (2004b) notes a tension between Currie and Ravenscroft’s (2002) argument from paradox of fictional emotions and argument from paradoxes of tragedy and horror.
2.3 Imagination, Imagery, and Perception
To have a (merely) mental image is to have a perception-like experience triggered by something other than the appropriate external stimulus; so, for example, one might have “a picture in the mind’s eye or … a tune running through one’s head” (Strawson 1970: 31) in the absence of any corresponding visual or auditory object or event (see entry on mental imagery). While it is propositional imagination that gets compared to belief and desire, it is sensory or imagistic imagination that get compared to perception (Currie & Ravenscroft 2002). Although it is possible to form mental images in any of the sensory modalities, the bulk of discussion in both philosophical and psychological contexts has focused on visual imagery.
Broadly, there is agreement on the similarity between mental imagery and perception in phenomenology, which can be explicated as a similarity in content (Nanay 2016b; see, for example, Kind 2001; Nanay 2015; Noordhof 2002). Potential candidates for distinguishing mental imagery and perception include intensity (Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature; but see Kind 2017), voluntariness (McGinn 2004; Ichikawa 2009), causal relationship with the relevant object (Noordhof 2002); however, no consensus exists on features that clearly distinguish the two, in part because of ongoing debates about perception (see entries on contents of perception and epistemological problems of perception).
What is the relationship between imaginings and mental imagery?
Historically, mental imagery is thought to be an essential component of imaginings. Aristotle’s phantasia, which is sometimes translated as imagination, is a faculty that produces images (De Anima; see entry on Aristotle’s conception of imagination; but see Caston 1996). René Descartes (Meditations on First Philosophy) and David Hume (Treatise of Human Nature) both thought that to imagine just is to hold a mental image, or an impression of perception, in one’s mind. However, George Berkeley’s puzzle of visualizing the unseen (Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous) arguably suggests the existence of a non-imagistic hypothetical attitude.
Against the historical orthodoxy, the contemporary tendency is to recognize that there is at least one species of imagination—propositional imagination—that does not require mental imagery. For example, Kendall Walton simply states, “imagining can occur without imagery” (1990: 13). Against this orthodoxy, Amy Kind (2001) argues that an image-based account can explain three crucial features of imagination—directedness, active nature, and phenomenological character—better than its imageless counterpart. In turn, Peter Langland-Hassan (2015) develops a pluralist position on which there exists a variety of imaginative attitudes, including ones that can take on hybrid contents that are partly propositional and partly sensorily imagistic. (For a nuanced overview of this debate, see Gregory 2016: 103–106.)
Finally, the relationship between mental imagery and perception has potential implications for the connection between imagination and action. The orthodoxy on propositional belief-like imagination holds that imagination does not directly output to action-generation system; rather, the connection between the two is mediated by belief and desire. In contrast, the enactivist program in the philosophy of perception holds that perception can directly output to action-generation system (see, for example, Nanay 2013). Working from the starting point that imagistic imagination is similar to perception in its inclusion of mental imagery, some philosophers have argued for a similar direct connection between imagistic imagination and action-generation system (Langland-Hassan 2015; Nanay 2016a; Van Leeuwen 2011, 2016b). That is, there exist imagery-oriented actions that are analogous to perception-oriented actions. For example, Neil Van Leeuwen (2011) argues that an account of imagination that is imagistically-rich can better explain pretense behaviors than its propositional-imagination-only rivals.
2.4 Imagination and Memory
To remember, roughly, is to form a mental representation of something that is no longer the case. On the standard taxonomy, there are three types of memory. Nondeclarative memory involves mental content that is not consciously accessible, such as one’s memory of how to ride a bike. Semantic declarative memory involves mental content that are propositional and not first-personal, such as one’s memory that Taipei is the capital of Taiwan. Episodic declarative memory involves mental content about one’s own past, such as one’s memory of the birth of one’s child. (See entry on memory for a detailed discussion of this taxonomy, and especially the criterion of episodicity.) In situating imagination in cognitive architecture, philosophers have typically focused on similarities and differences between imagination and episodic declarative memory.
There are obvious similarities between imagination and memory: both typically involve imagery, both typically concern what is not presently the case, and both frequently involve perspectival representations. Thomas Hobbes (Leviathan: 2.3) claims that “imagination and memory are but one thing, which for diverse consideration has diverse names”. In making this bold statement, Hobbes represents an extreme version of continuism, a view on which imagination and memory refer to the same psychological mechanisms.
The orthodoxy on imagination and memory in the history of philosophy, however, is discontinuism, a view on which there are significant differences between imagination and memory, even if there are overlaps in their psychological mechanisms. Some philosophers find the distinction in internalist factors, such as the phenomenological difference between imagining and remembering. Most famously, David Hume sought to distinguish the two in terms of vivacity—“the ideas of the memory are much more lively and strong than those of the imagination” (Treatise of Human Nature: 1.3; but see Kind 2017). Others who have adopted a phenomenological criterion include René Descartes, Bertrand Russell, and William James (De Brigard 2017). Other philosophers find the distinction in externalist factors, such as the causal connection that exists between memories and the past that is absent with imagination. Aristotle uses the causal connection criterion to distinguish between imagination and memory (De Anima 451a2; 451a8–12; see De Brigard 2017). Indeed, nowadays the idea that a causal connection is essential to remembering is accepted as “philosophical common sense” (see entry on memory; but see also De Brigard 2014 on memory traces). As such, it is unsurprising that discontinuism remains the orthodoxy. As J. O. Urmson (1967: 83) boldly claims, “One of these universally admitted distinctions is that between memory and imagination”.
In recent years, two sets of findings from cognitive science has given philosophers reasons to push back against discontinuism.
The first set of findings concern distortions and confabulations. The traditional conception of memory is that it functions as an archive: past experiences are encapsulated and stored in the archive, and remembering is just passively retrieving the encapsulated mental content from the archive (Robins 2016). Behavioral psychology has found numerous effects that challenge the empirical adequacy of the archival conception of memory. Perhaps the most well-known is the misinformation effect, which occurs when a subject incorporates inaccurate information into their memory of an event—even inaccurate information that they received after the event (Loftus 1979 ).
The second set of findings concern the psychological underpinnings of “mental time travel”, or the similarities between remembering the past and imagining the future, which is also known as mental time travel (see Schacter et al. 2012 for a review). Using fMRI, neuroscientists have found a striking overlap in the brain activities for remembering the past and imagining the future, which suggest that the two psychological processes utilize the same neural network (see, for example, Addis et al. 2007; Buckner & Carroll 2007; Gilbert & Wilson 2007; Schacter et al. 2007; Suddendorf & Corballis 1997, 2007). The neuroscientific research is preceded by and corroborated by works from developmental psychology (Atance & O’Neill 2011) and on neurodivergent individuals: for example, the severely amnesic patient KC exhibits deficits with remembering the past and imagining the future (Tulving 1985), and also exhibits deficits with the generation of non-personal fictional narratives (Rosenbaum et al. 2009). Note that, despite the evocative contrast between “remembering the past” and “imagining the future”, it is questionable whether temporality is the central contrast. Indeed, some philosophers and psychologists contend that temporality is orthogonal to the comparison between imagination and memory (De Brigard & Gessell 2016; Schacter et al. 2012).
These two set of findings have given rise to an alternative conception that sees memory as essentially constructive, in which remembering is actively generating mental content that more or less represent the past. The constructive conception of memory is in a better position to explain why memories can contain distortions and confabulations (but see Robins 2016 for complications), and why remembering makes use of the same neural networks as imagining.
In turn, this constructive turn in the psychology and philosophy of memory has revived philosophers’ interest in continuism concerning imagination and memory. Kourken Michaelian (2016) explicitly rejects the causal connection criterion and defends a theory on which remembering, like imagining, centrally involves simulation. Karen Shanton and Alvin Goldman (2010) characterizes remembering as mindreading one’s past self. Felipe De Brigard (2014) characterizes remembering as a special instance of hypothetical thinking. Robert Hopkins (2018) characterizes remembering as a kind of imagining that is controlled by the past. However, the philosophical interpretation of empirical research remain contested; in dissent, Dorothea Debus (2014, 2016) considers the same sets of findings but ultimately concludes that remembering and imagining remain distinct mental kinds.
2.5 Imagination and Supposition
To suppose is to form a hypothetical mental representation. There exists a highly contentious debate on whether supposition is continuous with imagination, which is also a hypothetical attitude, or whether there are enough differences to make them discontinuous. There are two main options for distinguishing imagination and supposition, by phenomenology and by function.
The phenomenological distinction standardly turns on the notion of vivacity: whereas imaginings are vivid, suppositions are not. Indeed, one often finds in this literature the contrast between “merely supposing” and “vividly imagining”. Although vivacity has been frequently invoked in discussions of imagination, Amy Kind (2017) draws on empirical and theoretical considerations to argue that it is ultimately philosophically untenable. If that is correct, then the attempt to demarcate imagination and supposition by their vivacity is untenable too. More rarely, other phenomenological differences are invoked; for example, Brian Weatherson (2004) contends that “supposing can be coarse in a way that imagining cannot”.
Table 1. Architectural similarities and differences between imagination and supposition (Weinberg & Meskin 2006).
There have been diverse functional distinctions attributed to the discontinuity between imagination and supposition, but none has gained universal acceptance. Richard Moran (1994) contends that imagination tends to give rise to a wide range of further mental states, including affective responses, whereas supposition does not (see also Arcangeli 2014, 2017). Tamar Szabó Gendler (2000a) contends that while attempting to imagine something like that female infanticide is morally right seems to generate imaginative resistance, supposing it does not (see the discussion on imaginative resistance in Supplement on Puzzles and Paradoxes of Imagination and the Arts). Gregory Currie and Ian Ravenscroft (2002) contend that supposition involves only cognitive imagination, but imagination involves both cognitive and conative imagination. Alvin Goldman contends that suppositional imagination involves supposing that particular content obtains (for example, supposing that I am elated) but enactment imagination involves “enacting, or trying to enact, elation itself.” (2006: 47–48, italics omitted). Tyler Doggett and Andy Egan (2007) contend that imagination tends to motivate pretense actions, but supposition tends not to. On Jonathan Weinberg and Aaron Meskin (2006)’s synthesis, while there are a few functional similarities, there are many more functional differences between imagination and supposition (Table 1).
There remain ongoing debates about specific alleged functional distinctions, and about whether the functional distinctions are numerous or fundamental enough to warrant discontinuism or not. Indeed, it remains contentious which philosophers count as continuists and which philosophers count as discontinuists (for a few sample taxonomies, see Arcangeli 2017; Balcerak Jackson 2016; Kind 2013).
3. Roles of Imagination
Much of the contemporary discussion of imagination has centered around particular roles that imagination is purported to play in various domains of human understanding and activity. Amongst the most widely-discussed are the role of imagination in understanding other minds (section 3.1), in performing and recognizing pretense (section 3.2), in characterizing psychopathology (section 3.3), in engaging with the arts (section 3.4), in thinking creatively (section 3.5), in acquiring knowledge about possibilities (section 3.6), and in interpreting figurative language (section 3.7).
Mindreading is the activity of attributing mental states to oneself and to others, and of predicting and explaining behavior on the basis of those attributions. Discussions of mindreading in the 1990s were often framed as debates between “theory theory”—which holds that the attribution of mental states to others is guided by the application of some (tacit) folk psychological theory—and “simulation theory”—which holds that the attribution of mental states is guided by a process of replicating or emulating the target’s (apparent) mental states, perhaps through mechanisms involving the imagination. (Influential collections of papers on this debate include Carruthers & Smith (eds.) 1996; Davies & Stone (eds.) 1995a, 1995b.) In recent years, proponents of both sides have increasingly converged on common ground, allowing that both theory and simulation play some role in the attribution of mental states to others (see Carruthers 2003; Goldman 2006; Nichols & Stich 2003). Many such hybrid accounts include a role for imagination.
On theory theory views, mindreading involves the application of some (tacit) folk psychological theory that allows the subject to make predictions and offer explanations of the target’s beliefs and behaviors. On pure versions of such accounts, imagination plays no special role in the attribution of mental states to others. (For an overview of theory theory, see entry on folk psychology as a theory).
On simulation theory views, mindreading involves simulating the target’s mental states so as to exploit similarities between the subject’s and target’s processing capacities. It is this simulation that allows the subject to make predictions and offer explanations of the target’s beliefs and behaviors. (For early papers, see Goldman 1989; Gordon 1986; Heal 1986; for recent dissent, see, for example, Carruthers 2009; Gallagher 2007; Saxe 2005, 2009; for an overview of simulation theory, see entry on folk psychology as mental simulation).
Traditional versions of simulation theory typically describe simulation using expressions such as “imaginatively putting oneself in the other’s place”. How this metaphor is understood depends on the specific account. (A collection of papers exploring various versions of simulation theory can be found in Dokic & Proust (eds.) 2002.) On many accounts, the projection is assumed to involve the subject’s imaginatively running mental processes “off-line” that are directly analogous to those being run “on-line” by the target (for example Goldman 1989). Whereas the “on-line” mental processes are genuine, the “off-line” mental processes are merely imagined. For example, a target that is deciding whether to eat sushi for lunch is running their decision-making processes “on-line”; and a subject that is simulating the target’s decision-making is running the analogous processes “off-line”—in part, by imagining the relevant mental states of the target. Recent empirical work in psychology has explored the accuracy of such projections (Markman, Klein, & Suhr (eds.) 2009, section V; Saxe 2005, 2006, 2009.)
Though classic simulationist accounts have tended to assume that the simulation process is at least in-principle accessible to consciousness, a number of recent simulation-style accounts appeal to neuroscientific evidence suggesting that at least some simulative processes take place completely unconsciously. On such accounts of mindreading, no special role is played by conscious imagination (see Goldman 2009; Saxe 2009.)
Many contemporary views of mindreading are hybrid theory views according to which both theorizing and simulation play a role in the understanding of others’ mental states. Alvin Goldman (2006), for example, argues that while mindreading is primarily the product of simulation, theorizing plays a role in certain cases as well. Many recent discussions have endorsed hybrid views of this sort, with more or less weight given to each of the components in particular cases (see Carruthers 2003; Nichols & Stich 2003.)
A number of philosophers have suggested that the mechanisms underlying subjects’ capacity to engage in mindreading are those that enable engagement in pretense behavior (Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; Goldman 2006; Nichols & Stich 2003; for an overview of recent discussions, see Carruthers 2009.) According to such accounts, engaging in pretense involves imaginatively taking up perspectives other than one’s own, and the ability to do so skillfully may rely on—and contribute to—one’s ability to understand those alternate perspectives (see entry on empathy). Partly in light of these considerations, the relative lack of spontaneous pretense in children with autistic spectrum disorders is taken as evidence for a link between the skills of pretense and empathy.
Pretending is an activity that occurs during diverse circumstances, such as when children make-believe, when criminals deceive, and when thespians act (Langland-Hassan 2014). Although “imagination” and “pretense” have been used interchangeably (Ryle 1949), in this section we will use “imagination” to refer to one’s state of mind, and “pretense” to refer to the one’s actions in the world.
Different theories of pretense disagree fundamentally about what it is to pretend (see Liao & Gendler 2011 for an overview). Consequently, they also disagree about the mental states that enable one to pretend. Metarepresentational theories hold that engaging in pretend play requires the innate mental-state concept pretend (Baron-Cohen, Leslie, & Frith 1985; Friedman 2013; Friedman & Leslie 2007; Leslie 1987, 1994). To pretend is to represent one’s own representations under the concept pretend. Behaviorist theories hold that engaging in pretend play requires a process of behaving-as-if (Harris 1994, 2000; Harris & Kavanaugh 1993; Jarrold et al. 1994; Lillard & Flavell 1992; Nichols & Stich 2003; Perner 1991; Rakoczy, Tomasello, & Striano 2004; Stich & Tarzia 2015). Different behaviorist theories explicate behaving-as-if in different ways, but all aim to provide an account of pretense without recourse to the innate mental-state concept pretend.
Philosophical and psychological theories have sought to explain both the performance of pretense and the recognition of pretense, especially concerning evidence from developmental psychology (see Lillard 2001 for an early overview). On the performance side, children on a standard developmental trajectory exhibit early indicators of pretend play around 15 months; engage in explicit prop-oriented play by 24 months; and engage in sophisticated joint pretend play with props by 36 months (Harris 2000; Perner, Baker, & Hutton 1994; Piaget 1945 ). On the recognition side, children on a standard developmental trajectory distinguish pretense and reality via instinctual behavioral cues around 15–18 months; and start to do so via conventional behavioral cues from 36 months on (Friedman et al. 2010; Lillard & Witherington 2004; Onishi & Baillargeon 2005; Onishi, Baillargeon, & Leslie 2007; Richert and Lillard 2004).
Not surprisingly, the debate between theories of pretense often rest on interpretations of such empirical evidence. For example, Ori Friedman and Alan Leslie (2007) argue that behavioral theories cannot account for the fact that children as young as 15 months old can recognize pretend play and its normativity (Baillargeon, Scott, & He 2010). Specifically, they argue that behavioral theories do not offer straightforward explanations of this early development of pretense recognition, and incorrectly predicts that children systematically mistake other acts of behaving-as-if—such as those that stem from false beliefs—for pretense activities. In response, Stephen Stich and Joshua Tarzia (2015) has acknowledged these problems for earlier behaviorist theories, and developed a new behaviorist theory that purportedly explains the totality of empirical evidence better than metarepresentational rivals. Importantly, Stich and Tarzia argue that their account can better explain Angeline Lillard (1993)’s empirical finding that young children need not attribute a mental concept such as pretend to someone else in order to understand them as pretending.
The debate concerning theories of pretense has implications for the role of imagination in pretense. Behaviorist theories tend to take imagination as essential to explaining pretense performance; metarepresentational theories do not. (However, arguably the innate mental-state concept pretend posited by metarepresentational theories serve similar functions. See Nichols and Stich 2000’s discussion of the decoupler mechanism, which explicitly draws from Leslie 1987. Currie and Ravenscroft 2002 gives a broadly behaviorist theory of pretense that does not require imagination.) Specifically, on most behaviorist theories, imagination is essential for guiding elaborations of pretense episodes, especially via behaviors (Picciuto & Carruthers 2016; Stich & Tarzia 2015).
Most recently, Peter Langland-Hassan (2012, 2014) has developed a theory that aims to explain pretense behavior and pretense recognition without appeal to either metarepresentation or imagination. Langland-Hassan argues that pretense behaviors can be adequately explained by beliefs, desires, and intentions—including beliefs in counterfactuals; and that the difference between pretense and sincerity more generally can be adequately characterized in terms of a person’s beliefs, intentions, and desires. While Langland-Hassan does not deny that pretense is in some sense an imaginative activity, he argues that we do not need to posit a sui generis component of the mind to account for it.
Autism and delusions have been—with much controversy—characterized as disorders of imagination. That is, the atypical patterns of cognition and behavior associated with each psychopathology have been argued to result from atypical functions of imagination.
Autism can be characterized in terms of a trio of atypicalities often referred to as “Wing’s triad”: problems in typical social competence, communication, and imagination (Happé 1994; Wing & Gould 1979). The imaginative aspect of autism interacts with other prominent roles of imagination, namely mindreading, pretense, and engagement with the arts (Carruthers 2009). Children with autism do not engage in spontaneous pretend play in the ways that typically-developing children do, engaging instead in repetitive and sometimes obsessional activities; and adults with autism often show little interest in fiction (Carpenter, Tomasello, & Striano 2005; Happé 1994; Rogers, Cook, & Meryl 2005; Wing & Gould 1979). The degree to which an imaginative deficit is implicated in autism remains a matter of considerable debate. Most radically, Gregory Currie and Ian Ravenscroft (2002) have argued that, with respect to Wing’s triad, problems in typical social competence and communication are rooted in an inability to engage in imaginative activities.
Delusions can be characterized as belief-like mental representations that manifest an unusual degree of disconnectedness from reality (Bortolotti & Miyazono 2015). Particularly striking examples would include Capgras and Cotard delusions. In the former, the sufferer takes her friends and family to have been replaced by imposters; in the latter, the sufferer takes himself to be dead. More mundane examples might include ordinary cases of self-deception.
One approach to delusions characterize them as beliefs that are dysfunctional in their content or formation. (For a representative collection of papers that present and criticize this perspective, see Coltheart and Davies (eds.) 2000). However, another approach to delusions characterize them as dysfunctions of imaginings. Currie and Ravenscroft (2002: 170–175) argue that delusions are imaginings that are misidentified by the subject as the result of an inability to keep track of the sources of one’s thoughts. That is, a delusion is an imagined representation that is misidentified by the subject as a belief. Tamar Szabó Gendler (2007) argues that in cases of delusions and self-deceptions, imaginings come to play a role in one’s cognitive architecture similar to that typically played by beliefs. Andy Egan (2008a) likewise argues that the mental states involved in delusions are both belief-like (in their connection to behaviors and inferences) and imagination-like (in their circumscription); however, he argues that these functional similarities suggest the need to posit an in-between attitude called “bimagination”.
3.4 Engagement with the Arts
There is an entrenched historical connection between imagination and the arts. David Hume and Immanuel Kant both invoke imagination centrally in their exploration of aesthetic phenomena (albeit in radically different ways; see entries on Hume’s aesthetics and Kant’s aesthetics). R.G. Collingwood (1938) defines art as the imaginative expression of feeling (Wiltsher 2018; see entry on Collingwood’s aesthetics). Roger Scruton (1974) develops a Wittgensteinian account of imagination and accords it a central role in aesthetic experience and aesthetic judgment.
In contemporary philosophy, the most prominent theory of imagination’s role in engagement with the arts is presented in Kendall Walton’s Mimesis as Make-Believe (1990). (Although Walton uses “fictions” as a technical term to refer to artworks, his conception of the arts is broad enough to include both high-brow and low-brow; popular and obscure; a variety of specific arts such as poetry and videogames; and—as Stacie Friend (2008) clarifies—both fictive and non-fictive works.) Walton’s core insight is that engagement with the arts is fundamentally similar to children’s games of make-believe. When one engages with an artwork, one uses it as a prop in a make-believe game. As props, artworks generate prescriptions for imaginings. These prescriptions also determine the representational contents of artworks (that is, “fictionality”, or what is true in a fictional world). When one correctly engages with an artwork, then, one imagines the representational contents as prescribed.
Out of all the arts, it is the engagement with narratives that philosophers have explored most closely in conjunction with imagination (see Stock 2013 for an overview). Gregory Currie (1990) offers an influential account of imagination and fiction, and Peter Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen (1996) discuss literature specifically. Indeed, this research program—despite many criticisms of Walton’s specific theory—remains lively today (see, for example, papers in Nichols (ed.) 2006b). For example, Kathleen Stock (2017) argues that a specific kind of propositional imagination is essential for engagement with fictions. In dissent, Derek Matravers (2014) argues that, contra Walton, imagination is not essential for engagement with fictions.
Philosophers have also done much to articulate the connection between imagination and engagement with music (see entry on philosophy of music; see also Trivedi 2011). Some philosophers focus on commonalities between engagement with narratives and engagement with music. For example, even though Walton (1990, 1994a, 1999) acknowledges that fictional worlds of music are much more indeterminate than fictional worlds of narratives, he maintains that the same kind of imagining used in experiencing narratives is also used in experiencing various elements of music, such as imagining continuity between movements and imagining feeling musical tension. Similarly, Andrew Kania (2015) argues that experiencing musical space and movement is imaginative like our experience of fictional narratives. Other philosophers draw parallels between engagement with music and other imaginative activities, namely as understanding other minds (section 3.1) and interpreting metaphor (section 3.7). As an example of the former, Jerrold Levinson (1996) argues that the best explanation of musical expressiveness requires listeners to experience music imaginatively—specifically, imagining a persona expressing emotions through the music. As an example of the latter, Scruton (1997) argues that musical experience is informed by spatial concepts applied metaphorically, and so imaginative perception is necessary for musical understanding (but see Budd 2003 for a criticism; see also De Clercq 2007 and Kania 2015). Stephen Davies (2005, 2011) and Peter Kivy (2002) notably criticize the imaginative accounts of engagement with music on empirical and theoretical grounds.
Philosophers have sought to clarify the role of imagination in engagement with the arts by focusing on a number of puzzles and paradoxes in the vicinity. The puzzle of imaginative resistance explores apparent limitations on what can be imagined during engagements with the arts and, relatedly, what can be made fictional in artworks. The paradox of emotional response to fictions (widely known as “paradox of fiction”) examines psychological and normative similarities between affective responses prompted by imaginings versus affective responses by reality-directed attitudes. The paradox of tragedy and the paradox of horror examine psychological and normative differences between affective responses prompted by imaginings versus affective responses by reality-directed attitudes. Finally, the puzzle of moral persuasion is concerned with real-world outputs of imaginative engagements with artworks; specifically, whether and how artworks can morally educate or corrupt. For more detail on each of these artistic phenomena, see the Supplement on Puzzles and Paradoxes of Imagination and the Arts.
The idea that imagination plays a central role in creative processes can be traced back to Immanuel Kant (Critique of Pure Reason), who takes artistic geniuses as paradigmatic examples of creativity. On Kant’s account, when imagination aims at the aesthetic, it is allowed to engage in free play beyond the understanding available to oneself. The unconstrained imagination can thereby take raw materials and produce outputs that transcend concepts that one possesses.
While the precise characterization of creativity remains controversial (see Gaut & Kieran (eds.) 2018; Paul & Kaufman (eds.) 2014), contemporary philosophers typically conceive of it more broadly than Kant did. In addition to creative processes in the aesthetic realm, they also consider creative processes in, for example, “science, craft, business, technology, organizational life and everyday activities” (Gaut 2010: 1034; see also Stokes 2011). As an example, Michael Polanyi (1966) gives imagination a central role in the creative endeavor of scientific discovery, by refining and narrowing the solution space to open-ended scientific problems (see Stokes 2016: 252–256). And, in addition to creative processes of geniuses, contemporary philosophers also consider creative processes of ordinary people.
With this broadened scope, contemporary philosophers have followed Kant’s lead in exploring the role of imagination in creativity (see Stokes 2016 for an overview). Berys Gaut (2003) and Dustin Stokes (2014) argue that two characteristic features of imagination—its lack of aim at truth and its dissociation from action—make it especially suitable for creative processes. Peter Carruthers (2002) argues that the same cognitive resources, including imagination, underlie children’s pretend play and adults’ creative thinking. Specifically, Carruthers hypothesizes that children’s play evolutionarily developed as precursors to and practices for adults’ creative thinking.
There are two points of disagreement regarding the role of imagination in creative processes. First, philosophers disagree about the nature and the strength of the connection between imagination and creativity. Kant takes imagination to be constitutive of creativity: what makes a creative process creative is the involvement of imagination aiming at the aesthetic (see also A. Hills & Bird forthcoming). Gaut and Stokes, by contrast, thinks there is only an imperfect causal connection between imagination and creativity: while imagination is useful for creative processes, there are creative processes that do not involve imagination and there are imaginings that are uncreative (see also Beaney 2005). Second, philosophers disagree about the type of imagination involved in creative processes. By hypothesizing a common evolutionary cause, Carruthers suggests that the same imaginative capacity is involved in pretense and in creativity. By contrast, perhaps echoing Kant’s distinction of productive versus reproductive imagination, Currie and Ravenscroft (2002) sharply distinguish recreative imagination, which is involved in pretense and mindreading, from creative imagination.
Imagination plays a role in the acquisition of knowledge. Many philosophical arguments call on imagination when they appeal to metaphysical modal knowledge (see entry on epistemology of modality; the papers collected in Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.) 2002; and Kung 2016 and Strohminger & Yli-Vakkuri 2017 for overviews). The kind of thought experiments that are regularly used in scientific theorizing is also plausibly premised on imaginative capacities (see entry on thought experiments). As already discussed, people use imagination to understand the perspectives of others (section 3.1). Moreover, people often make decisions via thinking about counterfactuals, or what would happen if things had been different from how they in fact are (see entries on causation and counterfactual conditionals). However, the phenomenon of transformative experience has recently called into question which kind of imaginary scenarios are truly epistemically accessible. (For a representative collection of papers that explore different epistemic roles of imagination, see Kind and Kung (eds.) 2016.)
Broadly speaking, thought experiments use imaginary scenarios to elicit responses that (ideally) grant people knowledge of possibilities. A special, but prominent, type of thought experiment in philosophy concerns the link between imagination, conceivability, and metaphysical possibility. René Descartes famously offered a modal argument in the Sixth Meditation, reasoning from the fact that he could clearly and distinctly conceive of his mind and body as distinct to the real distinctness between them. The current prevalence of similar modal arguments can be verified by the entries on zombies and dualism. These modal arguments all rely, in some way, on the idea that what one can imagine functions as a fallible and defeasible guide to what is really possible in the broadest sense.
Pessimists, notably Peter Van Inwagen (1998: 70), doubt that imagination can give us an accurate understanding of scenarios that are “remote from the practical business of everyday life”, such as those called upon in philosophical modal arguments. Optimists typically take it as a given that there is some connection between imagination and metaphysical modal knowledge, but focus on understanding where the connection is imperfect, such as when one (apparently) imagines the impossible. To just give a few examples, Saul Kripke (1972 ), Stephen Yablo (1993), David Chalmers (2002), Dominic Gregory (2004), Peter Kung (2010), and Timothy Williamson (2007, 2016) have each developed a distinctive approach to this task. For example, Kripke adopts a redescription approach to modeling (some) modal errors: in some cases where one is apparently imagining the impossible, one is in fact imagining a possible scenario but misconstruing it as an impossible one. On this diagnosis, in such cases, the error resides not with imaginative capacities, but with the capacity to describe one’s own imaginings.
Other thought experiments are scoped more narrowly; for example, scientific thought experiments are intended to allow people to explore nomic possibilities. Galileo (On Motion) famously offered a thought experiment that disproved Aristotle’s theory of motion, which predicts that heavier objects fall more quickly. In this thought experiment, Galileo asked people to imagine the falling of a composite of a light and heavy object versus the falling of the heavy object alone. When one runs the thought experiment—that is, when one elaborates on the starting point of this imaginary scenario—one notices an incoherence in Aristotle’s theory: on the one hand, it should predict that the composite would fall more slowly because the light object would slow down the heavy object; on the other hand, it should also predict that the composite would fall more quickly because the composite is heavier than the heavy object alone. While it is incontrovertible that imagination is central to thought experiments, debates remain on whether imagination can be invoked in the context of justification (Gendler 2000b; Williamson 2016) or only in the context of discovery (Norton 1991, 1996; Spaulding 2016).
The role of imagination in counterfactual reasoning—and, in particular, the question of what tends to be held constant when one contemplates counterfactual scenarios—has been explored in detail in recent philosophical and psychological works (Byrne 2005; Williamson 2005, 2007, 2016). Williamson suggests that
When we work out what would have happened if such-and-such had been the case, we frequently cannot do it without imagining such-and-such to be the case and letting things run. (2005: 19)
It is imagination that lets one move from counterfactuals’ antecedents to their consequents. Williamson (2016) argues that our imaginings have evolved to be suitably constrained, such that such counterfactual reasoning can confer knowledge. Indeed, he argues that if one were to be skeptical about gaining knowledge from such a hypothetical reasoning process, then one would be forced to be (implausibly) skeptical about much of ordinary reasoning about actuality. Developing an idea anticipated by Williamson (2007), Margot Strohminger and Juhani Yli-Vakkuri (forthcoming) argue that the same imaginative mechanisms that capable of producing metaphysical modal knowledge are also capable of producing knowledge of other restricted modalities, such as nomic and practical modality.
Thinking about counterfactuals is just one way that imagination can factor into mundane decision-making. Neil Van Leeuwen (2011, 2016a, 2016b) and Bence Nanay (2016a) have recently started to elaborate on the connection between imagination and actions via decision-making. Although neither authors focus on the epistemic status of imagination, their accounts of decision-making seem to suggest that imagination is used to gain practical knowledge about the probability and value of actions’ possible outcomes.
At the same time, the recently prominent discussion of transformative experiences calls into question the extent to which imagination can be epistemically useful for making life-altering decisions. L.A. Paul (2014, 2015, 2018; see also Jackson 1982, 1986; D. Lewis 1988) argues that some types of knowledge—especially de se knowledge concerning one’s values—are inaccessible by imaginings; only actual experiences can confer these types of knowledge. For example, one cannot really know whether one wants to become a parent without experiencing being a parent because parenthood itself can transform one’s values. If one cannot reasonably imagine oneself with radically different values, then plausibly one cannot appropriately imagine the values associated with the outcomes of one’s actions. As such, despite their epistemic worth in ordinary contexts, imaginings might not help in making life-altering decisions.
3.7 Figurative Language
Finally, imagination might play a role in interpreting figurative language. The exact role ascribed to imagination varies greatly from theory to theory. In part, this variation arose from a longstanding debate in philosophy of language concerning the divide between literal and figurative language: while some imaginative theories of figurative language (such as Walton 1990) accept a strong divide, others (such as Lepore & Stone 2015) reject it. Although this controversy cannot be avoided entirely, it is worth reiterating that the present aim is only to highlight the possible role(s) that imagination might play in the psychology of irony, metaphor, and nearby linguistic phenomena.
Despite immense differences between them, numerous theories of irony have converged on the idea that interpreting irony involves imagination. Kendall Walton (1990) treats ironic and metaphoric speech as props in momentary games of make-believe. On Walton’s theory, imagination is central to understanding and interpreting such figurative speech. Herbert Clark and Richard Gerrig (1984) and Gregory Currie (2006) connect irony to pretense, but without further linking all cases of pretense to imaginative capacities. Elisabeth Camp (2012) similarly endorses a role for pretense in the interpretation of irony and the related case of sarcasm. Finally, this idea that interpreting irony involves imagination is corroborated by psychological research: irony recognition is difficult for neurodivergent individuals who lack imaginative capacities (Happé 1991)—specifically, in individuals with Asperger’s syndrome, who have deficits with meta-representation—and in individuals with schizophrenia, who have deficits with theory-of-mind (Langdon et al. 2002).
Again, despite immense differences between them, numerous theories of metaphor have also converged on the idea that interpreting metaphor involves imagination (see entry on metaphor). The first family of theories focus on imagination’s role in pretense. As mentioned earlier, Walton (1990) takes metaphors to be props in momentary games of make-believe. Walton (1993, 2000) and David Hills (1997) further develop this idea. (Importantly, Walton (1993) notes that interpretation of a metaphor may not involve actual imaginings, but only the recognition of the type of imaginings prescribed.) Andy Egan (2008b) extends the idea to account for idioms. These theories remain controversial: in particular, Camp (2009) and Catherine Wearing (2011) have offered forceful criticisms. The second family of theories focus on imagination’s role in providing novel perspectives. While Camp (2009) criticizes the first family of theories, she also acknowledges a role for imagination. On her account, pretense and metaphor typically involve distinct types of imaginings: pretense-imaginings allow one to access counterfactual content, but metaphor-imaginings allow one to re-interpret actual content from a novel perspective. Indeed Camp (2007) argues that the kind of imagination involved in interpreting metaphors is also used to interpret similes and juxtapositions. The third family of theories focus on imagination’s role in providing mental images. Paul Ricouer (1978), Richard Moran (1989), and Robyn Carston (2010) all propose theories on which mental imagery plays an important role in processing metaphors. Outside of philosophy of language, James Grant (2011) argues that metaphors are prevalent in art criticism because they prompt readers’ imaginings.
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No one can have an encyclopedic knowledge on a topic as vast as imagination. The previous iteration of the entry could not have existed without the help of Paul Bloom, David Chalmers, Gregory Currie, Tyler Doggett, Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa, Shaun Nichols, Zoltán Gendler Szabó, Jonathan Weinberg, Ed Zalta, an anonymous referee, and—most of all—Aaron Norby. This iteration of the entry could not exist without the help of Tyler Doggett, Elisabeth Camp, Felipe De Brigard, Anna Ichino, Andrew Kania, Amy Kind, Peter Langland-Hassan, Aaron Meskin, Kengo Miyazono, Eric Peterson, Mark Phelan, Dustin Stokes, Margot Strohminger, Mike Stuart, Neil Van Leeuwen, Jonathan Weinberg, Nick Wiltsher, and two anonymous referees.