The doctrine of divine immutability (DDI) asserts that God cannot undergo real or intrinsic change in any respect. To understand the doctrine, then, we must first understand these kinds of change. Both “intrinsic” and “real” (in the relevant sense) are hard notions to elucidate. I cannot here attempt anything like a full account of them. I instead provide very rough characterizations, which would be acceptable on a wide variety of competing accounts of these notions.
- 1. Kinds of Change
- 2. Immutability vs. Impassibility
- 3. The Case for Immutability
- 4. Arguments Against Immutability
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
A change is real if and only if it makes on its own a real difference to the world. Real change is (roughly) change involved in causing something, change an item is caused to undergo or change not “logically parasitic” on change in other things. (These “or”s are inclusive, not exclusive — one change can satisfy more than one clause of this account.) Smith's kicking me involves changes in Smith. Kicking me makes on its own a real difference in Smith. When Smith kicks me, I undergo various changes which count as real, intuitively — being kicked makes many real differences in me. On the other hand, when I become shorter than Smith because Smith grows, Smith changes really but I do not. Gaining height makes a real difference in Smith, but Smith's gaining height doesn't make a real difference in me. Rather, my becoming shorter than Smith in this way is logically parasitic on Smith's growing. It is simply a logical consequence of a real change in something else, not a real change itself.
Coming at the notion another way, a change is real if and only if there is an absolutely or “broadly logically” possible world in which it is either the only event that occurs in an entire universe or else the sum of all events in a universe, while a change is a “logical parasite” if and only if this is not true of it. Consider Smith's kicking me. This looks like it could be the only occurrence in a universe. It is absolutely or “broadly logically” possible that the universe simply sits there wholly static, then Smith kicks me, then the universe winks out of existence before anything else happens. But actually, when we look more carefully, we see that in this case, the kick is not the only change. For it has parts which are shorter or spatially smaller changes. In the kick, for instance, Smith's leg first moves an inch, then another inch, etc., and each movement consists spatially of discrete movements by various muscles. The kick is not the only change, but in the odd universe I described, it is the sum of all changes in a universe. No change with parts can be the only change in a universe, strictly speaking. On the other hand, it is not logically possible that my becoming shorter than Smith in the way described occur alone or be a sum of all changes occurring in a universe. For it to occur, Smith's growth must also occur. And Smith's growth is not a part of it. So changes are real if and only if they are logically independent events in the world's history. If God cannot change really, then, nothing can so act on him as to change him, his actions do not change him, and no change in God could be the only event in a universe. If God cannot change really, then if had there been nothing other than God, there would have been no change at all, of any sort.
Intrinsic changes are changes like learning or expanding, which (roughly) occur entirely within the changing item — which could occur if the universe ended at the item's “skin.” Putting this more carefully, an item x has a property F intrinsically just if whether x is F is settled entirely by the states of x and x's proper parts (if any), and a change is intrinsic just if its occurring consists entirely in a thing's gaining or losing a property had intrinsically. Changes which are not intrinsic are extrinsic. All changes in relations to other things are extrinsic. For instance, if a dog moves to my left, I become a man with a dog on his left. This does not take place wholly within me; whether it occurs is not settled by my and my parts' states. It also involves the dog, who exists outside me.
Extrinsic changes aren't “real” in the sense above. I change extrinsically when a dog comes to be on my left. The dog does not so act on me at to make me have it on my left: the dog does nothing to me at all. And my becoming a man with a dog on his left could not be the only event in a universe. For it to happen, a dog must also move. But to say that extrinsic changes aren't “real” in the above sense is not to say that they don't occur. It is merely to classify them.
The classical and medieval authors who developed DDI did not operate with an explicit classification of changes. But Anselm, for instance, argues both that God is immutable and that His relations with other things can change (Monologion 25) and Aquinas does the same (ST Ia 9 and 13, 7). So as they understand DDI, it lets God change extrinsically. Suppose that at t, Quine begins to worship God. Then at t, God comes to have a new relational property, being-worshipped-by-Quine. This is clearly an extrinsic change, since its occurring in God implies the existence of someone “outside” God, namely Quine. God does not (let's say) do anything to cause this. It's a matter of Quine's free will. Quine doesn't do anything to God by worshiping him. And this change in God is a logical parasite of the real changes in Quine which constitute his beginning to worship God. It's not possible that becoming worshipped by Quine be the only change in a universe. Quine's beginning to worship must occur too if this one does. DDI thus lets God become Quine-worshipped. It rules out only real and intrinsic changes.
This raises a question: why do only real, intrinsic changes matter? It would be silly to ascribe to friends of DDI some sort of pre-given general antipathy against real, intrinsic change. Disliking such change makes as little sense as disliking universal properties- and while nominalists campaign endlessly against these, it is not because they have emotional attitudes toward them. Like nominalists, DDI's friends simply followed various specific arguments, discussed below, where they seemed to lead. And they seemed to lead to a denial that God can change really and intrinsically, but not to a denial of all divine change tout court. The arguments which led philosophers to exempt God from real, intrinsic change all had to do with ways real, intrinsic change or being capable of it might make God less perfect. It isn't plausible that extrinsic change or openness to it could make something more or less perfect. I am exactly as impressive a man with a dog on my left as I am without a dog on my left, though the dog might improve the scene including me. And I am no whit less impressive for being open to having a dog move nearby.
DDI is sometimes conflated with the doctrine of divine impassibility, which asserts that nothing external can affect God — that nothing external can cause God to be in any state, and in particular can cause him to feel negative emotions like grief. Actually, DDI neither implies nor is implied by divine impassibility. Something could be impassible but mutable if it could change itself, but nothing else could change or affect it. God could be immutable but passible. For he could be changelessly aware of events outside himself -- perhaps even caused to be aware of them by the events themselves -- and due to them changelessly feel such responsive emotions as grief. But he would feel them without change, and so always feel them. If temporal, such a God would grieve for us before, while and after we suffer what he grieves for. There is nothing counter-intuitive in this. It's standard theism to hold that God has full foreknowledge of what is to befall us: he sees our pain before we feel it, not just while we feel it, and so grieves it beforehand if He ever grieves it at all. There would be no difference in the quality of God's grief before and while the pain occurs. For were there anything about it He did not know beforehand, the foreknowledge would not be full, and full knowledge beforehand should elicit the same reaction as full knowledge during. Likewise, it's standard theism to hold that God is cognitively perfect. If he is so and exists in time, He has a past to recall and so has perfect memory. If God perfectly remembers your pain, it is as fresh for him years later as it was while it occurred, and if he perfectly loves you, perhaps he never gets over it. So we can make sense of unchanging grief; if God does grieve, we might well expect it from a God with full foreknowledge, cognitive perfection and a perfect affective nature. If He is timeless, an immutable but passible God would just timelessly suffer for us — responsively, i.e., because of our pain. The case would be just as if God were temporal, save that His knowledge would not be temporally located and so would not literally involve either foreknowledge or memory. So whether God is temporal or timeless, DDI implies nothing odd here. And it need not “depersonalize” God as some feel impassibility would.
Still, it is surprising that Western theists have held DDI. For Western Scriptures seem to conflict with DDI. Some Scriptural texts depict human sin as making God sadder than he was (e.g., Gen. 6:6), then bringing God to new decisions, e.g., to flood the world. According to John, “the Word became flesh” (1:14), i.e., God took on a human nature he did not always have. So Western theism's Scriptural roots seem to deny DDI. Yet by the first century C.E., DDI was central to the main theory of God's nature, “classical theism.” In such “classical theist” writers as Augustine and Aquinas, being immutable makes God atemporally eternal (see e.g. Aquinas, ST Ia 9–10), and eternality is God's distinctive mode of being. So DDI is at the roots of such writers' understandings of God's nature. And though Scotus and Ockham led a revolt against divine atemporality, they and their followers maintained DDI, and it ruled the theological roost till the 19th century. So one wonders: what made DDI so attractive for so long?
For one thing, the Scriptural witness is not really so clearly on the side of divine real intrinsic change. Much that Scripture says of God is clearly metaphor. And it is not hard to show that Old Testament texts which ascribe change to God could be speaking metaphorically. As I note later, one can parse even the Incarnation in ways which avoid divine real or intrinsic change. Standard Western theism clearly excludes many sorts of change in God. Western theists deny that God can begin or cease to be. If God cannot, He is immutable with respect to existence. Nothing can gain or lose an essential property, for nothing can fail to have such a property. For Western theists, God is by nature a spirit, without body. If he is, God cannot change physically — he is physically immutable. So the Western God could at most change mentally- in knowledge, will, or affect. Further, Scripture amply supports the claim that God is perfect in knowledge, will, and affect. This perfection seems to rule out many sorts of mental change.
This is a broader topic than can be tackled here; instead, let us examine a few examples involving God's knowledge. If perfect in knowledge, God is all-knowing. If God learns something new, then before learning it, he was not all-knowing. Even if the new fact could not have been foreknown, if He did not know it, He did not know all. But only free beings' future actions and what depends on these are even prima facie beyond God's foreknowledge, and Scripture is full of claims that God foreknows free actions. If God's knowledge is perfect and includes complete foreknowledge, there is a sort of fact about which God's knowledge is complete and unchanging. Suppose that today God knows that I will finish this article tomorrow and tomorrow God knows that I am finishing the article. There is a fact God knows both days, that on this particular day, referred to one day as “tomorrow” and another as “today,” I finish the article. Such facts involve no real tense: they are ‘tenseless’ facts. If God has foreknowledge even of free creaturely actions, he always knows all tenseless facts. It is a small step indeed from divine perfection to necessary divine perfection. For it is surely more perfect to be unable not to be perfect than to be perfect but able not to be. Again, it is a small step from foreknowledge to necessary foreknowledge: the latter would be more perfect. (If knowledge must be “safe,” i.e. secure against error in varying conditions, one's knowledge in one respect better if it is safer, and it is maximally safe only if it is the case that necessarily, if p, one knows that p.) If God's knowledge is necessarily perfect, His knowledge of tenseless fact is immutable. In any possible world in which He knows a tenseless fact, He always knows it, if He is necessarily omniscient. So it is not possible that His knowledge of it change, though if there are possible worlds in which it is not a fact, there are possible worlds in which He never knows it. Similarly, if God is necessarily omniscient, He immutably knows all necessary truths.
So God's knowledge of necessary truth and knowledge of tenseless contingent truth looks to be unchangeable, given only a small step beyond Scripture. We can take this a step further. The only sort of knowledge we've left out so far is knowledge of tensed contingent truths — such truths as that tomorrow I will finish the article or yesterday I did finish the article. If God always knows the tenseless correlates of these truths — e.g., that on March 27, 2002, it is the case that I tenselessly-finish the article on March 28, 2002 — then the sheer passage of time accounts for all changes in His contingent knowledge. For which tensed truth God knows — that I will finish, am finishing or did finish — depends simply on what time it is. So to speak, he never has to learn about whether I finish on March 28; he merely has to learn where in time he is in relation to March 28, and this tells him what tensed propositions are true about my finishing. Thus one can make a case on what are basically Scriptural grounds that God's knowledge changes at most due to the bare passage of time.
So Scriptural considerations suggest a God at least much less changeable than we in some respects. But the roots of the full DDI are also philosophical. In thinking out their views of God's nature, Western philosophers have largely filled out the concept of God by ascribing to him the properties they thought he must have to count as absolutely perfect. God's perfection seems to rule out many sorts of change, as we've just seen. More general arguments from perfection convinced classical theists that God cannot change in any way.
In Republic II (381b-c), Plato argued for the full DDI. He asserted that a god is “the… best possible” in virtue and beauty. Virtue is a perfection of mind. Beauty is a non-mental perfection. So Plato's examples are probably meant to do duty for all mental and non-mental perfections, i.e. all perfections simpliciter. If a god is already the best possible in these respects, Plato reasoned, a god cannot change for the better. But being perfect includes being immune to change for the worse — too powerful to have it imposed without permission and too good to permit it. Thus a god cannot improve or deteriorate. Plato's argument had great historical influence. But it overlooked the possibility of changes which neither better nor worsen. If one first knows that it is 11:59:59 and then knows that it is midnight, is one the better or the worse for it? If the best possible state of mind includes omniscience, then perhaps it includes constant change in respects which neither better nor worsen God, e.g., in what precise time God knows it is. Perhaps changes to ‘keep up with’ time are required by a constant perfection, his omniscience. At 11:59:59 it is surely better to know that it is now 11:59:59, and then at midnight it is better to know that it is now midnight. Plato's argument does not rule out such changes.
Aristotle also contributed to acceptance of the full DDI. For many medieval theists accepted Aristotle's case for God's existence. Aristotle's Physics reasoned that if change occurs, it has a final source, an eternally unchanged changer. Aristotle's De Caelo added that something is eternally unchanged only if unchangeable. Later theists thought the role of first cause of change too lofty not to be God's. Writers who took Aristotle's argument or its descendants to prove God's existence found themselves committed to DDI.
Augustine gave a powerful impetus to Christian acceptance of DDI. As he saw it (De trinitate V, 2), a God who gave His very name as “I am” and is perfect must be the perfect case of being. But what can change, Augustine thought, is not a perfect case of being: it does not have its being so securely that it cannot cease to be what it is.
Boethius' Consolation of Philosophy (V, 6) also played a role in DDI's popularity. He held that being in time must involve at least two things which are defects. For being temporal, as Boethius saw it, entailed having past and future parts of one's life. Temporal beings no longer live the past parts of their lives. They do not yet live the future parts of their lives. Both things are defects, according to Boethius. So if God is free of all defects, Boethius reasoned, then God has no past or future. What has no past or future does not change. For what changes goes from what it was to what it then was going to be, and so has a past and a future. Hence, to Boethius, perfection required changelessness. Necessary perfection — is better than contingent perfection, and so by perfect-being reasoning is God's. If perfection requires changlessness, necessary perfection requires being immutable. Now Boethius' reasoning requires at least some cleaning up. For a life could be temporal but lack past or future parts, if it was instantaneous. And if one's past or future are bad, it is not obviously a bad thing not to be living them. But perhaps Boethius' argument has some merit. For it would not be a perfection of an individual to live for only a single temporal instant. Surely longer would be better, at least if there was a good chance that the longer existence would be overall good. And if God is truly perfect, His life, cannot contain parts it is overall bad to live.
Boethius actually followed his reasoning about divine perfection to the conclusion that God exists outside time by his very nature — that God can't be temporal. For whatever has neither past nor future is not located in time. But change requires existence in time. Suppose that a turnip, aging, goes from fresh to spoiled. It also then goes from fresh to not-fresh. So first “the turnip is fresh” is true, then “it is not the case that the turnip is fresh” is true. The two cannot be true at once. So things change only if they exist at at least two distinct times. Hence, if God is necessarily atemporal — via necessary divine perfection — God is necessarily changeless, i.e. immutable. Anselm clearly picked up Augustine's and Boethius' tie between perfect being and immutability: he wrote in Monologion 28 that God alone exists in an unqualified sense and perfectly and absolutely, whereas all other things nearly do not exist at all... For because of his unchangeable eternity, it can in no way be said of (Him) because of any alteration that he existed or will exist; instead, he exists in an unqualified sense. Nor does he exist changeably, so that he is now something that at some time he was not or will not be. Nor does he fail to be now what at some other time he was or will be. Rather, whatever he is, he is once and for all, all at once, and illimitably. And since his existence is like this, he is rightly said to exist in an unqualified sense and absolutely and perfectly.
Aquinas (like Augustine) derived DDI from the deeper classical-theist doctrine of divine simplicity (ST Ia 9). If God is simple, God has no parts of any sort. Now when the turnip aged, it became partly different — its smell and texture altered. Were this not so, no change would have occurred. But if the turnip had changed in every respect, it would not have been a case of change either. For it would have changed with respect to such properties as being a turnip and being identical with this turnip. And if first we have something identical with this turnip and then we have something not identical with this turnip, the turnip has not changed, but disappeared and been replaced by something else. So whatever changes must stay partly the same (else there was not change in one selfsame surviving thing). So only things with parts or distinct aspects can change. If so, a simple God cannot change. DDI's connection with divine simplicity and the classical theist theory of God's perfection which centers on divine simplicity is one of the deepest reasons for DDI's broad historical appeal; one cannot fully explain what moved thinkers to accept DDI without also treating the motivation for the doctrine of divine simplicity. That, however, is too large a topic to broach here.
DDI, then, has a variety of religious and philosophical roots.
There are many arguments against DDI. Al-Ghazali (The Incoherence of the Philosophers, XIII) originated one that was re-invented by Norman Kretzmann (1966). We can put a version of it this way:
- If God is omniscient, God knows what time it is now.
- What time it is now is constantly changing. So
- What God knows is constantly changing. (First He knows that it is now t and not now t+1, later He knows that it is now t+1 and not now t.) So
- God is constantly changing.
(2) assumes that presentness is a metaphysically privileged status, and what events, times or states of affairs have it is constantly shifting: following current jargon, let us call views of time which hold this A-theories. Kretzmann and others who push the argument speak as if there were also a unique universal present, but this is inessential: if due to relativity we were to say that there are different nows in different places, an omniscient God would have to know what time it is now at all of them. Some responses to the argument deny this assumption: Helm (1988), for instance, suggests that all temporal truths can be expressed by wholly tenseless propositions, though he also notes that if one finds this unacceptable, he would be content with the claim that for every tensed proposition there is a tenseless one that reports the same fact.
(3) assumes that one knows that p only if one can truly token “p” to oneself. Aquinas seems to have questioned this. He reports “ancient nominalists” as dealing with (1)–(4) by denying (3) — they claimed that what God knows is simply an event, the nativity of Christ, and so the sentences “Christ was born” and “Christ will be born” signify the same thing, since they signify the same event (ST Ia 14, 15 ad 3), and therefore the objects of divine knowledge these sentences express do not differ. Aquinas objects that the differences in the sentences cause them to express different propositions, and so concedes that it is not true that whatever proposition ever expresses what God knows, always expresses what God knows. This, however, does not mean that God's knowledge itself changes, Thomas adds, because He does not know what He knows by affirming propositions (ibid.). Rather, His knowledge is a timeless intuition which shows that propositions are at one time true and another false (ibid. et De Ver. 2, 5 ad 11; for commentary see Sullivan 1991). Aquinas, then, might simply deny the tokening requirement, and so (3): he may object not to the nominalist move, but to how they get there.
Hector-Neri Castañeda replied to Kretzmann by way of the claim that
P. If x knows that y knows that p, x knows that p (1967, 207).
(P) is plausible. If x knows that y knows that p, x knows that p is true, since knowledge entails truth. But plausibly, if x knows that p is true, x knows that p. Suppose, then, that our immutable being is an atemporal God, seeing time from without. God knows that Smith, at t, knows that it is now t. God knows that Jones, at t+1, knows that it is now t+1. By (P), God atemporally knows both propositions, without having to change — though if we impose the tokening requirement, we have to add that He can token them to Himself only through other sentences than “it is now t” and “it is now t+1”: for an atemporal being cannot truly token either. Swinburne objects: (P) does not just (say) predicate properties of an individual, but presents the individual to x a particular way, and y does not know what x does unless what y tokens to y presents that individual to y the same way what x tokens to x presents it to x (1993, 170–1). However, this reply may equivocate on “what y knows.” It is one thing for x and y to know the same proposition, and another, perhaps, for the proposition to have the same overall cognitive significance for x and y. A mode of presentation might affect overall significance without providing further information that might be stated in a further proposition. Still, (P) is in fact false. If God tells me that He knows the date of the Second Coming, I know that God knows it: He cannot lie, and I know that He is omniscient anyway. But I still do not know the day nor the hour.
Edward Wierenga (1989, 175–90) offered two replies to the argument, based on differing accounts of what propositions are believed and the requirements of omniscience. On the first, an omniscient being would know all truths, propositions expressed by present-tensed sentences predicate properties of whatever time has a time-haecceity T, but they and all other propositions are eternally true. Knowers in time have access to the time with T, and perhaps T itself, only at that time: so what changes over time is not what is true, but what temporal believers have access to. But (Wierenga notes) there is no reason to think that an atemporal believer would suffer similar access limits. (After all, plausibly it is being in time that imposes them.) So on this account there is no bar to holding that an atemporal believer timelessly knows the same truths temporal believers know only at some times. In effect, Wierenga denies that (2) implies (3): if all truths are eternally true, what is true does not change. Kvanvig 1986 had made a broadly similar move.
William Craig has argued that this move is incompatible with an A-theory of time (2001, 119–23). In a sense Wierenga need not care. He was not aiming to show that omniscience, immutability and an A-theory are compatible, but only that omniscience and immutability are compatible. If the conjunction of omniscience, immutability and a B-theory is consistent, its members are pairwise consistent, for if there were a contradiction between any two conjuncts, the whole conjunction would ipso facto be inconsistent. But in any case, Craig's charge misfires. This first move is compatible with real passage. The first move entails only that if time passes, passage is not represented by first one thing and then another being true. Passage is instead represented by something within the overall set of eternal truths- perhaps something as simple as an assertion that time passes, or even that each time, when present, is all there is to temporal reality. Passage can also appear in our story as what explains change in what we have access to and perhaps in the overall cognitive import of our belief-states. Wierenga's view can allow that the times he speaks of are A-theoretic, existing only when present. The view requires not that times be tenselessly there but that their haecceities be always and atemporally available.
On Wierenga's second move, there is no such thing as truth simpliciter. Rather, all truth is truth at a perspective (a pair <S, t> of a person and a time). If I am sitting now but was not sitting at midnight, the second move does not say that the proposition <I am sitting> first was not true and then was. Rather, it says that <I am sitting> is true at <me, now> but was false at <me, midnight>. Given this machinery, Wierenga defines omniscience this way: x is omniscient just if for all propositions p and perspectives <S, t>, if p is true at <S, t>, x knows this, and if x is at <S, t> and p is true at <S, t>, x knows that p. With these moves, it's easy to show that atemporal (and so immutable) omniscience is possible if there can be such a thing as an atemporal perspective. If so, those pushing (1)–(4) can rule out immutable omniscience only if they can provide independent reason to think that necessarily, all perspectives are temporal. If they have that, of course, they do not need (1)–(4), because if God is temporal and persists, His perspective changes and so what He must know to be omniscient changes. Thus (1)–(4) turns out dialectically impotent and otiose.
Craig claims that recourse to truth-at-a-perspective is incompatible with an A-theory (2004, 107). This is so, he thinks, because propositions true at t must be true simpliciter when t is the unique objective present. But why think so? Here is another A-theoretic view: when t is the unique objective present, all temporal perspectives that actually exist include t, truths indexed to t are true at all actually existing perspectives, but there is no such thing as truth simpliciter. Unless there is some hidden inconsistency here, A-theories do not require truth simpliciter. Craig claims that Wierenga's second move too is incompatible with an A-theory (2001, 2004). But on this move, omniscience does not require that perspectives be tenselessly there. It requires that propositions about them be always and perhaps atemporally available, which one can assure by taking “t” as shorthand for “some time with haecceity T” and letting haecceities exist necessarily.
The second move works given an A-theory, but has a consequence A-theorists may not like. Suppose that time really passes: indeed, suppose presentism, on which only the fleeting present is real. Then first <it is now t> is true at those temporal perspectives that include t (on presentism, there are no others) and then it is false at all perspectives (on presentism, since t is now past, there are only temporal perspectives in which it is false). But at an atemporal perspective, it is never true that it is now t, for any t. There is no time it is in eternity; if there were, eternality would not be an atemporal mode of being. So at an atemporal perspective, time simply does not pass, there is nothing about passage to know, and this is why passage poses no problem for immutable omniscience. Passage is real in time, then, but not at an atemporal perspective. Requiring an atemporal being to know that it is now noon to count as omniscient is like requiring someone at midnight to know that it is now noon to count as omniscient: what is not true at one's perspective is not knowable then either.
Of course, one wants to know how to make sense of the idea that passage is real only in time. Stump and Kretzmann (1981) gave a take on this while retracting Kretzmann's original commitment to (1)–(4). Suppose presentism. On the Stump-Kretzmann picture, each time t, when present, is “ET-simultaneous” with the life of an eternal being. So that life is ET-simultaneous with t. So all times, precisely in their presentness, are just ET-simultaneous with an eternal life. But in an eternal life, nothing passes. If it did, that life would have earlier and later parts: it would be temporal, not eternal. So in God's eternal life, each time, precisely in its presentness, remains: nothing ever ceases to be ET-simultaneous with God's life, for that would entail an earlier and a later simultaneous to God's life, and so in God's life. So while times pass in time, they do not pass relative to eternity. Leftow (1991) offers a broadly similar picture, but works with a differently-defined simultaneity-relation.
Kretzmann's argument is simply that an omniscient being must be “subject to change” (1966, 410): he does not sort changes as intrinsic and extrinsic. One of his examples of change induced by a change in what is known is clearly an extrinsic change (1966, 411).
So one reply is that knowing the correct time is not an intrinsic state of God's, and so change with respect to it would not contradict DDI. Intrinsic states are those settled entirely within one's own skin. But then unless p is a truth entirely about matters within one's own skin, knowing that p is not an intrinsic state. For that one knows that p rather than believes falsely that p only if p is true, and if p is not a truth entirely about matters within one's own skin, whether p is true is at least partly settled by matters outside one's own skin. But when it is now is not a matter settled within God's own skin. What time it is now is not a fact about God alone. It is a fact about time, which is not God, and also about the entire temporal universe. Further, it arguably is not the case even that what is within God's skin settles what time it is in the sense that were nothing else than God to exist, facts about God would suffice to determine what time it is. For this would be at best a contentious claim, as it implies that God would be in time if he existed alone, without a universe. Many would say that time is an aspect of the physical universe — no universe, no time either. Moreover, even if God existed alone and were then in time, knowing what time it is would not be a temporally intrinsic matter. God knows that it is now t just at t. So knowing the correct time at t is temporally intrinsic only if it does not entail the existence or occurrence of anything that exists at other times. But for any time after the first instant (if there was one), knowing what time it is involves knowing the temporal distance between the present time and some other time: knowing that it is noon, April 16, 2002, implies knowing a relation between that time and date and the date traditionally assigned to the birth of Christ. Thus knowing what time it is entails knowing that there was some time other than the present — a time outside the period in which God knows that it is now this time. Knowing what time it is at any time after the first instant thus is not a temporally intrinsic state. And if this is so, it is hard to see why even knowledge that it is time's first instant would be. Thus the objection has a false premise. If God's cognitive state with respect to what time it is changed, it would not follow from this that he is not intrinsically immutable. This result may seem a bit hard to swallow. One wants to know how a change in knowledge could fail to be an intrinsic change. One answer might appeal to externalist theories of mental content. On these, my knowledge that p is a complex consisting of my inner mental state plus certain items in the world. Perhaps God's knowledge that it is now t is something like a complex consisting of God's inner cognitive state and an external component, t. If it is, perhaps the only change involved when God first knows that it is now t and then knows that it is now t* (> t) is the change from t to t*.
Other arguments against DDI appeal to Scripture's depiction of God as changing, e.g., in the Flood story. Facing such texts, DDI's friends defuse the appearance of divine change by appeal to doctrines less speculative and theoretical than DDI. Thus Philo argues from God's foreknowledge of the future and constancy of character that God cannot repent or feel regret, as the Flood story suggests. The Incarnation is an especially knotty problem for DDI's Christian friends. In general, these argue that all change it involved occurred in the human nature God the Son assumed rather than in God; God was eternally ready to be incarnate, and eternally had those experiences of the earthly Christ which the Incarnation makes part of his life. Through changes in Mary and the infant she bore, what was eternally in God eventually took place on earth.
Another argument against DDI appeals to God's power. Before Creation, God could assure that no universe ever existed. God has this power now only if he can alter the past. Few think he can. So events seem to change God's power. DDI's defenders reply that any change here is purely extrinsic. God has the power he always has. He has lost a chance to use it, and so we no longer want to call his power a power to prevent a universe. But God is intrinsically as able as ever to do so.
Swinburne has argued that immutability is incompatible with acting freely, writing that an “agent is perfectly free at a certain time if his action results from his own choice at that time and if his choice is not itself brought about by anything else. Yet a person immutable in the strong sense would be unable to perform any action at a certain time other than what he had previously intended to do. His course of action being fixed by his past choices, he would not be perfectly free” (1993, p. 222). One thing to note here is that if my past choices fix my present choice, it does not follow that they bring it about. It may only follow that it is inevitable that I myself bring that choice about at that time. So it is not at all clear that immutability is incompatible even with Swinburnean perfect freedom. More importantly, Swinburne's “perfect freedom” is a particularly demanding notion. Even if my own past choices do bring about my present choice, many libertarians would allow that my present choice is derivatively free and responsible if the past choices that brought it about were libertarian-free (see e.g. Kane 1996, Stump 1996, Ekstrom 2000). Most theists would be quite content with a God with full libertarian freedom.
A final objection goes thus: God does change extrinsically. Even full DDI grants this. But whatever changes extrinsically is in time. For different things are true of it at different times, even if the ‘real’ changes due to which this is so are in other things. And whatever is in time changes intrinsically — it grows older. So DDI is false. Some would reply by denying that growing older is an intrinsic change. A more controversial response might be to deny even extrinsic change to God. This can be done by holding that God is atemporal. For if God exists at t and at a later t*, and, at t, p is true of him and, at t*, p is false of him, he does change extrinsically. He bears different relations to proposition p, at least. If God is atemporal, he exists neither at t nor at t* — his existence is not temporally located. If this is so, there are never two times such that different things are true of him at different times. Rather, all that is ever true of him is true of him timelessly. But a thing changes, even extrinsically, only if different things are true of it at different times. Perhaps, then, defending DDI requires commitment to divine timelessness.
- Aristotle, De Caelo (De Cael.), trans. R. Hardie and R. Gaye, in The Basic Works of Aristotle, ed. Richard McKeon, NY: Random House, 1941.
- Aristotle, Physics (Phys.), tr. J. Stocks, in The Basic Works of Aristotle, ed. Richard McKeon, NY: Random House, 1941.
- Boethius, The Consolation of Philosophy, trans. H. Stewart, in Boethius: The Theological Tractates, trans. H. Stewart and E. K. Rand, Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press, 1936.
- Brown, Robert F., 1991, “Divine Omniscience, Immutability, Aseity, and Human Free Will,” Religious Studies: An International Journal for the Philosophy of Religion, 27: 285–295.
- Castañeda, Hector-Neri, 1967, “Omniscience and Indexical Reference,” Journal of Philosophy, 64: 203–210.
- Craig, William L., 2001, God, Time and Eternity, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- –––, 2004, “Wierenga No A-Theorist Either,” Faith and Philosophy, 21: 105–109.
- Cumming, David, 2003, “Descartes on the Immutability of the Divine Will,” Religious Studies: An International Journal for the Philosophy of Religion, 39 (1): 79–92.
- Ekstrom, Laura, 2000, Free Will, Boulder: Westview.
- Gale, Richard, 1986, “Omniscience-Immutability Arguments,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 23: 319–35.
- Hallman, Joseph, 1981, “The Mutability of God: Tertullian to Lactantius,” Theological Studies, 42: 373–93.
- Hartshorne, Charles, 1948, The Divine Relativity, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Helm, Paul, 1988, Eternal God, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Kane, Robert, 1996, The Significance of Free Will, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kaufman, Dan, 2005, “God's Immutability and the Necessity of Descartes's Eternal Truths”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43: 1–19.
- Kretzmann, Norman, 1966, “Omniscience and Immutability,” Journal of Philosophy, 63: 409–421.
- Kretzmann, Norman, and Eleonore Stump, 1981, “Eternity,” Journal of Philosophy, 78: 429–458.
- Kvanvig, Jonathan, 1986, The Possibility of an All-Knowing God, New York: St. Martin's Press.
- Leftow, Brian, 1991, Time and Eternity, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- Mann, William, 1987, “Immutability and Predication,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 22: 21–39.
- –––, 1983, “Simplicity and Immutability in God”, International Philosophical Quarterly, 23: 267–276.
- McHugh, Christopher, 2003, “A Refutation of Gale's Creation-Immutability Arguments,” Philo, 6: 5-9.
- Philo, On the Unchangeableness of God, trans. F. Colson and G. Whitaker, in Philo, trans. F. Colson and G. Whitaker, Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library (Volume 3), Harvard University press, 1960.
- Plato, Phaedo, trans. G. Grube, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1977.
- Plato, Republic, trans. G. Grube and C. Reeve, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1992.
- Sorabji, Richard, 1983, Time, Creation and the Continuum, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- Stump, Eleonore, 1996, “Libertarian Freedom and the Principle of Alternative Possibilities,” in Jeff Jordan & Daniel Howard-Snyder (eds.), Faith, Freedom, and Rationality, Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Sullivan, Thomas D., 1991, “Omniscience, Immutability, and the Divine Mode of Knowing,” Faith and Philosophy, 8: 21–35.
- Swinburne, Richard, 1993, The Coherence of Theism, rev. ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Wierenga, Edward, 1989, The Nature of God, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
[Please contact the author with suggestions.]