First published Mon Jul 1, 2002; substantive revision Thu Mar 28, 2024

The doctrine of divine immutability (DDI) asserts that God cannot change in accidental property. To understand the doctrine, then, we must first understand this kind of change.

1. Kinds of Change

The classical and medieval authors who developed DDI divided attributes into essential and accidental. Essential attributes are roughly those that help define the kind of thing an item is. A thing cannot exist without having its essence. So the only way to gain an essential attribute is to begin to exist, and the only way to lose one is to cease to exist. Classical/medieval authors call beginning to exist generation, not change. They call ceasing to exist corruption, not change. They restrict the term “change” to gain or loss of an accident, a non-essential attribute. Their DDS asserted that God cannot change. So it does not entail that God cannot begin or cease to exist. It asserts only that He cannot gain or lose an accident.

Accidental attributes can be had intrinsically or extrinsically. I explain these notions as follows: an item x has a property F intrinsically just if whether x is F is settled entirely by x, x’s proper parts (if any), plus the standard for being F, and has F extrinsically just if it does not have F intrinsically. A change is intrinsic just if it is a gaining or losing of a property had intrinsically. Changes which are not intrinsic are extrinsic. An attribute is intrinsic just if it can only be had intrinsically, extrinsic just if it can only be had extrinsically. For any x and y, if y is not part of x, x’s relations to y are extrinsic attributes, and so changes in these are extrinsic. Francescotti (2017) provides many other ways to parse “intrinsic.” Their differences from the one sketched here would not affect my account; those who prefer one of them can just reinterpret my tokens of “intrinsic” accordingly.

Relational properties are properties like being kicked by a horse or loved by Smith. They are clearly extrinsic. Authors from Aristotle to Duns Scotus took some relational properties as real, inhering accidents. Being shorter than Smith would qualify, but being admired by Smith would not, for reasons that need not detain us. Thus DDI ruled out not only intrinsic accidental change, but some sorts of extrinsic change- namely, change in real, inhering relational accident.

This raises a question: why do only these kinds of changes matter? DDI’s friends simply followed specific arguments, discussed below, where they seemed to lead- and they seemed to lead to denial of these sorts of divine change.

2. Immutability vs. Impassibility

DDI is sometimes conflated with the doctrine of divine impassibility, which asserts that nothing external can affect God — i.e., cause God to be in any state, and in particular to feel negative emotions like grief. Actually, DDI neither implies nor follows from divine impassibility. Something could be impassible but mutable if it could change itself, but nothing else could affect it. God could also be immutable but passible. If an event outside Him always affected God, He would always perceive it, but never change. If it caused Him grief, He would always feel it, but never change. If temporal, such a God would grieve for us before, as, and after we suffer.

There is nothing counter-intuitive in this. The God of Western theism has full foreknowledge of our futures: he sees our pain before we feel it. Were there anything about it He did not know beforehand, the foreknowledge would not be full. Full knowledge beforehand should elicit the same reaction as full knowledge during. So the God of Western theism would grieve our pain beforehand if He ever grieves it at all, and His grief before we suffer would not differ from His grief while we suffer. It is also standard Western theism that God is cognitively perfect. If he is, and exists in time, He has a past to recall, and so has perfect memory. If God perfectly remembers our pain, it is as fresh for him years later as it was while it occurred, and if he perfectly loves us, perhaps he never gets over it. So we can make sense of unchanging grief; if God does grieve, we might well expect it from a God with full foreknowledge, cognitive perfection and a perfect affective nature. If He were timeless, an immutable but passible God would timelessly suffer for us — responsively, i.e., because of our pain. Things would be just as if He were temporal, save that His knowledge would not be temporally located, and so He would not literally foreknow or remember. So whether God is temporal or timeless, DDI implies nothing odd here. And it need not “depersonalize” God, as some feel impassibility would.

Still, it is surprising that Western theists have held DDI. For Western Scriptures seem to conflict with DDI. Genesis depicts human sin as saddening God, then bringing Him to new decisions, e.g., to flood the world. According to John, “the Word became flesh” (1:14), i.e., God took on a human nature he did not always have. So Western theism’s Scriptural roots seem to deny DDI. Yet DDI entered Judaism as early as Philo, and Christianity during its second century. In such “classical theist” writers as Augustine and Aquinas, being immutable makes God atemporally eternal (see, e.g., Aquinas, ST Ia 9–10), and eternality is God’s distinctive mode of being. So DDI is at the roots of such writers’ understandings of God’s nature. And though Scotus and Ockham led a revolt against divine atemporality, they and their followers maintained DDI, and it ruled the theological roost till the 19th century. So one wonders: what made DDI so attractive for so long?

3. The Case for Immutability

For one thing, Scripture is not really so clearly on the side of divine accidental change. Much that Scripture says of God is clearly metaphor, and Old Testament texts which ascribe change to God could be speaking metaphorically. As I note later, one can parse even the Incarnation without accidental change. Standard Western theism clearly excludes many sorts of change in God. For standard Western theists, God is by nature a spirit, without body. If he is, God cannot change physically — he is physically immutable. So the Western God could at most change mentally- in knowledge, will, or affect. Further, Scripture amply supports the claim that God is always perfect in knowledge, will, and affect. This rules out many sorts of mental change. This is too broad a topic to tackle fully here; instead, let us just examine one facet of God’s knowledge.

If always perfect in knowledge, God always knows all that is past and present, and all of the future that can be foreknown. Only free beings’ future actions and what depends on these are even prima facie beyond God’s foreknowledge, and Scripture is full of claims that God foreknows free actions. If God’s knowledge is always perfect and this always includes complete foreknowledge, God always knows all “tenseless” facts. Suppose that God now knows that I will finish this article tomorrow, and tomorrow God knows that I am finishing the article. There is a fact God knows both days, that on a day referred to one day as “tomorrow” and another as “today,” I finish the article. Such facts involve no real tense. It’s the same fact whether one is before that day, on that day, or after that day. So such facts are tenseless. If God always foreknows even free creaturely acts, he always knows all tenseless facts. If He always knows them, that He knows them never changes.

It is a small step from divine perfection to necessary divine perfection. For it is surely more perfect to be unable not to be perfect than to be perfect but able not to be. Again, it is a small step from omniscience to necessary omniscience: the latter would be more perfect. If God’s knowledge is necessarily perfect, His knowledge of tenseless fact is immutable. In any possible world in which He knows a tenseless fact, He always knows it,. So it is not possible that His knowledge of it change, though if there are possible worlds in which it is not a fact, there are possible worlds in which He never knows it. Similarly, if God is necessarily omniscient, He immutably knows all necessary truths.

So God’s knowledge of necessary and of tenseless contingent truth looks to be unchangeable, given only small steps beyond Scripture. The only sort of knowledge we’ve left out so far is knowledge of tensed contingent truths — such truths as that tomorrow I will finish the article or yesterday I did finish the article. If God always knows the tenseless correlates of these truths — e.g., that on March 27, 2002, it is the case that I tenselessly-finish the article on March 28, 2002 — then the sheer passage of time accounts for all changes in His contingent knowledge. For which tensed truth God knows — that I will finish, am finishing or did finish — depends simply on what time it is. So to speak, he never has to learn about whether I finish on March 28; he merely has to learn where in time he is in relation to March 28, and this tells him what tensed propositions are true about my finishing. Thus one can make a case on what are basically Scriptural grounds that the content of God’s knowledge changes at most due to the bare passage of time.

So Scriptural considerations suggest a God unchangeable in some respects. But the roots of the full DDI are also philosophical. Western philosophers have largely filled out the concept of God by ascribing to him the properties they thought he must have to count as absolutely perfect. God’s perfection seems to rule out some sorts of change, as we’ve just seen. More general arguments from perfection convinced many that God cannot change in any way.

In Republic II (381b-c), Plato argued for the full DDI. He asserted that a god is “the… best possible” in virtue and beauty. Virtue is a perfection of mind. Beauty can be mental or non-mental. So Plato’s examples are probably meant to do duty for all mental and non-mental perfections, i.e., all perfections simpliciter. If a god is already the best possible in these respects, Plato reasoned, a god cannot change for the better. But being perfect includes being immune to change for the worse — too powerful to suffer it without permission and too good to permit it. Thus a god cannot improve or deteriorate. Plato’s argument had great historical influence. But it overlooked changes which neither better nor worsen. If one first knows that it is 11:59:59 and then knows that it is midnight, one is not better or worse for the change. If the best possible state of mind includes omniscience, then perhaps it includes constant change which neither better nor worsen God, e.g., in what precise time God knows it is. Perhaps constant omniscience requires constant change to ‘keep up with’ time. At 11:59:59 it is surely better to know that it is now 11:59:59, and then at midnight it is better to know that it is now midnight. Plato’s argument does not rule out such changes.

Aristotle also contributed to acceptance of the full DDI. For many medieval theists accepted Aristotle’s case for God’s existence. Aristotle’s Physics reasoned that if change occurs, it has a final source, an eternally unchanged changer. Aristotle’s De Caelo added that something is eternally unchanged only if unchangeable. Later theists thought the role of first cause of change too lofty not to be God’s. Writers who took Aristotle’s argument or its descendants to prove God’s existence found themselves committed to DDI.

Augustine gave a powerful impetus to Christian acceptance of DDI. As he saw it (De Trinitate V, 2), a God who gave His very name as “I am” and is perfect must be the perfect case of being. But what can change, Augustine thought, is not a perfect case of being: it does not have its being so securely that it cannot cease to be what it is.

Boethius’ Consolation of Philosophy (V, 6) also helped make DDI popular. Boethius held that being in time must involve defects, as it entails having a past and a future. If temporal lives have past parts, temporal things are no longer living them. They are deprived of their pasts. They do not yet live the future parts of their lives, and this is another sort of deprivation. Both deprivations are defects, according to Boethius. So if God is free of all defects, Boethius reasoned, God has no past or future. What has no past or future does not change. For what changes goes from what it was to what it was going to be, and so has a past and a future. Hence, to Boethius, perfection required changelessness. Necessary perfection is better than contingent perfection, and so by perfect-being reasoning is God’s. If perfection entails changelessness, necessary perfection entails being immutable.

Now Boethius’ reasoning requires at least some cleaning up. If one’s past or future have bad episodes, it is not a bad thing not to be living them. But if God is truly perfect, His life cannot contain parts it is overall bad to live. Again, we must expand Boethius’ thought about the past. For one thing, if a temporal thing is not alive, it in no sense really misses or is deprived of its past. But being non-alive is itself an inferior state of being. Further, a temporal life may have no past parts; the temporal thing might be instantaneous, or just beginning to exist. But either way, it has missed out on any previous time there was- a deprivation. Further, it is a deprivation to exist for only an instant. If there was no previous time, the temporal thing is instantaneous or beginning to exist at the first instant of time Again, being instantaneous is a deprivation. A thing beginning to exist at the first instant of time is for Boethius and Western theists a creature being newly created. Being causally dependent for existence seems to many a defect, and being a creature is an inferior status. So on this limb of the argument too, we get to an imperfection. Thus a suitable expansion of Boethius’ argument about the past may have some merit, and one can treat his thought about the future in broadly similar ways.

Boethius actually followed his reasoning about divine perfection to the conclusion that God exists outside time. For whatever has neither past nor future is not located in time. But change requires existence in time. Suppose that a turnip, aging, goes from fresh to spoiled. It also then goes from fresh to not-fresh. So first “the turnip is fresh” is true, then “it is not the case that the turnip is fresh” is true. The two cannot be true at once. So things change only if they exist at at least two distinct times. Hence, if God is necessarily atemporal — via necessary divine perfection — God is necessarily changeless, i.e., immutable.

Aquinas (like Augustine) derived DDI from the deeper classical-theist doctrine of divine simplicity (ST Ia 9). If God is simple, God has no parts of any sort. Now when a thing changes, it becomes partly different. Were this not so, no change would have occurred. But it cannot become different in every respect. For if it did, it would become different with respect to being identical with this thing. If first we have something identical with this turnip and then we have something not identical with it, the turnip has not changed, but disappeared and been replaced by something else. So whatever changes must stay partly the same (else there was not change in one selfsame surviving thing). Thus whatever can change is divisible in some way into what would stay and what would go if it changed. If so, a simple God cannot change. Moreover, classical theists- as well as such critics as Scotus and Ockham- universally understood God’s simplicity as ruling out possession of accidents. Of course, what has no accidents cannot change in accidents. Further, a simplicity which rules out accidents cannot itself be an accidental property, and must therefore be essential. Thus such simplicity dictates not just no actual accidental change but immutability. DDI’s connection with divine simplicity and the classical theist theory of God’s perfection which centers on divine simplicity is one of the deepest reasons for DDI’s broad historical appeal; one cannot fully explain what moved thinkers to accept DDI without also treating the motivation for the doctrine of divine simplicity. That, however, is too large a topic to broach here.

DDI, then, has a variety of religious and philosophical roots.

4. Arguments Against Immutability

There are many arguments against DDI. Avicenna originated one that Norman Kretzmann (1966) re-invented. We can put a version of it this way:

  1. If God is omniscient, God knows what time it is now.
  2. What time it is now is constantly changing. So
  3. What God knows is constantly changing. So
  4. God is constantly changing.

(2) assumes that in addition to such facts as that t is present at t and t+1 is present at t+1, there are facts about which time is present in an absolute sense, present simpliciter: that if it is now t, t is not just present at t, but present full stop. Some responses to (1)-(4) deny this assumption and so deny (2), e.g., Helm (1988). Also, Kretzmann and others who push the argument speak as if there is a unique universal present, but this is inessential: if due to relativity we were to say that there are different nows in different places, an omniscient God would have to know what time it is now at all of them.

Aquinas reports “ancient nominalists” as denying (3) — they claimed that what God knows is simply an event, the nativity of Christ. So as they saw it, the sentences “Christ was born” and “Christ will be born” signify the same thing, since they signify the same event (ST Ia 14, 15 ad 3), and so the objects of divine knowledge these sentences express do not differ. Aquinas objects that the differences in the sentences cause them to express different propositions, and so concedes that it is not true that whatever proposition ever expresses what God knows, always expresses what God knows. But he adds that this does not mean that God’s knowledge itself changes, because He does not know what He knows by affirming propositions (ibid.). Rather, His knowledge is a timeless intuition which shows that propositions are at one time true and another false (ibid. et De Ver. 2, 5 ad 11; for commentary see Sullivan 1991). Aquinas, then, also denies (3).

Hector-Neri Castañeda replied to Kretzmann by way of the claim that

P. If x knows that y knows that p, x knows that p (1967, 207).

(P) is plausible. If x knows that y knows that p, x knows that p is true, since knowledge entails truth. But it is at least plausible that if x knows that p is true, x knows that p. Suppose, then, that our immutable being is an atemporal God, seeing time from without. God knows that Smith, at t, knows that it is now t. God knows that Jones, at t+1, knows that it is now t+1. By (P), God atemporally knows both propositions, without having to change. Swinburne objects: a proposition does not just (say) predicate properties of an individual, but presents the individual to x a particular way, and y does not know what x does unless what y tokens to y presents that individual to y the same way what x tokens to x presents it to x (1993, 170–1). However, Swinburne may equivocate on “what y knows.” It is one thing for x and y to know the same proposition, and another, perhaps, for the proposition to have the same overall cognitive significance for x and y. A mode of presentation might affect overall significance without providing further information that might be stated in a further proposition. Still, Castañeda’s move does fail, for (P) is in fact false. If I know that God is omniscient, then for any proposition p, I know that God knows that p. But I may still not know that p. I know that God knows the date of the Second Coming. But I still do not know the day nor the hour.

Edward Wierenga (1989, 175–90) offered two replies to (1)-(4), based on differing accounts of what propositions God believes and the requirements of omniscience. On one, present-tensed sentences express propositions predicating properties of whatever time has a time-haecceity T, they and all other propositions are eternally true, and being omniscient is knowing all truths. Knowers in time have access to the time with T, and perhaps T itself, only at that time. So what changes over time is not what is true, but what temporal believers have access to. But (Wierenga notes) there is no reason to think that an atemporal believer would suffer similar access limits. (After all, plausibly it is being in time that imposes them.) So on this account, an atemporal, immutable believer timelessly knows the same truths temporal believers know only at some times. In effect, Wierenga denies that (2) implies (3): if all truths are eternally true, what is true does not change. Kvanvig 1986 makes a broadly similar move.

William Craig has argued that this move is incompatible with holding that time really passes (2001, 119–23). In a sense, Wierenga need not care. He was not aiming to show that omniscience, immutability and passage are compatible, but only that omniscience and immutability are compatible. If the conjunction of omniscience, immutability and a denial of passage is consistent, its members are pairwise consistent, for if there were a contradiction between any two conjuncts, the whole conjunction would ipso facto be inconsistent. But in any case, Craig’s charge misfires. Wierenga’s first move is compatible with real passage. It entails only that if time passes, passage is not represented by first one thing and then another being true. Passage is instead represented by something within the overall set of eternal truths- perhaps something as simple as an assertion that time passes, or even that each time, when present, is all there is to temporal reality. Passage can also appear in our story as what explains change in what we have access to and perhaps in the overall cognitive import of our belief-states. Wierenga’s view can allow that the times he speaks pass, and exist only when present. The view requires not that times be tenselessly there but that their haecceities be always and atemporally available.

On Wierenga’s second move, there is no such thing as truth simpliciter. Rather, all truth is truth at a perspective (a pair <S, t> of a person and a time). If I am sitting now but was not sitting at midnight, the second move does not say that the proposition <I am sitting> first was not true and then was. Rather, it says that <I am sitting> is true at <me, now> but false at <me, midnight>. Given this machinery, Wierenga defines omniscience this way: x is omniscient just if for all propositions p and perspectives <S, t>, if p is true at <S, t>, x knows this, and if x is at <S, t> and p is true at <S, t>, x knows that p. With these moves, it’s easy to show that atemporal (and so immutable) omniscience is possible if there can be such a thing as an atemporal perspective. If so, those pushing (1)–(4) can rule out immutable omniscience only if they can provide independent reason to think that necessarily, all perspectives are temporal. If they have that, of course, they do not need (1)–(4), because if God is temporal and persists, His perspective changes and so what He must know to be omniscient changes. Thus (1)–(4) turns out dialectically impotent and otiose.

Craig claims that recourse to truth-at-a-perspective is incompatible with real passage and a real absolute present (2004, 107). This is so, he thinks, because propositions true at t must be true simpliciter when t is the unique objective present. But why think so? Here is another view: when t is the unique objective present, all temporal perspectives that actually exist include t, truths indexed to t are true at all actually existing perspectives, but there is no such thing as truth simpliciter. Unless there is some hidden inconsistency here, passage and an absolute present do not require truth simpliciter. On Wierenga’s move, omniscience does not require that perspectives be tenselessly there. It requires that propositions about them be always and perhaps atemporally available, which one can assure by taking “t” as shorthand for “some time with haecceity T” and letting haecceities exist necessarily.

The second move works given passage and an absolute present, but has a consequence friends of these may not like. Suppose that time really passes: indeed, suppose presentism, on which only the fleeting present is real. Then first <it is now t> is true at those temporal perspectives that include t (on presentism, there are no others) and then it is false at all perspectives (on presentism, since t is now past, there are only temporal perspectives in which it is false). But at an atemporal perspective, it is never true that it is now t, for any t. There is no time it is in eternity; if there were, eternality would not be an atemporal mode of being. So at an atemporal perspective, time simply does not pass, there is nothing about passage to know, and this is why passage poses no problem for immutable omniscience. Passage is real in time, then, but not at an atemporal perspective. Requiring an atemporal being to know that it is now noon to count as omniscient is like requiring someone at midnight to know that it is now noon to count as omniscient: what is not true at one’s perspective is not knowable at one’s perspective either.

Of course, one wants to know how to make sense of the idea that passage is real only in time. Stump and Kretzmann (1981) gave a take on this while retracting Kretzmann’s original endorsement of (1)–(4). Suppose presentism. On the Stump-Kretzmann picture, each time t, when present, is “ET-simultaneous” with the life of an eternal being. So that life is ET-simultaneous with t. So all times, precisely in their presentness, are ET-simultaneous with an eternal life. In an eternal life, nothing passes. If it did, that life would have earlier and later parts: it would be temporal, not eternal. So in God’s eternal life, each time, precisely in its presentness, remains: nothing ever ceases to be ET-simultaneous with God’s life. So while times pass in time, they do not pass relative to eternity. Leftow (1991) offers a broadly similar picture, but works with a differently-defined simultaneity-relation.

Other arguments against DDI appeal to Scripture’s depiction of God as changing, e.g., in the Flood story (Genesis 6:6). Facing such texts, DDI’s friends defuse the appearance of divine change by appeal to doctrines less speculative and theoretical than DDI. Thus Philo argues from God’s foreknowledge of the future and constancy of character that God cannot repent or feel regret, as the Flood story suggests. The Incarnation is an especially knotty problem for DDI’s Christian friends. In general, these argue that all change it involved occurred in the human nature God the Son assumed rather than in God; God was eternally ready to be incarnate, and eternally had those experiences of the earthly Christ which the Incarnation makes part of his life. Through changes in Mary and the infant she bore, what was eternally in God eventually took place on earth.

Another argument against DDI appeals to God’s power. Before Creation, God could assure that no universe ever existed. God has this power now only if he can alter the past. Few think he can. So events seem to change God’s power. DDI’s defenders reply that God always has all power he ever has, but has lost a chance to use it. Because He has, we no longer want to call his power a power to prevent a universe. But He is still (they claim) as able to do it as He was.

Swinburne has argued that immutability is incompatible with acting freely, writing that an “agent is perfectly free at a certain time if his action results from his own choice at that time and if his choice is not itself brought about by anything else. Yet a person immutable in the strong sense would be unable to perform any action at a certain time other than what he had previously intended to do. His course of action being fixed by his past choices, he would not be perfectly free” (1993, p. 222). One thing to note here is that if my past choices fix my present choice, it does not follow that they bring it about. It may only follow that it is inevitable that I myself bring that choice about at that time. So it is not at all clear that immutability is incompatible even with Swinburnean perfect freedom. More importantly, Swinburne’s “perfect freedom” is a particularly demanding notion. Even if my own past choices do bring about my present choice, many libertarians would allow that my present choice is derivatively free and responsible if the past choices that brought it about were libertarian-free (see, e.g., Kane 1996, Stump 1996, Ekstrom 2000). Most theists would be quite content with a God with full libertarian freedom.

A final objection assumes that time passes, and runs this way: what is related to God changes. First God co-exists with one time’s being present, then He co-exists with another’s being present. If what is related to God changes, God changes in relational accident. One reply is to hold that God is atemporal. If He is, at His own standpoint, what is related to Him does not change. . Perhaps, then, defending DDI requires commitment to divine timelessness.


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