First published Mon Mar 14, 2011

To imagine something is to form a particular sort of mental representation of that thing. Imagining is typically distinguished from mental states such as perceiving, remembering and believing in that imagining S does not require (that the subject consider) S to be or have been the case, whereas the contrasting states do. It is distinguished from mental states such as desiring or anticipating in that imagining S does not require that the subject wish or expect S to be the case, whereas the contrasting states do. It is also sometimes distinguished from mental states such as conceiving and supposing, on the grounds that imagining S requires some sort of quasi-sensory or positive representation of S, whereas the contrasting states do not.

Contemporary philosophical discussions of the imagination have been primarily focused on three sets of topics. Work in philosophy of mind and philosophy of psychology has explored a cluster of issues concerning the phenomenology and cognitive architecture of imagination, examining the ways that imagination differs from and resembles other mental states both phenomenologically and functionally, and investigating the roles that imagination may play in the understanding of self and others, and in the representation of past, future and counterfactual scenarios. Work in aesthetics has focused on issues related to imaginative engagement with fictional characters and events, identifying and offering resolutions to a number of (apparent) paradoxes. And work in modal epistemology has focused on the extent to which imaginability—and its cousin conceivability—can serve as guides to possibility.

Because of the breadth of the topic, this entry focuses exclusively on contemporary discussions of imagination in the Anglo-American philosophical tradition. (For an overview of historical discussions of imagination, see the sections on pre-twentieth century and early twentieth century accounts of mental imagery in the corresponding Stanford Encyclopedia entry; for a more detailed and comprehensive historical survey, see Brann 1991. For a sophisticated and wide-ranging discussion of imagination in the phenomenological tradition, see Casey 2000.)

1. Overview: Varieties of Imagination

There is a general consensus among those who work on the topic that the term imagination is used too broadly to permit simple taxonomy. Indeed, it is common for overview essays (including this one) to begin with an invocation of P. F. Strawson's remarks in “Imagination and Perception” (1970), where he writes:

The uses, and applications, of the terms ‘image’, ‘imagine’, ‘imagination’, and so forth make up a very diverse and scattered family. Even this image of a family seems too definite. It would be a matter of more than difficulty to identify and list the family's members, let alone their relations of parenthood and cousinhood (Strawson 1970, 31; cf. McGinn 2009, 595).

These taxonomic challenges carry over into attempts at characterization. In the opening chapter of Mimesis as Make-Believe—perhaps the most influential contemporary book-length treatment of imagination—Kendall Walton (1990) throws up his hands at the prospect of delineating the notion precisely. After enumerating and distinguishing a number of paradigmatic instances of imagining, he asks:

What is it to imagine? We have examined a number of dimensions along which imaginings can vary; shouldn't we now spell out what they have in common?—Yes, if we can. But I can't. (Walton 1990, 19)

The only recent attempt at a somewhat comprehensive inventory of the term's uses is due to Leslie Stevenson (2003), who enumerates (without claiming exhaustiveness) twelve of “the most influential conceptions of imagination” that can be found in recent discussions in “philosophy of mind, aesthetics, ethics, poetry and … religion. ” These range from “the ability to think of something not presently perceived, but spatio-temporally real” to “the ability to create works of art that express something deep about the meaning of life” (Stevenson 2003, 238).

In light of this unwieldiness, recent attempts at taxonomy have tended to eschew comprehensiveness, focusing instead on identifying and classifying selected aspects of the phenomenon. Kendall Walton (1990), for instance, distinguishes between spontaneous and deliberate imagining (acts of imagination that occur with or without the subject's conscious direction), between occurrent and nonoccurrent imaginings (acts of imagination that do or do not occupy the subject's explicit attention), and between social and solitary imaginings (episodes of imagining that occur with or without the joint participation of several subjects.)

Other taxonomies concentrate on carving out a particular aspect of the topic for further discussion. Gregory Currie and Ian Ravenscroft (2002) begin their book-length work on imagination by distinguishing among creative imagination (combining ideas in unexpected and unconventional ways); sensory imagination (perception-like experiences in the absence of appropriate stimuli); and what they call recreative imagination (an ability to experience or think about the world from a perspective different from the one that experience presents), focusing the remainder of their discussion largely on the third (recreative) sense, and setting aside the first (creative) sense almost entirely. (Cf. also Strawson 1970, 31.) [Recent work on the creative imagination has taken place largely within the context of empirical psychology (see Boden 2003; Csikszentmihalyi 1997; Sternberg 1998), though there has been some philosophical attention to the issue in recent years (see Carruthers 2007; Gaut & Livingston 2003).]

Yet other taxonomies classify varieties of imagination in terms of their structure and content. Many philosophers distinguish between propositional imagination (imagining that P) and non-propositional imagination, dividing the latter into objectual imagining (imagining E) (Yablo 1993) and active imagining (imagining X-ing) (Walton 1990). (For a related distinction, see the discussion of Thomas Nagel's (1974) distinction between sympathetic imagining (imagining oneself undergoing a certain experience) and perceptual imagining (imagining oneself perceiving a certain event or state of affairs) in section 4.5 below.) These notions are often spelled out by means of examples.

When a subject imagines propositionally, she represents to herself that something is the case. So, for example, Juliet might imagine that Romeo is by her side. To imagine in this sense is to stand in some mental relation to a particular proposition. (See propositional attitude reports.)

When a subject imagines objectually, she represents to herself a real or make-believe entity or situation. So, for example, Prospero might imagine an acorn or a nymph or the city of Naples or a wedding feast. To imagine in this sense is to stand in some mental relation to a representation of an (imaginary or real) entity or state of affairs. (Yablo 1993; see also Martin 2002; Noordhof 2002; O'Shaughnessy 2000.)

When a subject imagines X-ing, she simulatively represents to herself some sort of activity or experience. So, for example, Ophelia might imagine seeing Hamlet or getting herself to a nunnery. To imagine in this sense is to stand in a first-personal mental relation to some (imaginary or real) behavior or perception.

A final way of thinking about imagination treats imagined as a “decoupling” or “facsimile” or “counterpart” operator (cf. Leslie 1987; Goldman 2000; Budd 1989) that can, in principle, be attached to any (mental) state. So, for example, one might speak of imagined perception (or perception-like imagining), imagined belief (or belief-like imagining), imagined desire (or desire-like imagining), imagined action (or action-like imagining), and so on. On this sort of account, a taxonomy of imaginative attitudes would share whatever shape governs experience more generally.

No particular taxonomy has gained general currency in recent discussions.

2. Imagination and Other Mental States

2.1 Imagination and Mental Imagery

To have a (merely) mental image is to have a perception-like experience triggered by something other than the appropriate external stimulus; so, for example, one might have “a picture in the mind's eye or … a tune running through one's head” (Strawson 1970, 31) in the absence of any corresponding visual or auditory object or event.

Although it is possible to form mental images in any of the sensory modalities, the bulk of discussion both in psychological and philosophical contexts has focused on visual imagery. The most prominent debate in this area concerns the representational format of visual mental images, and, in particular, the question of whether visual mental images are “picture-like” in the sense they can be “mentally scanned” in much the way that we can visually scan objects that we see. The “picture theory” holds, roughly, that the mental representations we experience in cases of visual imagining represent spatial relationships via representational properties that are themselves inherently spatial (Kosslyn 1980, 1994; Kosslyn et al. 2006; Shepard and Metzler 1971; Shepard and Cooper 1982). The alternative, “propositional” or “descriptive” theory, holds that visual mental images are non-pictorial, language-like representations of visual scenes (Pylyshyn 1973, 2002, 2003). (For a detailed presentation and discussion of these issues, see the discussion of the analog-propositional debate in the entry on mental imagery; cf. also Block ed. 1981; Tye 1991.)

A more general question—which has received less attention in philosophical discussions of the imagination—concerns the relation between mental imagery (or sensory imagination) and imagination more generally. While most theorists of the imagination distinguish between sensory imagination (forming a mental image) and cognitive imagination (conceptually entertaining a possibility) (cf. McGinn 2009, following McGinn 2004), or between perception-like (sensory) and belief-like (propositional) imaginings (Currie and Ravenscroft 2002), questions such as whether sensory and propositional imagining are related as perception is to belief have not been explored in detail. (For some speculative thoughts about the ways in which sensory and cognitive imagination may be related, see McGinn 2004, chapters 12 and 13; cf. also Kind 2001; for discussion of potential relations between perceptual imagination and objectual imagination, see Chalmers 2002, 150–151; Yablo 1993.)

A detailed discussion of the topic of mental imagery and its attendant debates can be found in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry on mental imagery.

2.2 Imagination and Belief

As was noted in section 1, imagination, like belief, has a propositional use. When we say something like: “Macbeth believes that there is a dagger before him,” we attribute to the subject (Macbeth) an attitude (belief) towards a proposition (that there is a dagger before him). In so doing, we are—roughly—suggesting that he regards the proposition in question as true. (See belief.)

Likewise, when we say something like: “Juliet imagines that Romeo is standing beside her,” we again attribute to our subject (Juliet) an attitude (imagination) towards a proposition (that Romeo is standing beside her). In so doing, we are—roughly—suggesting that she regards the proposition as, say, fictional or make-believe or pretend. (Cf. Currie 1990; Nichols and Stich 2000; Walton 1990.)

To a reasonable approximation, then, to believe that P is to regard P as literally true (for complications with this account, see Velleman 2000), whereas to imagine that P is to regard P as fictional or make-believe or pretend, regardless of whether P actually obtains. What does this characterization illuminate about the relation between the two attitudes?

It is widely accepted that—at least in their propositional usage—imagination and belief range over similar, though perhaps not identical, ranges of content. The caveats arise because if one holds a view of imagination according to which imagination must be quasi-sensory, then there are (abstract) propositions that can be believed but not imagined (though they can presumably be conceived.) And if one holds a certain view of epistemic modality, there are propositions—a posteriori necessary falsehoods—that can be imagined but not believed. Setting aside these exceptions, however, it appears that the in-principle domain over which both belief and (propositional) imagination range is the same: roughly, the domain of all understandable propositions.

But whereas what we believe is determined by (what we think) the actual world is like, what we imagine is (to a large extent), up to us. The reason for this is straightforward. Since to believe that P is to take P to hold of the actual world, and since which world is the actual world is (in the relevant sense) not up to us, belief's task is to conform to some pre-ordained structure—its direction of fit is mind-to-world. (For related discussion of direction of fit, see the entry on speech acts.) By contrast, since to imagine P is to take P to hold of some particular (set of) non-actual world(s), and since which worlds are imagined is (in the relevant sense) up to us, imagining's task need not be to conform to some pre-ordained structure. (A possible exception is guided imagination of the sort generated by stories and works of art; for discussion of these issues, see section 5.1 below.)

This distinction is sometimes expressed by saying that whereas believing some content involves taking the content to be true in the actual world, imagining that content involves taking that content to be true-in-fiction, or make-believe-true, or pretend-true. (Discussion of the relation between truth simpliciter and truth-in-fiction goes beyond the scope of this entry. For further discussion of some of these issues, see the Stanford Encyclopedia entries on truth and fictionalism and Zalta 1992.)

On the basis of these sorts of considerations, a number of theorists have proposed cognitive models on which belief and imagination (or pretense) involve distinct but structurally-similar psychological mechanisms that act on similar sorts of representational content. The most prominent of these is Nichols and Stich's (2000, 2003) cognitive theory of pretense, according to which belief and imagination are psychological attitudes that operate on propositional content ‘stored’ in different mental ‘boxes’—a “Belief Box” in the case of beliefs, and a “Possible World Box” in the case of imaginings—each governed by characteristic set of rules that regulate its relation to behavior and to other mental states.

For general discussions of the relation between imagination and belief, see Currie and Ravenscroft 2002; Nichols and Stich 2000; Walton 1990; and Velleman 2000 as well as essays collected in Lopes and Kieren eds. 2003 and Nichols ed. 2006.

2.3 Imagination and Desire

Like belief and imagination, desire has a propositional use. In this sense, we might say: “Hamlet desires that Claudius drink from the poisoned cup.” When we say this, we attribute to our subject (Hamlet) an attitude (desire) towards a proposition (that Claudius drink from the poisoned cup). In so doing, we are—roughly—suggesting that he regards the state of affairs represented by the proposition as one to be brought about.

Unlike belief, desire does not have a mind-to-world fit. Desire is an attitude that is conative rather than cognitive: it has a world-to-mind fit. To desire that P is, roughly, to wish that it were or will be the case that P hold of the actual world.

In light of this, the question arises whether—in addition to there being an imaginative analogue to belief—there is also an imaginative analogue to desire. To imaginatively desire (i-desire) that P, or to have a desire-like imagining, would be to wish—in an imaginative way—that it were or will be the case that P hold (in some fictional or make-believe or pretend world.)

The notion of desire-like imagination (Currie 1990, 2002; Velleman 2000) or i-desire (Doggett and Egan 2007) has been invoked to explain two phenomena: the generation of behaviors in imaginary contexts, and the apparent existence of desires evoked by fictions. According to such accounts, if I'm pretending to be Cleopatra, it is my desire-like imagining that I be with Antony, in conjunction with my belief-like imagining that you are Antony, that leads me to take actions such as embracing you. Relatedly, on such accounts, just as I may imagine that Romeo and Juliet both die (and thus imagine something about them in a belief-like way), I may also ‘want’ them to go on living (and thus imagine something about them in a desire-like way.)

Objections to such accounts contend that the notion of desire-like imagination (or i-desire) is unnecessary to explain the phenomena for which it is intended to account. On such views, rather than desiring-in-imagination that Romeo and Juliet live, what I desire(-in-actuality) is that in the fiction Romeo and Juliet live.

For further discussion of desire-in-imagination/i-desire, see (defenders) Currie 1990, ch.5; Currie 2002; Currie and Ravenscroft 2002; Doggett and Egan 2007; Velleman 2000; (dissenters) Carruthers 2003; Nichols and Stich 2000, 2003; Funkhouser and Spaulding 2009

2.4 Imagination and Supposition

A number of contemporary discussions of the imagination distinguish between mere supposition on the one hand, and engaged or vivid imagination on the other. Roughly, mere supposition is what is involved in simple cases of hypothetical reasoning, whereas vivid imagination is what is involved in aesthetic participation, engaged pretense, or absorbing games of make-believe.

A related distinction is made by Alvin Goldman (2006) between suppositional imagination (s-imagination) on the one hand, and enactment imagination (e-imagination) on the other. S-imagination involves supposing that particular content obtains (for example, supposing that I am elated); e-imagination involves “enacting, or trying to enact, elation itself.” (Goldman 2006, 47–48, italics omitted.) (Note that Goldman's notion of s-imagination is to be distinguished from Peacocke's notion of the same name (see section 5.6 below.))

The distinction between mere supposition and vivid imagination is often invoked in discussions of imaginative engagement. Richard Moran (1994), for example, distinguishes between them on the grounds that vivid imagination tends to give rise to a wide range of further mental states, including affective responses, whereas mere supposition does not. (See section 5.3 below.) In a related vein, Tamar Gendler (2000) points out that while attempting to vividly imagine something like that female infanticide is morally right seems to generate imaginative resistance, merely supposing it does not. (For a characterization and discussion of imaginative resistance, see section 5.2 below.) Gregory Currie and Ian Ravenscroft (2002) contend that this difference arises because supposition involves belief-like imagining in the absence of desire-like imagining, whereas engaged imagining involves both, Similarly, Tyler Doggett and Andy Egan (2007) point out that vividly imagining tends to motivate actions in the context of pretense, while merely supposing tends not to.

For additional discussion of the relation between supposition and vivid imagination, see Currie & Ravenscroft 2002, Doggett and Egan 2007, Gendler 2000, Moran 1994, Nichols 2006, Weinberg & Meskin 2006.

2.5 Imagination and Dreaming

Dreaming is often characterized by appeal to the idea of imagination. Kendall Walton (1990), for example, describes dreams as “spontaneous, undeliberate imaginings,” while psychologist David Foulkes characterizes dreaming as “the awareness of being in an imagined world in which things happen” (Foulkes 1999, 9).

As John Sutton (2009) notes, the topic of dreaming has been relatively neglected in recent discussions in the philosophy of mind (for an exception, see Flanagan 2000)—including the literature on imagination. But there has been a recent flurry of discussion about the question of whether dream contents are (experienced as) imagined or believed.

On what might be called the ‘orthodox view’ of dreaming, if I dream that I'm falling, while dreaming I have the belief that I'm falling. Perhaps the most famous adherent to the orthodox view is Descartes, who uses the purported fact that we often believe what we dream to motivate his skepticism.

More recently, Jonathan Ichikawa (2009) and Ernest Sosa (2005; 2007) have denied that dreaming involves believing. Rather, they argue, dreaming is a form of imagining. Ichikawa, expanding on work by Sosa, observes that the dream-analogues of beliefs do not behave like normal beliefs: dream ‘beliefs’ are not related to perceptual experience or to behavior in ways that waking beliefs are; and dream ‘beliefs’ are subject to radical shifts in ways that waking beliefs are not. Thus, they contend, our relation to the contents of our dreams is one of imagination, not belief. (See also Malcolm 1959; Dennett 1976.) Sosa claims (2005; 2007) and Ichikawa denies (2008) that this reconstrual fully blunts the force of the Cartesian dreaming argument.

In support of a version of the orthodox view, Colin McGinn (2004) has argued that, although dreams do involve mental imagery rather than perceptual experiences, they may also involve belief. He argues this partly on the grounds that dreams often involve a deep emotional engagement that is absent from both imagination and daydreaming, yet characteristic of belief (97–8). He proposes what he calls the fictional immersion theory of dreaming (103–4), according to which dreams are like fictions where we become so deeply engaged that we ‘lose ourselves’ and thereby form (admittedly atypical) beliefs. (For related discussion, see 5.3 below.)

For an overview of the range of philosophical issues raised by dreaming—including a number that relate directly to the issue of imagination—see Sutton 2009, as well as the book-length treatment in Flanagan 2000. For an overview of recent empirical discussions of dreaming see the anthologies edited by Barrett and McNamara eds. (2009), Ellman and Antrobus eds. (1991), and Pace-Schott et al eds. (2003), or the book-length treatments by Domhoff (2003) and Hobson (1988, 2002). For a review of recent empirical work on the nature of daydreaming, see Klinger 2009.

2.6 Imagination and Pretense

Questions about the relation between imagination and pretense are to some extent terminological. Some (following Ryle 1949) speak of imagination and pretense interchangeably; others take imagination to be more mentalistic and pretense more behavioral. On the latter reading, most philosophers agree that one could imagine without pretending, and that one could pretend (that is, act-as-if) without imagining. (Cf. Ryle 1949; Currie and Ravenscroft 2002.)

In the developmental psychology literature, there is debate over the underlying capacities that facilitate pretense behavior in children, with three competing theoretical positions predominating. Metarepresentational accounts maintain that pretense involves representing the contents of the pretend episode as pretense, and thus holds that those who engage in pretense behavior must possess a concept of pretense (Leslie 1987, 1994). Behaviorist accounts maintain, to the contrary, that pretending requires only the ability to ‘behave as if’ the content of the pretense were true (Harris 1994, 2000; Perner 1991; Nichols and Stich 2003). Intentionalist accounts maintain that what underlies the ability to engage in pretense behavior is the ability to intend to pretend or to act as though the contents of the pretense episode were true (Searle 1979; Rakoczy, Tomasello and Striano 2004).

A more detailed discussion of pretense in the context of early childhood development can be found in section 6.1 below.

3. Imagination: Norms and Violations

3.1 Mirroring and Quarantining

Games of pretense in particular, and imaginative episodes in general, tend to share a pair of features that have been dubbed mirroring and quarantining. (Gendler 2003; see also Leslie 1987; Perner 1991, Nichols and Stich 2000).

Mirroring is manifest to the extent that features of the imaginary situation that have not been explicitly stipulated are derivable via features of their real-world analogues, or, more generally, to the extent that imaginative content is taken to be governed by the same sorts of restrictions that govern believed content. For example, in a widely-discussed experiment conducted by Alan Leslie (1994), children are asked to engage in an imaginary tea party. When an experimenter tips and ‘spills’ one of the (empty) teacups, children consider the non-tipped cup to be ‘full’ (in the context of the pretense) and the tipped cup to be ‘empty’ (both within and outside of the context of the pretense). More generally, it appears that both games of make-believe and more complicated engagements with fiction, cinema, and visual art are governed by principles of generation, according to which particular prompts or props ‘generate’ or ‘render make-believe’ particular fictional truths and that those principles tend to be, for the most part, reality-oriented. (Walton 1990). (For further discussion, see Currie 2002; Gendler 2003; Harris 2000; Harris and Kavanaugh 1993; Leslie 1994; Lewis 1983b; Nichols and Stich 2000. Related issues are discussed below in section 3.3 below.)

Quarantining, is manifest to the extent that events within the imagined or pretended episode are taken to have effects only within a relevantly circumscribed domain. So, for example, the child engaging in the make-believe tea party does not expect that ‘spilling’ (imaginary) ‘tea’ will result in the table really being wet, nor does a person who imagines winning the lottery expect that when she visits the ATM, her bank account will contain a million dollars. More generally, quarantining is manifest to the extent that proto-beliefs and proto-attitudes concerning the imagined state of affairs are not treated as beliefs and attitudes relevant to guiding action in the actual world. (The failure to quarantine imaginary attitudes in certain contexts is often taken to be a mark of mental illness; see section 6.3 below.)

Some (Nichols and Stich 2000, 2003; cf. Leslie 1987) have suggest that mirroring and quarantining fall out naturally from the architecture of the imagination: mirroring is a consequence of the ways in which imagination and belief share a “single code” and quarantining is a consequence of the way in which imagination takes place “off-line” (Nichols 2004; 2006.)

3.2 Disparity and Contagion

Though games of pretense and imaginative episodes are largely governed by mirroring and quarantining, both may be violated in systematic ways. Mirroring gives way to disparity as a result of the ways in which (the treatment of) imaginary content may differ from (that of) believed content. Imagined content may be incomplete (e.g. there may be no fact of the matter (in the pretense) just how much tea has spilled on the table) or incoherent (e.g. it might be that the toaster serves (in the pretense) as a logical-truth inverter). And content that is imagined may give rise to discrepant responses, most strikingly in cases of discrepant affect (where, for example, the imminent destruction of all human life is treated as amusing rather than terrifying; cf. Nichols 2006, also Gendler 2003, 2006; see also section 5.2 below.)

Quarantining gives way to contagion when imagined content ends up playing a direct role in actual attitudes and behavior. This is common in cases of affective transmission, where an emotional response generated by an imagined situation may constrain subsequent behavior. For example, imagining something fearful (such as a tiger in the kitchen) may give rise to actual hesitation (such as reluctance to enter the room; cf. Harris et al 1991.) And it also occurs in cases of cognitive transmission, where imagined content is thereby “primed” and rendered more accessible in ways that go on to shape subsequent perception and experience. For example, imagining some object (such as a sheep) may make one more likely to “perceive” such objects in one's environment (such as mistaking a rock for a ram.) (For an overview of such cases, cf. Gendler 2003; 2006.)

3.3 Explaining Contagion

A number of philosophers have proposed explanations for how imagining might give rise to emotional and behavioral responses typically associated with belief, despite the imaginer's explicit avowal that she does not take the imagined content to be real.

One recent explanation of this phenomenon makes appeal to what Tamar Gendler has dubbed alief. (Gendler, 2008a, 2008b; see also Dennett and McKay 2009) To have an alief is—roughly—to have an innate or habitual propensity for a real or apparent stimulus to automatically activate a particular affective and behavioral repertoire, where the behavioral propensities to which an alief gives rise may be in tension with those that arise from one's beliefs. So, for example, while a subject may believe that drinking out of a sterile bedpan is completely safe, she may nonetheless show hesitation and disgust at the prospect of doing so because the bedpan renders occurrent an alief with the content ‘filthy object, disgusting, stay away.’ Since aliefs, by their nature, are source-indifferent, imagined content may give rise to alief-driven reactions. As a result, the notion of alief may explain how content that we explicitly recognize to be purely imaginary may nonetheless produce powerful emotional and cognitive responses. (Gendler 2008a, 2008b; see also section 5.3 below.)

Andy Egan (2001) explains similar phenomena in terms of what he calls ‘bimagination’, a mental state that has some of the distinctive features of belief and some of imagination: bimagination is both action-guiding (and hence belief-like) and inferentially highly circumscribed (and hence imagination-like.) On Egan's view, this distinctive mental state can be invoked to explain a number of cases that other philosophers have described as involving imagined content that gives rise to belief-typical responses (particularly delusions, see section 6.3 below.)

Further discussion of related issues can be found in Perner, Baker, and Hutton 1994; Schwitzgebel 2001; and Zimmerman 2007. Additional discussion of contagion in the context of fictional emotions can be found in section 5.3 below.

4. Some Roles of Imagination

Much of the contemporary discussion of imagination has centered around particular roles that imagination is purported to play in various domains of human understanding and activity. Five of the most widely-discussed are the role of imagination in the understanding of other minds (Section 4.1), in the cultivation of moral understanding and sensibility (Section 4.2), in the reconfiguration of responses (Section 4.3), in planning and counterfactual reasoning (Section 4.4), and in providing knowledge of possibility (Section 4.5).

4.1 Imagination and Mindreading

Mindreading is the activity of attributing mental states to oneself and to others, and of predicting and explaining behavior on the basis of those attributions.

Early discussions of mindreading were often framed as debates between the “theory theory”—which holds that the attribution of mental states to others is guided by the application of some (tacit) folk psychological theory—and the “simulation theory”—which holds that the attribution of mental states is guided by a process of replicating or emulating the target's (apparent) mental states, perhaps through mechanisms involving the imagination. (Influential collections of papers on this debate include Carruthers and Smith, eds. 1996; Davies and Stone, eds. 1995a, 1995b.) In recent years, proponents of both sides have increasingly converged on common ground, allowing that both theory and simulation play some role in the attribution of mental states to others (Cf. Carruthers 2003; Goldman 2006; Nichols and Stich 2003; cf. also empirical work adverted to in section 6 below.) Many such hybrid accounts include a role for imagination.

On theory theory views, mindreading involves the application of some (tacit) folk psychological theory that allows the subject to make predictions and offer explanations of the target's beliefs and behaviors. On pure versions of such accounts, imagination plays no special role in the attribution of mental states to others. (For an overview of theory theory, cf. the entry on folk psychology as a theory).

On simulation theory views, mindreading involves simulating the target's mental states so as to exploit similarities between the subject's and target's processing capacities. It is this simulation that allows the subject to make predictions and offer explanations of the target's beliefs and behaviors. (For early papers, see Goldman 1989; Gordon 1986; Heal 1986; for recent dissent, see, e.g., Carruthers 2009; Gallagher 2007; Saxe 2005, 2009; for an overview of simulation theory, cf. the entry on folk psychology as mental simulation.)

Traditional versions of simulation theory typically describe simulation using expressions such as “imaginatively putting oneself in the other's place” (Gordon 2004). How this metaphor is understood depends on the specific account. (A collection of papers exploring various versions of simulation theory can be found in Dokic and Proust, eds. 2002.) On many accounts, the projection is assumed to involve the subject's imaginatively “running” mental processes “off-line” that are directly analogous to those being run “on-line” by the target (e.g. Goldman 1989). Recent empirical work in psychology has explored the accuracy of such projections (Markman et al eds. 2009, section V; Saxe 2005, 2006, 2009.)

Though classic simulationist accounts have tended to assume that the simulation process is at least in-principle accessible to consciousness, a number of recent simulation-style accounts appeal to neuroscientific evidence suggesting that at least some simulative processes take place completely unconsciously. On such accounts of mindreading, no special role is played by conscious imagination. (For discussion, see Goldman 2009; Saxe 2009.)

Many contemporary views of mindreading are hybrid theory views according to which both theorizing and simulation play a role in the understanding of others' mental states. Goldman (2006), for example, argues that while mindreading is primarily the product of simulation, theorizing plays a role in certain cases as well. Many recent discussions have endorsed hybrid views of this sort, with more or less weight given to each of the components in particular cases. (Cf. Carruthers 2003; Nichols and Stich 2003.)

A number of philosophers have suggested that the mechanisms underlying subjects' capacity to engage in mindreading are those that enable engagement in pretense behavior (Currie and Ravenscroft 2002; Goldman 2006; Nichols and Stich 2003; for an overview of recent discussions, see Carruthers 2009.) According to such accounts, engaging in pretense involves imaginatively taking up perspectives other than one's own, and the ability to do so skillfully may rely on—and contribute to—one's ability to understand those alternate perspectives. Partly in light of these considerations, the relative lack of spontaneous pretense in children with autistic spectrum disorders is taken as evidence for a link between the skills of pretense and empathy (see section 6.2.)

4.2 Imagination, Fiction and Moral Understanding

Since ancient times, philosophers and others have argued that fiction can play a role in the ‘moral education’ of those who imaginatively engage with it through developing of their abilities to think and act in morally desirable ways. One suggested mechanism for this process is that fictions allow imaginative acquaintance with unfamiliar moral perspectives and emotions, and cultivate existing moral understanding and capabilities by directing the reader's attention in ways that allow that understanding to be applied. Theories along these lines are endorsed by Carroll 2002, Currie 1995b, Jacobson 1996, Mullin 2004, Nussbaum 1990, and Robinson 2005, and explored throughout the works of Iris Murdoch passim.

Martha Nussbaum maintains that one of the central moral skills is the ability to discern morally salient features of one's situation. This skill, she contends, is one that must be developed, and one to which the engagement with literature might effectively contribute by providing “close and careful interpretative descriptions” of imagined scenarios that enable emotional involvement untainted by distorting self-interest (1990, 46–8). Hakemulder (2000) reviews some empirical psychological evidence for this hypothesis.

Mark Johnson (1994, Ch. 8) holds a view on which our moral understanding and moral development are both fundamentally tied to our imaginative abilities. On his account, our abilities to imagine morally relevant situations and alternatives aids in our moral understanding, and our moral education consists at least partly in the development of abilities to imaginatively apply moral concepts to events in our everyday lives.

4.3 Imagination and Reshaping Responses

Another purported role for imagination is in reshaping innate or habitual patterns of response. I might, for example, believe that snakes are harmless, yet nonetheless find myself unable to tolerate their presence; or I might believe that male and female students are, on the whole, equally capable academically, yet nonetheless read the papers of my female students less charitably. Empirical evidence suggests that engaging in certain types of mental imagery exercises can mitigate these sorts of unwanted automatic associations, that is, that imagination, properly deployed, may be a resource for the regulation of behaviors that lie beyond the range of our immediate rational control. (Historical discussions of this technique can be found in the entry on Ancient, Medieval, and Renaissance theories of emotions and on 17th and 18th century theories of emotions; for an overview of some recent work in this domain, see Gendler 2008b.)

These issues have been explored extensively in work in sports psychology, where researchers have demonstrated the efficacy of mental imagery practice in domains ranging from table tennis and golf to kayaking and dart throwing. (For references to studies of the efficacy of mental imagery in more than forty sports, see Kosslyn and Moulton 2009, 38.)

Mental imagery also plays a central role in a number of therapeutic practices, including Cognitive Behavioral Therapy (cf. Beck 1993; Ellis 2001.) For further discussion, see the Stanford Encyclopedia segment on the mental imagery revival.

4.4 Imagination and Counterfactual Reasoning

It has been argued that imagination plays a central role in figuring out what would happen—or what would have happened—had things been different from how they in fact are or were. Timothy Williamson, for example, suggests that “When we work out what would have happened if such-and-such had been the case, we frequently cannot do it without imagining such-and-such to be the case and letting things run.” (Williamson 2005, 19; cf. Williamson 2007). On this sort of account, if King Lear thinks to himself, “If only I hadn't divided my kingdom between Regan and Goneril, Cordelia would still be alive,” it is Lear's imagining a relevant situation in which he hadn't divided his kingdom between Regan and Goneril that allows him to move from the antecedent to the consequent of the counterfactual conditional that he entertains. Clearly, such contemplation gives access to a suitably circumscribed set of worlds only if the imaginative exercise is somehow constrained with respect to what is held constant.

The role of imagination in counterfactual thinking—and, in particular, the question of what tends to be held constant when subjects contemplate counterfactual scenarios—has been explored in detail in recent empirical psychological work. In her monograph-length discussion of the role of imagination in counterfactual reasoning, Ruth Byrne (2005) presents evidence showing that, when people reason using counterfactuals, what is imagined tends to fall into certain typical categories. For example, people tend not to imagine worlds with different natural laws, and they tend to imagine alternatives to more recent as opposed to earlier events, alternatives to actions as opposed to inactions, and alternatives to events that were within their control as opposed to events outside of it. (Additional influential work on this topic can found in Byrne 2005; Johnson-Laird 1983, 2006; Markman et al. 2009, sect. III; Roese and Olson 1995. )

Such issues may bear on other philosophical work that makes appeal to counterfactual reasoning, for example, theories of causation, counterfactual conditionals and modality.

4.5 Imagination and Possibility

On one widely-discussed view of the epistemology of modality, conceivability is taken to be a (prima facie) guide to possibility. (For discussion, see Yablo 1993,). On the simplest version of this account (which, for reasons discussed below, no one holds), whatever can be conceived is possible (sometimes called the C-P thesis) and whatever is possible can be conceived (sometimes called the P-C thesis).,

Possibility in this context is generally understood as metaphysical possibility, where a proposition is metaphysically possible iff it describes some way things might have been. (Cf. Gendler & Hawthorne 2002; Fine 2002). Conceivability here is generally taken in a broad sense, where conceiving is something like “the capacity that enables us to represent scenarios to ourselves using words or concepts or sensory images, scenarios that purport to involve actual or non-actual things in actual or non-actual configurations” (Gendler & Hawthorne 2002, 1; for an overview of some of the distinctions that this characterization brushes over, see Yablo 1993).

Given these clarifications, it is clear that the P-C thesis is a non-starter, at least without heavy idealization: the range of metaphysical possibilities certainly outruns the range of propositions that we ordinary humans can represent to ourselves. But versions of the C-P thesis, according to which the fact that we can represent P to ourselves provides (probabilifying or decisive) evidence in favor of P's metaphysical possibility, have played a central role in a number of traditional and contemporary discussions, particularly in the context of mind-body dualism (for details, see relevant sections in the SEP entries on zombies and dualism.)

Descartes famously offered one such modal argument in the Sixth Meditation (CSM II, 54), reasoning from the fact that he could clearly and distinctly conceive of his mind and body as distinct to the real distinctness between them. Contemporary advocates of related arguments—details of which can be found in relevant sections in the SEP entries on zombies and dualism—include Saul Kripke (1972/80), W.D. Hart (1988), and David Chalmers (1996, 2002). One form of such argument takes as a premise something implying or implied by the following:

Zombie-conceivability: It is conceivable that there could be an exact physical duplicate of me who lacked consciousness.

And, relying on some suitably strong C-P-style principle, concludes from this that:

Zombie-possibility: It is possible that there could be an exact physical duplicate of me who lacked consciousness.

Both defenders and critics of such modal arguments have suggested that appeal to the notion of imagining—as distinct from mere conceiving—may play a role in such arguments' soundness.

On the defenders' side, David Chalmers has argued that even those who hold that there are propositions that are not epistemically accessible on the basis of a complete qualitative description of the world should still accept that what he calls “ideal primary positive conceivability” entails what he calls “primary possibility.” Primary (as opposed to secondary) possibility concerns the question of whether there is some world W that makes P true when W is considered as actual. (For a discussion of the relation between this notion and the notion of metaphysical possibility, see Chalmers 2002.) Ideal (as opposed to mere prima facie) conceivability concerns the question of whether P is conceivable on ideal rational reflection. And positive (as opposed to negative) conceivability concerns the question of whether P is imaginable: to positively conceive of a situation is “to in some sense imagine a specific configuration of objects and properties” (Chalmers 2002). According to Chalmers, then, a certain sort of C-P thesis holds for states of affairs that are conceivable on reflection in the positive sense—that is, for states of affairs that are, on reflection, imaginable. (For discussion, see Byrne 2007; Levin 2008; Stoljar 2007; Stalnaker 2002; Yablo 2002.)

On the critical side, Christopher Hill (Hill 1997; Hill & McLaughlin 1999), following a suggestion of Thomas Nagel (Nagel 1974, footnote 11), has argued that if we distinguish properly between sympathetic imagining—wherein one imagines oneself undergoing a certain experience—and perceptual imagining—wherein one imagines oneself perceiving a certain event or state of affairs, then Descartes/Kripke/Chalmers-style modal arguments fail. He contends that in the Zombie argument, the “exact physical duplicate” is imagined in one way, whereas the “lacking consciousness” is imagined in another: the conceiving that goes on with respect to the relevant physical features involves perceptual imagination, whereas the conceiving that goes on with respect to the relevant phenomenal features involves sympathetic imagination. As a result, the relation between the physical and phenomenal features “will appear contingent even if it is necessary, because of the independence of the disparate types of imagination” (Nagel 1974, footnote 11). So the argument cannot get off the ground. (Chalmers' response can be found in Chalmers 1999.)

For a comprehensive discussion of the major philosophical positions concerning the relations among imagination, conceivability and possibility, see the entry on the epistemology of modality; for related discussion, see relevant sections in the entries on zombies and dualism. A detailed introduction to the issues in question can be found in Gendler & Hawthorne 2002b or Evnine 2008; recent papers on this topic can be found at PhilPapers Conceivability, Imagination and Possibility. See especially Byrne 2007 and Stoljar 2007.

5. Imagination: Puzzles and Problems

Much of the most sophisticated discussion of imagination in recent years has taken place in the context of the relation between imagination and aesthetic experience—often focusing on issues of imaginative engagement with fictional content through literature, theater and cinema, and visual art.

The subsections below present some of the main issues that have emerged in these discussions by looking at six sets of puzzles and problems around which a great deal of discussion has been focused.

5.1 Imagination and Fictionality

When we engage with a fiction, by watching a play or reading a book or viewing a work of visual art or playing a game of make-believe, we take certain things to be fictional, or true in that fiction. One way to understand this is to explain what is fictional in terms of what we imagine or are directed or supposed or intended to imagine.

Influential accounts by Kendall Walton (1990) and Gregory Currie (1990), for instance, contend that there is an intimate connection between imagination and fictionality. On Walton's view, what is fictional is what is “to be imagined” given the conventions governing the game of make-believe or the world of the story. If you and I are putting on a production of Twelfth Night and we decide that I'll play Viola and you'll play Sebastian, then we will have established a convention by which what I say and do is what, in the fiction, Viola says and does, and what you say and do is what Sebastian says and does. On Walton's account, this will be the case regardless of whether the members of our audience do in fact imagine that what I'm saying is what Viola says; what is important is that it is prescribed, by the conventions of our production, to be imagined that what I say is what Viola says.

On Currie's account, which is similar to Walton's, what is fictional is defined as that which the author (or actor, or creator) intends the audience to make-believe or imagine. Related discussion in the context of literature can be found in Lamarque and Olson (1996).

The intimate relationship between imagination and fictionality is illustrated by the puzzle of imaginative resistance (see Section 5.2). When we resist imagining something, we also tend to resist accepting it as fictional. And conversely, what we imagine is often (particularly in the context of art and games of make-believe) what we take to be fictional.

For related considerations in the context of film, see the entry on film. For empirical work in this area, see the writings of Ed Tan passim (under Other Internet Resources).

5.2 Imaginative Resistance

Imaginative resistance occurs when a subject finds it difficult or problematic to engage in some sort of prompted imaginative activity. Suppose, for example, that you were confronted with a variation of Macbeth where “the facts of [Duncan's] murder remain as they are in fact presented in the play, but it is prescribed in this alternate fiction that this was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth's sleep” (Moran 1994). If you found it difficult to imagine this, even though the author had done everything authors usually do to make such a story fictionally true, then you would be experiencing imaginative resistance.

While early discussions of imaginative resistance tended to focus on examples (like the one above) involving ‘morally deviant’ worlds, it is now widely agreed that this initial characterization was too restrictive (for partial dissent, see Gendler 2006). In more recent literature, the term is typically applied to any sort of case where subjects find it unexpectedly difficult to (bring themselves to) imagine what an author describes, or to accept such a claim as being true in the story. So, for example, Brian Weatherson (2004) has argued that resistance puzzles arise not only for normative concepts (including thick and thin moral concepts, aesthetic judgments, and epistemic evaluations), but also for attributions of mental states, attributions of content, and claims involving constitution or ontological status.

As Kendall Walton (2006) notes, the questions addressed under the rubric of imaginative resistance turn out to be a ‘tangled nest of importantly distinct but easily confused puzzles’. Indeed, it has been argued (Weatherson 2004) that there are at least four such puzzles: those of aesthetic value, phenomenology, fictionality, and imaginability.

In its most general form, the aesthetic value puzzle is the puzzle of why texts that evoke imaginative resistance are often aesthetically compromised thereby; this puzzle is typically discussed specifically in the context of morality. (See, for example, Bermúdez & Gardner 2003, Gaut 2003, Walton 2006.) The phenomenological puzzle is the puzzle of why passages that evoke resistance tend to involve a particular phenomenology, described by Gendler as ‘doubling of the narrator’ or ‘pop-out’ (Gendler 2000, 2006). The fictionality puzzle is the puzzle of why, in certain cases, the default position of authorial authority appears to break down, so that mere authorial say-so is insufficient to make it the case that something is true in a story. And the imaginability puzzle is the puzzle of why, in certain cases, readers display a reluctance or inability to engage in some mandated act of imagining, so that typical invitations to make-believe are insufficient to bring about the requisite response on the part of the reader.

The bulk of philosophical discussion has been devoted—often without distinguishing between them—to the puzzles of fictionality and imaginability, with accounts of the phenomena falling into two main categories.

The first group—sometimes called can't theories (Gendler 2006)—trace the puzzles to features of the fictional world: they maintain that readers are unable to follow the author's lead because of some problem with the world the author has tried to describe.

Simple can't theories often embrace some sort of impossibility hypothesis, suggesting that propositions that evoke imaginative resistance are impossible in the context of the stories where they appear, and that this explains why readers fail to imagine them as true in the fiction. (For discussion and criticism, see Gendler 2000; Stock 2005; Walton 1994.) Brian Weatherson (2004) offers a more sophisticated version of a can't theory, suggesting that resistance puzzles arise in the face of a certain type of impossibility: they arise in cases where the lower-level facts of the story and the higher-level claims of the author exhibit a particular kind of incoherence. (See also Yablo 2002.)

The second group—sometimes called won't theories—trace the puzzles to features of the actual world: they maintain that readers are unwilling to follow the author's lead because doing so might lead them to look at the (actual) world in a way that they prefer to avoid (Gendler 2000, 2006). Advocates of such views tend to stress the distinctive role of imagination in imaginative resistance, focusing on ways that imagination may implicate the subject's actual beliefs and desires. (For discussions see Currie 2002; Doggett & Egan 2007; Matravers 2003; Nichols 2006; Stokes 2006.)

A number of recent discussions of resistance-related phenomena draw on work in cognitive and social psychology, naturalizing the puzzle in ways that partially finesse the can't/won't distinction. According to architectural accounts, imaginative resistance emerges because imagination and belief make use of the same cognitive structures, so resistance to imagining P is to be expected in certain of the cases where we would be resistant to believing P. (Cf. Nichols (2004); Weinberg and Meskin (2006).)

Other recent work has explored the connections between imaginative resistance, moral evaluation, moral psychology and moral realism (Driver 2008; Levy 2005; Stokes 2006; Todd 2009).

5.3 The Paradox of Fictional Emotions

The paradox of fictional emotions arises because certain reactions to fictional scenarios seem to systematically violate the norm of quarantining (see section 3.1 above), in that subjects regularly exhibit apparently genuine emotional responses to characters and situations that they explicitly represent as being merely imaginary. The paradox is typically formulated using something like the following three conditions (cf. Radford 1975; Gendler & Kovakovich 2006). Regarding certain fictional characters (and situations) F, it appears to be simultaneously true that:

  1. Response Condition: Subjects experience genuine emotional responses (e.g. pleasure, fear, pity, sadness) towards F
  2. Belief Condition: Subjects believe that F is purely fictional or merely imaginary
  3. Coordination Condition: In order to have genuine emotional responses towards a character (or situation), one must not believe that the character (or situation) is purely fictional or merely imaginary

Solutions to the paradox generally deny one of the three claims while maintaining the other two, and are typically classified into three families on the basis of which condition they reject.

The first family of solutions rejects the Response Condition (a) by denying that subjects have emotional responses towards imaginary characters and situations. They do so either by denying that the responses in question are genuine emotions, or by denying that the targets of these responses are imaginary characters and situations.

The most prominent view in the first subgroup is Walton's (1990) quasi-emotion theory, according to which what appear to be genuine emotions are, in the context of engagement with imagined content, nothing more than ‘quasi’ ‘pretend’ or ‘fictional’ emotions. Quasi-emotions differ from their actual counterparts both in their source (they are generated by beliefs about what is fictionally rather than actually true), and, typically, in their behavioral consequences (though we may pity Ophelia, we make no effort to console her in her sorrow.)

Views in the second subgroup maintain that when we engage with fiction, our emotional responses are directed not towards the characters or events within the imaginary context, but rather towards appropriate real-world surrogates for or counterparts of those characters and events. So, for example, we don't feel sadness for Romeo and Juliet, but rather for people in the actual world who have led relevantly similar lives. (Cf. Charlton 1984)

A second family of response rejects the Belief Condition (b), denying that the situations and characters to which subjects have emotional responses are situations and characters that they believe to be fictional or merely imaginary. Advocates of such confusionist or illusionist or belief-suspension views maintain that when we engage emotionally with fictional characters and situations, we temporarily cease to represent them as imaginary, instead representing them (as the result of some confusion, or an illusion, or a ‘suspension of disbelief’) to be real and mind-independent. Such views have few adherents among contemporary philosophers (a possible historical advocate is Coleridge 1817) and are generally discussed only to be subsequently dismissed (cf. Currie 1990; Radford 1975; Walton 1978; for partial exception in the case of dreaming, see McGinn 2004).

The most popular family to responses rejects the Coordination Condition (c), allowing that it is possible or permissible to have emotional responses towards a character (or situation) that one believes to be purely fictional or merely imaginary.

Such non-coordination theories take a number of different forms. Advocates of so-called thought theories argue that it is false to think that, in general, our emotional responses are directed only towards things that we take to be real. Versions of this sort of theory have been advanced by, among others, Noël Carroll (1990), Susan Feagin (1996), Peter Lamarque (1981; 1996), and Richard Moran (1994); objections to the thought theory are explored in Walton 1990. A recent version of this sort of account makes appeal to the notion of alief (Gendler 2008a, 2008b, see section 3.3 above), according to which emotional responses to fictional characters are the result of cognitive mechanisms that are indifferent between content that is represented as real or as merely imaginary.

A second family of anti-coordination views rejects (c) on empirical grounds. Gendler and Kovakovich 2005, following Harris 2000 suggest that work done by cognitive neuroscientists (Damasio 1997, 1999) has shown that emotional engagement with imagined scenarios is integral to human practical reasoning. Potential decisions are ‘tested out’ in the imagination, and are accepted or rejected partly on the basis of emotional reactions to imagined outcomes. Thus, it is argued, if we could not have genuine emotional responses to imagined scenarios—and by extension fully developed fiction—we would not be able to engage in practical reasoning. (Related views are explored in Weinberg and Meskin 2006; Currie 1997.)

Finally, according to irrationalist accounts, although subjects tacitly endorse all three of (a), (b) and (c) as normative constraints, as a descriptive matter, they violate (c): they have genuine emotional reactions to fictional characters and events that they believe to be purely imaginary, while (tacitly) holding that they should have genuine emotional reactions only to characters and events that they believe to be real. These reactions are thus irrational. (cf. Radford 1975).

Influential anthologies on the fictional paradoxes include Bermúdez & Gardner, eds. 2003; Hjort & Laver, eds. 1997; Kieran & Lopes, eds. 2003; Nichols, ed. 2006; collections of essays include Currie 2004; Levinson 1998. Book-length treatments include Carroll 1990; Currie 1990, 1995a; Feagin 1996; Robinson 2005; Scruton 1974; Walton 1990; see also Brann 1991. Discussion in this section is indebted to the thorough review found in Neill 2005, as well as in Levinson 1997 and Schneider 2006.

5.4 The Paradox of Tragedy

The paradox of tragedy is closely related to the paradox of fiction. But whereas the former focuses on an unexpected similarity between our reactions to fiction and reality, the latter focuses, in additional, on an unexpected difference between them. The paradox of tragedy takes notice not only of the fact that we seem to experience negative emotions in response to tragedy in fiction, but also that, while we tend in general to avoid things that evoke negative emotions in us, we do not tend to avoid fictional tragedies.

Like the paradox of fiction, the paradox of tragedy can be formulated as a conflict among three mutually inconsistent propositions:

  1. Negative Emotion Condition: Tragedy evokes negative emotion in subjects.
  2. Negative Avoidance Condition: If something evokes negative emotion in a subject, then the subject tends to avoid it.
  3. Non-Avoidance Condition: Subjects do not tend to avoid tragedy.

There seem to be few grounds for the rejection of the Non-Avoidance Condition (f); it is undeniable that, at least in some cases, people seek out tragedy. So we will restrict our discussion to solutions that reject the Negative Emotion (d) or Negative Avoidance (e) Condition.

Anti-Negative Emotion Condition responses deny that—properly understood—the emotion that tragedy evokes in us is negative. Conversionary explanations suggest that in the context of an engagement with art, negative emotional responses are converted—as a matter of fact about how human psychological mechanisms operate—into something positive and pleasant. This sort of view can be found in Hume's ‘Of Tragedy’. Deflationary explanations deny that we in fact have negative emotional responses to art. One version of such an account is Walton's (1990) theory of quasi-emotions (see section 5.3 above), according to which artistic representations do not give rise to genuine emotions.

Anti-Negative Avoidance Condition responses deny that if something evokes negative emotion in us, we tend to avoid it. These responses take a number of forms. The most blunt form simply denies (e) outright. Such revisionary explanations argue that, in fact, it is simply not true that in general we tend to avoid things that induce negative emotional responses in us (cf. Walton 1990.) Compensatory explanations stress that, although engagement with tragedy may bring unpleasantness, the reward gleaned from that experience outweighs the cost of the negative emotional experience. (Cf. Aristotle's Poetics; Carroll 1990.) Closely related are rich experience explanations, according to which art that is ultimately painful may nevertheless be valuable because of the richness of experience that it provides (Smuts 2007).

A view that can be understood either as an anti-avoidance view or an anti-negative emotion view is the control theory explanation (Morreall 1985.) Advocates of such views argue what explains our relative desire to engage with fictional tragedies is that we have more control over our experience of fictions—we can get up and leave any time we want—than we do over real life. (For criticism, see Yanal 1999.)

For a comprehensive recent overview of responses to the paradox of tragedy, see Smuts 2009.

5.5 The Puzzles of Iteration

An iterated fiction (or pretense) is one that has a fiction (or pretense) embedded within it. Following Nichols (2003), it is common to speak of two puzzles of iterated fiction, the puzzle of preserved iteration (also known as the ‘Flash Stockman’ puzzle (Lewis 1983a)) and the puzzle of collapsed iteration (Currie 1995c). A successful theory of pretense or imagination must simultaneously account for both puzzles.

The Puzzle of Preserved Iteration

The puzzle of preserved iteration is the puzzle of how it is possible for pretending to pretend (or imagining that one is imagining) to differ from merely pretending (or imagining). Suppose, for example, that you are playing one of the ‘rude mechanicals’ in A Midsummer Night's Dream, who themselves stage a performance of Pyramus and Thisbe as a ‘play within a play.’ In order to do so, you need to pretend to be a character in A Midsummer Night's Dream pretending to be a character in Pyramus and Thisbe—without your pretense “collapsing” into your simply pretending to be a character in Pyramus and Thisbe.

David Lewis (1983a), who brought the puzzle to the attention of the Anglo-American philosophical community (with the story of a singer who pretends to be a lying stockman pretending to tell the truth) offers no solution to it. Peter Lamarque (1987) has suggested that a solution can be found in the nature of pretense itself: pretense has particular features, which are mimicked in cases of pretending to pretend. Shaun Nichols (2003) contends that this solution is insufficiently general, since there are parallel cases of iteration that do not involve pretense: I might imagine imagining that I see a dagger, and this is different from imagining that I see a dagger.

Nichols suggests instead that the phenomenon can be accounted for by appeal to the “cognitive theory of pretense” advanced in Nichols and Stich (2000). On this account, our mental architecture contains not only a “belief box” in which believed content is “stored”—it also contains a “pretense box” for holding imagined or pretended content. Nichols maintains that “the pretence box account provides a general solution to the puzzle of preserved iteration. To imagine about imaginings is to have a representation in one's pretence box that attributes imagining” (Nichols 2003).

The Puzzle of Collapsed Iteration

The puzzle of collapsed iteration is the puzzle of how it is possible for pretending to pretend to collapse into merely pretending.

Consider The Taming of the Shrew which, for almost the entirety of the main plot, is ‘framed’ as a performance for a drunkard. Here, audiences will typically watch the play, not as a play within a play, but as having ‘one level of pretense’, and those playing Bianca and Katherina will (typically) be pretending to be Bianca and Katherina, not pretending to be actors pretending to be Bianca and Katherina.

Greg Currie (1995c) who raises the puzzle, suggests that collapsed iteration may result from limitations in our cognitive resources; on his account, imagining imagining requires a simulation of a simulation—a capacity that human beings may simply lack. Nichols (2003) counters that such an account makes it difficult to explain how, in some cases (as above), iteration is preserved. Instead, he suggests, in some cases of imagining we ‘relocate’ ourselves into the position of another person, imagining what they imagine (resulting in collapsed iteration), while in others, we do not engage in such ‘relocation’ (resulting in preserved iteration.)

The puzzle of collapsed iteration provides a useful foil for thinking about the relation between imagination and belief. While in imagining that you imagine something I might end up thereby imagining what you imagine, I will not come to believe what you believe simply by coming to believe that you believe it. (Cf. Currie 1995c, 161)

5.6 Visualizing the Unseen (Berkeley's Puzzle)

In its original form, Berkeley's Puzzle is presented as a puzzle about the possibility of conceiving of something neither perceived nor thought of, or, as Winkler (1989) suggests, as a puzzle of how it could be that an idea in the mind represents the mind-independence of what is represented. In the context of imagination, attention has been given to a special case of the puzzle, namely, whether it is possible to visualize the unseen.

The original puzzle, often referred to as the ‘Master Argument’, is found in both Berkeley's Principles (sect. 23) and his Three Dialogues. In the Dialogues Hylas, challenged by Philonous to conceive of the unperceived, finds that he is unable to do so:

Hylas: […] As I was thinking of a tree in a solitary place, where no one was present to see it, methought that was to conceive a tree as existing unperceived or unthought of, not considering that I myself conceived it all the while. But now I plainly see, that all I can do is to frame ideas in my own mind. I may indeed conceive in my own thoughts the idea of a tree, or a house, or a mountain, but that is all. And this is far from proving, that I can conceive them existing out of the minds of all spirits. (First Dialogue between Hylas and Philonous)

The notion of conception assumed here seems tied closely to mental imagery: it appears that what Hylas sets out to do is to visually imagine an unperceived tree; in so doing, he constructs a visual image of a tree, thereby rendering it conceived. A number of philosophers, including Bernard Williams (1973), have dismissed the argument as incapable of achieving its stated goal on the grounds that it fails to distinguish between conceiving of something and visually imagining it. John Campbell points out that one can, for example, describe in writing an unseen tree (Campbell 2002, 128; contra Williams, Campbell argues that there is something importantly correct in Berkeley's challenge with respect to conceivability).

According to Williams, the more interesting challenge raised by Berkeley's puzzle concerns whether one can visualize the unseen. It might seem that, almost trivially, one cannot visualize an unseen object, in virtue of the apparent fact that to visualize, say, a tree is to think of oneself as seeing a tree, and I can hardly think of myself as seeing a tree that is unseen. Against this view Williams argues that even if to visualize a tree is to think of myself as seeing a tree, nevertheless I need not include my seeing in what is visualized. In cinema and theater, it need not be true in the fiction that the camera or audience sees what the scene contains, so too, Williams argues, even though I can visualize my seeing a tree such that my seeing is part of what is visualized, I can also visualize a tree without doing so, and therefore can visualize an unseen tree (Williams 1973).

Against Williams' arguments, Christopher Peacocke has defended the view that one cannot visually imagine the unperceived, on the grounds that the content of what one imagines may contain more than what is ‘depicted’ in the image (Peacocke 1985). To make this point Peacocke introduces the notion of ‘S-imagination’, with the ‘S’ standing for ‘supposition’ (25). S-imagined content is supposed to account for the difference between visually imagining, say, a briefcase, and visually imagining a cat that is wholly obscured by a briefcase; though they share imagistic content, they differ in S-imagined content. Peacocke acknowledges that in visually imagining a tree it may not be part of what is visualized that it is being seen, but, he argues, that the tree is seen will inescapably be part of what is S-imagined. (Note that Peacocke's use of the term “S-imagine” differs from Goldman's notion of the same name (see Section 2.4 above.))

For additional discussions of Berkeley's puzzle, see Walton 1990, 237—9; cf. also Szabó 2005. Further discussion of Berkeley's master argument and its role in his philosophical program can be found in the entry on Berkeley (sect. 2.2.1).

6. Empirical Work on Imagination

6.1 Developmental Work on the Origins of Pretense

By the age of 15 months, typically developing children are capable of engaging in primitive games of make-believe—acting, for instance, as if a piece of cloth or coat collar were their special bedtime pillow. (Instances of unconscious symbolic representation may occur much earlier—see Piaget 1945/1962, 96 and chapters 6 and 7.) By 18 months, many children show signs of tracking rather elaborate games of pretense initiated by others—for instance, being able to identify which of two dolls that have been ‘washed’ by an adult experimenter is ‘still wet’ and engaging in the requisite ‘drying’ activity (Walker-Andrews and Kahana-Kelman 1997). By 22 months, these skills become quite widespread (Harris 2000, chapter 2; Harris and Kavanaugh 1993), and by 24–28 months, most children are able to participate fully in such games—for example, pouring ‘tea’ for a stuffed cow from an empty plastic teapot, feeding a toy pig some ‘cereal’ from an empty bowl, giving a toy monkey a ‘banana’ when there are no (real) bananas in sight, and so on (Harris 1994; Harris 2000, chapter 2; Walker-Andrews and Kahana-Kelman 1997).

Around this same age (24–28 months), children show themselves readily able to generalize on the basis of others's pretend stipulations—if they are told, for instance, that a particular yellow block represents a banana and a particular red block represents a cookie, they require no further prompting to engage in a pretense where yellow blocks in general represent bananas, and red blocks in general represent cookies (Harris 2000, chapter 2 reporting Harris & Kavanaugh 1993; Walton 1990). They show themselves readily able to suspend such stipulations as soon as a new episode of pretense begins—the bricks that represent bananas or sandwiches in one game can without difficulty come to represent bars of soap or pillows in the next game. (Skolnick and Bloom 2006a, 2006b) They show themselves ready to credit imaginary objects with causal powers much like those of their real-world analogues—if Teddy eats one of the (wooden brick) bananas, he will no longer be hungry; if he is bathed in a (cardboard-box) bathtub, he will emerge wet (Harris 2000). And they are ready to describe situations from the perspective of the imaginary world—when asked to express what happened after (literally) an experimenter holds a stuffed animal in such a way that the animal's paws grip an empty plastic teapot and hold the teapot above the head of some other stuffed animal, children are happy to report the event as: ‘Teddy poured tea on Monkey's head’ or ‘Monkey's all wet—he's got tea on his head’ (cf. Harris 2000).

During the year that follows, most children develop the capacity to engage in complex coordinated games of joint pretense with others (Perner et al 1994, 264). And well before the age of four, they have figured out how to keep track of different individuals simultaneously engaging in different games of pretense—recognizing, for instance, that if you pretend the pebbles are pears and I pretend the pebbles are cherries, you will be baking a pear cake while I bake a cherry cake (Perner at al 1994, 264).

These capacities are accompanied by a parallel conscious capacity to keep track of what is pretend, and what is not. Even children as young as 15 months show few signs of what Alan Leslie has termed ‘representational abuse,’ that is, there is little indication that the child comes overtly to believe that actual-world objects have or will come to have features of the pretend objects that they serve to represent (Leslie 1987). By the age of 3, children are able to articulate explicitly a number of the differences between real and pretend—noting, for instance, that a child with a real dog will be able to see and pet the dog, whereas a child with a pretend dog will not (Estes, Wellman and Wooley 1989; Harris 2000, chapters 2 and 4; Wellman and Estes 1986; see also Bouldin and Pratt 2001 and references therein).

In recent years, there has been intense debate among psychologists concerning exactly what this capacity for pretense amounts to, in light of the fact that children of this age are (a) generally incapable of solving standard (‘Smarties-box’) false-belief tasks (though see Onishi and Baillargeon 2005); (b) fairly limited in their capacity to distinguish apparent from real identity in the case of visually deceptive objects; and (c) generally willing to attribute the behavior ‘pretending to be an X’ to an individual unaware of the existence of Xs. For further discussion, see Harris 2000, chapter 3 and the papers collected in Goswami ed. 2002; Lewis and Mitchell ed. 1994; Mitchell ed. 2003.

6.2 Imagination and Autism

Individuals with autism typically display a trio of impairments often referred to as ‘Wing's triad’: problems in social competence, communication, and imagination (Happé 1994; Wing and Gould 1979).

Imagination: Children with autism do not engage in spontaneous pretend play in the ways that typically-developing children do, engaging instead in repetitive and sometimes obsessional activities. Adults with autism often show little interest in fiction. (Carpenter, Tomasello, and Striano 2005; Happé 1994; Rogers, Cook, and Meryl 2005; Wing and Gould 1979).

Communication: Autism is often characterized by a delay or lack of development in speech, a failure to respond to the speech of others and to initiate or sustain normal conversation, a tendency towards pronoun reversal (“I” for “you”), and abnormalities in prosody and non-verbal communication.(Happé 1994).

Social Competence: Children with autism often display an inability to share and direct attention, to engage in imitation, and to recognize affect (Happé 1994). Autistic individuals often display difficulty in understanding and interpreting the mental states of others (Baron-Cohen et al. 1985) and in collaborating with others on shared intentions and goals (Tomasello et al. 2005). For these reasons, autism is often understood as involving a deficit in subjects' ‘theory of mind’ or ‘mindreading’ skill. (See section 4.1, above).

While the degree to which theory of mind enlists imaginative faculties is a matter of considerable debate, as is the matter of what autistic spectrum disorders can tell us about that debate, some have suggested that autism's characteristic deficits might provide evidence for the simulation theory of mind reading (e.g. Goldman 2006; for dissent see Carruthers 2009 and discussion therein.) More radically, Currie and Ravenscroft (2002) have suggested that autism is itself a disorder of the imagination, arguing that an inability to engage in imaginative activities could uniformly explain the constellation of Wing's deficits.

6.3 Imagination and Delusions

Delusions can be characterized, roughly, as belief-like mental representations that manifest an unusual degree of disconnectedness from reality, and cover a range of phenomena. Particularly striking examples would include Capgras and Cotard delusions. In the former, the sufferer takes her friends and family to have been replaced by imposters; in the latter, the sufferer takes himself to be dead. More mundane examples might include cases that are closer to what would typically be called self-deceit—thinking of oneself as a great friend or a great beauty, when all evidence points to the contrary.

A natural way to characterize delusions is as beliefs that are in some way dysfunctional, either in their content or formation. (For a representative collection of papers that present and criticize this perspective, see Coltheart and Davies ed. 2000). Currie and Ravenscroft (2002: 170–175), however, have argued that delusions are often disorders of the imagination. Specifically, they argue that delusions are imaginings that are misidentified by the subject as the result of an inability to keep track of the sources of one's thoughts. A delusion, on this view, is an imagined representation that is misidentified by the subject as a belief.

A different theory, but also one on which delusions and self-deceptions are the result of imagination or pretense, has been offered by Gendler (2007). In contrast to Currie and Ravenscroft, Gendler argues not that the self-deceived subject misidentifies imaginings as beliefs, but that, in certain cases, imaginings can come to play a role in one's cognitive economy similar to that typically played by beliefs. This view emphasizes the ways in which the line between imagination and belief may be difficult to discern in some cases.

Andy Egan (2008) likewise argues that delusions should be understood as ‘bimaginations’, that is, as something in between belief and imagination. Like Currie and Ravenscroft and Gendler, Egan focuses on the fact that delusions are similar in certain ways to both imaginings and to beliefs, in that, like beliefs, they guide certain aspects of a person's behavior and inferences, but, like imaginings, their range is circumscribed. (Cf. section 2.2).

Schizophrenia is a complex pathology that may involve, among its many signs and symptoms, severe delusions and hallucinations. Although the nature and causes of the disorder are a matter of controversy (see Harrison 2005 for a review of the neurological data; cf. also Frith 1992; for representative philosophical discussion, see Campbell 1999; Carruthers 2009; Gallagher 2004; Langdon, Davies and Coltheart 2002; Zahavi ed. 2000). It has been suggested by Currie (2000) and Currie and Ravenscroft (2002, 170) that schizophrenia and its attendant hallucinations might be understood as fundamentally involving a deficit in the subject's ability to distinguish between what is real and what is merely imagined.

6.4 Recent Cognitive and Social Psychological Work on Imagination

Recent empirical work on imagination and mental simulation has been focused in four main areas: (1) the relation between imagination and memory, with particular attention to the topic of “false memory”; (2) the role of imagination in the mental simulation of action and behavior; (3) the role of imagination in enabling empathy and perspective taking; and (4) the role of imagination in counterfactual reasoning, and in planning for the future.

Regarding the first (the relation between imagination and memory), a sizable literature has been devoted to the phenomenon of “imagination inflation” (Garry et al. 1996; Goff and Roediger 1998), whereby imagining an event can cause a subject to “remember” having experienced it. (For a more general discussion of intrusion errors of this kind, see Loftus 1979 and Fiedler et al. 1996). An overview of recent discussions of this topic can be found in Bernstein et al 2009.

Regarding the second (the role of imagination in the mental simulation of action and behavior), work by Jean Decety (Decety and Stevens 2009), Marc Jeannerod (Jeannerod 2006, 1997), and others suggests that simulated or imagined action “activates the same cortical structures that are responsible for motor execution” (Markman et al. 2009, viii). The implications of this overlap have been a central topic in discussions of, among others, implicit memory and learning (Kosslyn and Moulton 2009), imitation (Hurley and Chater, eds. 2005; Meltzoff and Prinz, eds. 2002), and social understanding (Decety and Stevens 2009; Goldman 2006; Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia 2008).

Regarding the third (the role of imagination in enabling empathy and perspective taking), in addition to the work just mentioned, a sizable research program has been devoted to exploring the general issue of the role played by imagination in empathy, perspective taking, and the theory of mind. An overview of some of this work can be found in the essays that appear in Markman 2009, section V.

Regarding the fourth (the role of imagination in counterfactual reasoning and planning for the future), systematic treatments have been offered of the general structures that appear to govern human counterfactual thinking; the influence of past-directed counterfactual thinking on creativity, emotion, problem-solving and motivation; and the role of simulation in planning and preparing for future contingencies. (For an overview of these issues, see the essays collected in Markman 2009, sections III and VI, and references therein.)


Other Internet Resources


For helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry, thanks are due to Paul Bloom, David Chalmers, Greg Currie, Tyler Doggett, Jonathan Ichikawa, Shaun Nichols, Zoltán Gendler Szabó, Jonathan Weinberg, Ed Zalta, and an anonymous referee for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. For research assistance, I am enormously grateful to Shen-Yi (Sam) Liao and—most especially—Aaron Norby, who for several sections was a de facto co-author. Sections 3.1, 3.2 and 6.1 draw on Gendler 2003; section 5.2 draws on Gendler 2009.

Copyright © 2011 by
Tamar Gendler <>

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