Thomas Aquinas

First published Wed Dec 7, 2022

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Robert Pasnau replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

Between antiquity and modernity stands Thomas Aquinas (ca. 1225–1274). The greatest figure of thirteenth-century Europe in the two preeminent sciences of the era, philosophy and theology, he epitomizes the scholastic method of the newly founded universities. Like Dante or Michelangelo, Aquinas takes inspiration from antiquity, especially Aristotle, and builds something entirely new. Viewed through a theological lens, Aquinas has often been seen as the summit of the Christian tradition that runs back to Augustine and the early Church. Viewed as a philosopher, he is a foundational figure of modern thought. His efforts at a systematic reworking of Aristotelianism reshaped Western philosophy and provoked countless elaborations and disputations among later medieval and modern philosophers.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

Thomas Aquinas was born near Aquino, halfway between Rome and Naples, around the year 1225. He was the youngest of at least nine children, and born into a wealthy family that presided over a prominent castle in Roccasecca. As a teenage student in Naples, he fell under the sway of the Dominicans, a newly founded order of priests devoted to preaching and learning. Joining the order at the age of nineteen, he was assigned to Paris for further study, but his plans were delayed by the intransigency of his parents, who had hoped he would play a leading role at the venerable local monastery, Monte Cassino, where he had studied as a child. After confining him to Roccasecca for a year, his parents yielded and Thomas went to Paris as a Dominican friar.

Thomas spent three years in Paris, studying philosophy, and then was sent to Cologne, in 1248, under the supervision of Albert the Great. This older Dominican proved to be the ideal mentor. Albert was at the time the leading figure in the newly prominent program of melding Christian theology with Greek and Arabic philosophy. He possessed an encyclopedic grasp of the sciences of the day, which had been expanding at a dizzying pace thanks to the new availability of the Aristotelian corpus in Latin translation. It was Albert’s firm conviction, which became Aquinas’s own, that the Christian faith could only benefit from a profound engagement with philosophy and science.

Thomas evidently flourished under Albert’s influence, for when Albert was asked in 1252 to nominate a student to pursue an advanced degree in theology at the University of Paris, he chose Thomas, even though he was still two years younger than the minimum required age. After four years as a bachelor of theology, lecturing on the Bible and on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, Aquinas received his doctorate and was immediately appointed master of theology, once again at an earlier age than the statutes officially allowed. From 1256 until 1259, he held the Dominican chair of theology in Paris, preaching, lecturing on the Bible, and presiding over various philosophical and theological disputations.

Although some masters at the University of Paris spent decades teaching there, it was the custom of the Dominican order (as with the Franciscans) to rotate scholars through these positions. Accordingly, in 1259 Aquinas was sent back to Italy, where he spent most of the following decade in several Dominican houses of study, first in Orvieto (in Umbria) and then in Rome. During these years, while he continued to preach, lecture on the Bible, and conduct academic disputations, he found the time to develop his two most important works, the Summa contra gentiles and the Summa theologiae.

In 1268, Aquinas was asked to return to Paris for an unusual second term as master of theology. Here he put his now venerable reputation to work in attempting to steer the philosophical conversation away from various extreme positions that were dividing scholars. He wrote a brief treatise arguing for a middle ground on the vexed question of whether the world could be proved to be eternal or created in time (§3), and a somewhat longer treatise against the view that all human beings share a single intellect (§6.2). These years were dominated, though, by his efforts to complete the Summa theologiae and at the same time write commentaries on all of Aristotle’s principal works. When his second four-year term in Paris came to an end he returned to Italy, this time to Naples, in 1272. During these final years he nearly, but not quite, finished both the Summa theologiae and his commentary series. Instead, after a year and a half in Naples, he stopped writing, famously explaining that “All that I have written seems to me like straw compared with what has now been revealed to me.” A few months after that he died, in the Cistercian abbey of Fossanova, on March 7, 1274.

This chronology of Aquinas’s life is fairly well attested. There are also many colorful stories about his life, many of which stem from testimony given during his canonization inquiry in 1319. The authenticity of these stories is unknowable. Aquinas himself, in his writings, reveals almost nothing about his personal life. (For biography see Porro 2012 [2016]; Torrell 1993 [2022]; Legge 2022.)

1.2 Works

Over a mere two decades of literary activity, Aquinas left behind more than eight million words (eight times more than has survived, for instance, from Aristotle). It is a measure of Aquinas’s immediate and lasting influence that—quite unlike the situation with other medieval philosophers—essentially everything he wrote has survived and has been lovingly edited and translated into English and many other modern languages. In outline, there are five categories of works:

  • encyclopedic theological treatises, such as the Summa theologiae and the Summa contra gentiles;
  • disputed questions, such as the Questions on Truth, often more detailed than his summae;
  • brief works (opuscula), such as On Being and Essence;
  • commentaries on Aristotle and on other philosophical texts;
  • biblical commentaries.

The bibliography below contains further details about individual works and their chronology.

The Summa theologiae (ST) generally represents Aquinas’s most considered thought on a given topic, and the work is comprehensive enough that it contains at least some discussion of almost all of Aquinas’s intellectual concerns. It divides into four parts:

  • the prima pars (1a): the nature of God and the created world, including human nature;
  • the prima secundae (1a2ae): human action and what shapes it (passion, virtue, vice, law, grace);
  • the secunda secundae (2a2ae): the theological and philosophical virtues, in detail;
  • the tertia pars (3a): Christ and the sacraments (complete through q. 90; his disciples drew on earlier texts to produce a “supplement” that brings the work to its intended end).

The treatments in ST are deliberately brief. Aquinas writes in the preface that “our intent in this work is to develop those issues that concern the Christian religion in a way that suits the education of those who are just beginning.” Today, no one thinks of ST as a work for beginners, although its scope and concision make it a useful place to start. A serious engagement with Aquinas’s work, however, requires comparing ST with parallel treatments elsewhere, such as the earlier Summa contra gentiles (SCG) and the still earlier commentary on Lombard’s Sentences. Moreover, since all three of these long works are written as theological treatises, it is useful also to compare these discussions with his accounts in the more philosophically focused and often more detailed disputed questions. In general, given how much Aquinas wrote and how often he reconsidered the same issue from a slightly different perspective, a careful study of his work requires comparing multiple treatments of the same issue. And since he did not begin to circulate his work until he was 30, and lived for only two decades more, those various treatments tend to reinforce rather than conflict with each other. (Naturally, scholars have long debated whether his thought evolves on one topic or another, on which see Pini 2012.)

Most of Aquinas’s central texts are written in the distinctive scholastic style of the disputed question, in which the topic to be discussed is posed at the start as a question. The dispute begins with a series of arguments on one side. These, however, almost always represent the opposite of Aquinas’s own position, and so, after the initial arguments, one or more arguments are posed to the contrary (sed contra), and then Aquinas makes his own main reply in the body (corpus) of the article, and finally he responds to the initial arguments (ad 1, ad 2, etc.). This structure is based on actual classroom procedures, even if Aquinas’s carefully composed works are never a literal record of an actual classroom debate. It is a method that lends itself to argumentative rigor, but often is best digested by reading the text in something other than the order in which it appears on the page. (I myself like to begin with the main reply.)

An important exception to the disputed-question format is Aquinas’s commentaries. These are often extremely useful for understanding his own philosophical thought. This is true most obviously of the philosophical commentaries, which cover most of Aristotle’s key works. The point holds true, however, for his biblical commentaries as well, because they regularly contain interesting discussions of wide-ranging philosophical topics (Stump 2010). One has to approach all of Aquinas’s commentaries with some caution, however, because his principal method of commentary is to produce a word-by-word paraphrase. This means that, if one does not read these works with one eye on the text being commented upon, a passage that may seem to represent Aquinas’s thought may instead be a rephrased version of what Aristotle (or Isaiah or Paul) said. Whether or not Aquinas’s paraphrase of a passage from Aristotle should be treated as a reflection of Aquinas’s own thought is a matter of some dispute (Jenkins 1996; Elders 2009), but readers should at least be aware of how these commentaries are structured. The passages most likely to shed light on Aquinas’s own thought are those where he breaks away from his line-by-line paraphrase to offer a brief lecture on some issue germane to a proper understanding of the underlying text.

It is tempting, for modern readers, to divide Aquinas’s work into the theological and philosophical, but lines here are difficult to draw. The medieval university did formally distinguish between the higher-level discipline of theology and the undergraduate arts faculty, whose curriculum consisted largely in the works of Aristotle. But many of the questions of the theologians—such as the workings of intellect, the nature of freedom, the systematization of ethical theory—are now seen as paradigmatically philosophical. At the same time, much of Aristotle, and therefore much of the arts faculty curriculum, looks to us more scientific than philosophical. Aquinas, unlike his teacher Albert the Great, only occasionally dwelled on what we now think of as scientific questions. Conversely, as a professor of theology, he considered at great length various matters that depend on divine revelation, such as the nature of the Trinity and the character of Christ’s humanity. A complete understanding of Aquinas’s thought thus requires spending considerable time with such properly theological questions. At the same time, it is appropriate today to number Aquinas among the philosophers, because he was particularly interested in and had particularly innovative things to say about what we now think of as philosophical questions. The tremendous energy he put into commenting on Aristotle’s works is a testimony both to the importance he gives philosophy for a proper understanding of theology, and to his confidence that progress in philosophy will only benefit the Christian faith. As he famously wrote, “if anything is found in the words of the philosophers that is contrary to the faith, this is not philosophy but rather an abuse of philosophy, due to a failure of reason” (Comm. Boethius De trinitate 2.3c).

For book-length general surveys of Aquinas's thought see Stump 2003, Davies and Stump 2012, Shields and Pasnau 2016, Stump and White 2022.

2. God

Aquinas believes that natural reason can demonstratively prove God’s existence. The first step is to show that, for everything in the changeable world around us, there is a first cause, or prime mover, in virtue of which all other things have their existence, their motion, their qualities and direction. This is the result he gets in his much discussed “five ways” of proving God’s existence (ST 1a 2.3c). Aquinas denies that Anselm’s ontological argument has any force as a proof (ST 1a 2.1 ad 2; SCG I.10–11). Instead, the first three ways are cosmological arguments, based on the impossibility of an infinite series of causes. Commentators generally agree that what Aquinas means to exclude is an infinite series of simultaneous causes, a “vertical” series as opposed to an infinite “horizontal” series of causes going back in time, which he does not think can be proved to be impossible (§3). Each of the five brief arguments ends with a variation on the formula “this is what everyone calls God.” He puts his claim cautiously at this point, because to demonstrate the existence of a prime mover falls well short of demonstrating the existence of a being worthy of being called God. For all we have seen so far, for instance, this first cause might itself be a body. But Aquinas thinks natural reason—what we now call natural theology—can go well beyond the five ways. ST 1a goes on to establish that this first cause is not a body (3.1), nor composite in any way and hence entirely simple (3.7), perfect in every respect (4.2), the highest good (6.2), infinite (7.1), omnipresent (8.2), completely unchangeable (9.1), eternal (10.2), supremely one (11.4), and possessing the most perfect knowledge (14.1). These results establish the existence of something worthy of being called God. (On Aquinas’s natural theology in general see Kretzmann 1997; Wippel 2000 chs. 10–13; Stump 2003 pt. I. On the five ways see Kenny 1969; MacDonald 1991a; Martin 1997; Pawl 2012; Cohoe 2013.)

The successes of natural theology, for Aquinas, have their limit. For although natural reason can establish the existence of a perfect being, it is incapable of establishing many of the features that distinctively characterize the Christian God, such as God’s triune nature and God’s incarnation as a human being. Here is a place where philosophy alone, unaided by revelation, fails to yield an adequate theology. Since the ultimate goal of human life, salvation in the life to come (§8.1), requires some grasp of these Christian truths, “it was necessary for the sake of human salvation that certain truths that surpass human reason be made known to us through divine revelation” (ST 1a 1.1). The study of revealed theology is important, moreover, not only with respect to these so-called mysteries of the faith, but also in cases where the results of natural reason are too precarious to be counted on. Without direct access through revelation, “the truth about God investigated by reason would be available only to a few people, after a long time, and with the admixture of many errors.” Accordingly, “beyond the philosophical disciplines investigated by human reason, it was necessary to have a sacred teaching through revelation” (ibid.). This sacred teaching (sacra doctrina) is the work of theology.

One of the most difficult and most discussed issues in Aquinas’s natural theology is the limits he places on our ability to understand God’s nature. A sign of the difficulties to come emerges just after he sets out his initial five-way proof, when he remarks,

Once it is grasped that something exists, it remains to be investigated how it exists, in order that what it is may be known. But because it is not possible for us to know what God is, but rather what God is not, we cannot consider how God exists, but rather how God does not exist. (ST 1a 3pr; see Davies 2018)

That Aquinas in fact honors this constraint is far from obvious, given the seemingly positive claims he makes regarding the divine nature. To understand his approach one must come to grips with his theory of analogical predication. In a case like God’s goodness, for instance, Aquinas does not mean only to deny God’s badness. It can be truly said, he thinks, that God is good. The difficulty is that the word ‘good,’ when truly applied to God, has a different sense from what it has in cases familiar to our own experience. The two senses are thus not univocal, but nor are they purely equivocal, as if God’s goodness were wholly unrelated to the goodness we experience. Instead, the usages are analogical (ST 1a 13.5). So, “when we say God is good, the sense is not that God is the cause of goodness or that God is not bad; rather, the sense is that what we call good in creatures preexists in God, albeit in a higher mode” (ST 1a 13.2c). We can say with confidence, on the basis of this analysis, that God is good, indeed preeminently so. To the extent that we are good, it is so only by participation in God’s goodness. But our cognitive limitations preclude a more adequate account of this “higher mode” in which God is good. (On analogy in Aquinas see McInerny 1996; Montagnes 1963 [2004]; Dewan 2007; Ashworth 2014; Hochschild 2019.)

3. The Created World

The mainstream of philosophical tradition as Aquinas knew it, running from Aristotle through the Greek commentators and into the Arabic tradition, held that the material world, and all the kinds of living things in it, had always existed. These earlier Aristotelians still thought there was a place for God, as the first mover, but they understood God to be the initial, remote source of motions that had always existed, rather than an eternal being who created the universe anew. Aquinas understood Christianity to be committed to the latter view. He holds that the changeable universe around us has existed for only a finite amount of time; that God, in contrast, has existed eternally and unchangingly; and that God freely chose to create the changeable universe from nothing (ex nihilo). To bring a thing into existence ex nihilo is the defining feature of creation, in the strict sense of that term, and only God can do it (ST 1a 45). Everything else in the natural world causes new things to come into existence by modifying what is here already. The proper terminology for these natural changes is generation and corruption, which refer to a substance’s coming into or going out of existence by natural means, and alteration, which refers to a substance’s undergoing accidental change: continuing to exist through change to its shape, color, and other non-essential properties.

Aristotle and many of his followers believed they could prove that the world had always existed. Conversely, many of Aquinas’s contemporaries thought they could prove the opposite, that the world had to have a beginning in time, and the debate between these rival philosophical accounts was one of the most acrimonious issues in the early medieval university (Dales 1990). Aquinas took up the question in detail in his treatise On the Eternity of the World, concluding that no demonstrative argument is possible either way. For all we can tell, God could have created the world in such a way that it had always existed. That we think otherwise is another deliverance of the faith, not susceptible to philosophical proof. This measured conclusion is characteristic of his thought in many domains. On the one hand, he has complete confidence that philosophical reasoning, properly pursued, will not yield results that are a threat to Christianity. On the other hand, he thinks it discredits the faith to defend it through dubious attempts at demonstration. The key is to see where philosophy can be of service, and where it must give way to revealed doctrine (Wippel 1995c; Kretzmann 1999 ch. 5).

It is not easy to think about God’s relationship to the created world, because without such a world there can be neither space nor time (ST 1a 46.1, 46.3). Not space, because space is nothing more than the existence of bodies, where bodies are beings that possess parts outside of parts, and so constitute the three-dimensional extension that we think of as space. Accordingly, where there are no bodies there is no space. (Aquinas, following Aristotle, denies that void space is coherent.) Not time, because Aquinas accepts Aristotle’s definition of time as the measure of motion. In a world without motion, then, there is no time, which means that the first moment of time was the first moment of the created world. Although it is hard to resist thinking of God as having existed “before” there was a material universe, God’s mode of existence, in a world without bodies, must be an existence outside of space and time. This need not entail, however, that God even now exists outside of space and time. God’s omnipresence was commonly understood as a literal presence everywhere (Pasnau 2011 ch. 16), and Aquinas characterizes God’s eternity not as a mode of existence outside of time, but as “being present to every time or instant of time” (SCG I.66.8). It is, however, far from clear what “present” amounts to in such a claim (Leftow 1990). These difficulties are of a piece with the general difficulty we have in thinking about God using the concepts familiar to us from the world around us.

However these metaphysical issues are resolved, it is clear that God is constantly, everywhere engaged with the world. Because “a thing’s existence cannot remain after the cessation of the action of the agent causing the effect” (ST 1a 104.1c), the created world must have not just an initial creative cause but also an ongoing cause that conserves it from moment to moment. Since God is necessarily perfect, the created world cannot be beneficial for God, and since a universe with a perfect being is itself already perfect, God’s goodness does not necessitate his creating anything at all. Moreover, since for everything God creates he could create something better (ST 1a 25.6c), there is no sense to be made of the idea of a best of all possible worlds. Accordingly, God is free to create otherwise than he did, and free even not to create anything at all: “Since God’s goodness is perfect, and he can exist without other things, … it follows that there is no absolute necessity that he will things other than himself” (ST 1a 19.3c). Still, creation has a purpose: God “intends only to share his perfection, which is his goodness” (ST 1a 44.4c). Among creatures, those beings who possess intellects—angels and human beings—are preeminent, in virtue of their capacity to love and understand their creator. Accordingly, the rest of creation is organized for their sake (SCG III.112). Ultimately, however, the purpose of the created world is to reflect God’s goodness and glory: “the whole universe, with its individual parts, is ordered to God as its end, inasmuch as, by a kind of imitation, the universe represents divine goodness for the glory of God” (ST 1a 65.2c). So it is that Aquinas takes everything in the created world to be subject to God’s providential order (§7). (For a broad study of Aquinas on creation see Kretzmann 1999.)

4. Form and Matter

Given the preeminence of intellectual beings in the created order, it should be no surprise that most of God’s creative efforts went into their establishment. This is, primarily, the domain of the angels, who “exceed in number, incomparably, material substances” (ST 1a 50.3c). The angels are wholly immaterial beings, which makes them unlike us (§5) and unlike the created world with which we are directly acquainted, which is a material world. So, if we set aside the realm of immaterial minds—God, angels, the human soul—we are left with a world of material objects, suitable to be understood in terms of an Aristotelian hylomorphic (matter–form) analysis.

Within this material domain, a material substratum underlies all change, and real change typically involves the gain or loss of some form. This can be made to look straightforward enough when examples are carefully chosen. If a tree’s limbs are bent under the weight of an early fall snowstorm, then the tree undergoes alteration (accidental change) in virtue of taking on a new shape (a new accidental form), while the material substance (the tree itself) endures. If the storm in fact kills the tree, then the substance is corrupted (a substantial change), in virtue of losing its substantial form, which is the internal principle that gives the substance its nature. In cases like this, where the substance is destroyed, Aquinas advances a metaphysical claim that is quite surprising: that all that endures through the change is the most basic material substratum, prime matter, which lacks all form. (Aquinas’s early On the Principles of Nature summarizes the basic story. For general discussions of Aquinas’s metaphysics of material bodies see Wippel 2000 chs. 7–9, Brower 2014. On causation at the level of creatures see Frost 2022.)

The resulting picture seems to postulate, as the constituents of substances, three types of basic entities: prime matter, substantial forms, and accidental forms. How exactly to understand each of these has been subject to a great deal of discussion over the centuries. With respect to accidental forms, one of the chief puzzles is to define those cases in which we have a genuine change of form. Aquinas clearly thinks, for instance, that colors and other proper sensibles are accidental forms. But does he think, as the above example of the tree implied, that shapes too are accidental forms? It is not entirely clear, and depends on difficult questions about how he understands Aristotle’s theory of the categories (Wippel 2000 ch. 7; Pasnau 2011 ch. 12). With respect to substantial form there is an analogous problem arising from unclarity over what exactly the substances are (Pasnau 2002 ch. 3; Rota 2004; Marmodoro and Page 2016). He clearly takes all living things to be substances, although there are puzzles here about how to define the beginning and end of life (Van Dyke 2012; Amerini 2009 [2013]). When it comes to nonliving things the situation is still less clear. He clearly thinks that artifacts like a house are not substances. Water is a substance, but it is not clear whether a puddle of water is a single substance or a collection of substances. Aquinas does not discuss these issues in the sort of detail that later medieval authors would, and as a result there is little scholarly consensus about his views. But one important guide to his thinking about substances is that they have unity in a very strong sense: “whatever is one in substance is one absolutely (simpliciter)” (ST 1a2ae 17.4c). Of course, no creature has the sort of unity that God has; God’s perfect simplicity precludes even the composition of essence and existence, which is found in all created substances, even in immaterial angels (Wippel 2000 ch. 5). Material substances, being composites of form and matter, have less unity than the angels. Even so, Aquinas thinks there can be complex material substances, unified by their substantial form. How does a substantial form unify? An important part of his answer is that a substantial form actualizes not only the whole substance, but each part: “a form of the whole that does not give existence to the individual parts of the body, … such as the form of a house, is an accidental form” (ST 1a 76.8c).

Substantial forms both unify a substance at a given time and individuate a substance over time. To play this role, they must be particulars rather than universals. In general, it seems that Aquinas thinks that no forms are universals except inasmuch as we conceive of them in abstraction from particulars. In external reality (in re), “no commonness is found in Socrates; rather, whatever is in him has been individuated” (On Being and Essence 3.80–2; Leftow 2003; Brower 2016). The principle of individuation, for forms, is matter (King 2000; Klima 2000). The account of individuation, then, comes in two stages: matter individuates the form at the start, when the form first inheres in that matter, and from that point forward the form possesses a fixed identity of its own. If it is a substantial form, it subsequently individuates the substance as a whole.

Fundamental to Aquinas’s hylomorphism is his coordinate distinction between potentiality and actuality. His brief treatise On the Principles of Nature, perhaps his earliest work, begins with this remark:

One should know that some things can be, although they are not, and some things are. That which can be is said to be in potentiality; that which is now is said to be in actuality.

He goes on to associate potentiality with matter, and actuality with form, and draws the distinctions we would expect between the various kinds of matters and forms. He also remarks at this point that being is of two kinds, and that the being of a substance is “something different” from accidental being. This signals his commitment to Aristotle’s doctrine of the multivocity (or homonymy) of being. What it means for a substance to exist is different from what it means for an accidental aggregation of a substance with its accidents (say, a pale man) to exist. In general, what properly exists is substances, whereas “forms, accidents, and other things of this sort are called beings not because they themselves exist, but because it is by them that something exists” (ST 1a 45.4c). Moreover, even among substances, God does not exist in the same way that creatures do, but only in an analogous way (§2). This denial of the univocity of being was contentious among later medieval authors (most notably John Duns Scotus) and its correct interpretation remains controversial today (Brower 2014; Pasnau 2018). Even more problematic is Aquinas’s conception of prime matter, which he characterizes as pure potentiality: “being in actuality is incompatible with matter’s nature, since matter is a potential existent by its very nature” (Quodlibet III.1.1). Although later medieval Aristotelians accepted that substantial change requires a material substratum, hardly anyone endorsed Aquinas’s suggestion that it is pure potentiality, because they were convinced that what lacks actuality does not exist. Readers of Aquinas have disputed how he himself could have evaded that outcome (Brower 2014 ch. 5), or whether perhaps it is an outcome he intended (Pasnau 2002 ch. 1).

5. Soul and Body

For living things, their substantial form is their soul (anima). In saying this, Aquinas should not be understood to be ascribing some special sort of spirituality to plants and animals: he thinks they are material objects just as much as rocks and streams are. Rather, he is following the lead of Aristotle’s De anima in treating the soul as the first principle of life, whatever that may be. Since Aquinas thinks that the primary internal explanation for the existence of any substance is its substantial form (§4), it follows that every living substance has a soul that is its substantial form.

As with any substantial form, the primary function of a soul is to account for the substance’s nature as a certain kind of thing, possessed of the unity and persistence that characterizes substances. This actualizing role is what Aquinas calls the soul’s essence (ST 1a 77.1c). The ongoing existence of living things also requires that they carry out distinctive operations: taking nourishment and reproducing, moving and perceiving (in the case of animals), and reasoning (in the human case). Corresponding to these operations are the powers of the soul. Medieval authors had long puzzled over the relationship between the soul and its powers. Aquinas takes a strong position that would be the subject of much later dispute: that the soul’s powers, being potentialities, are really distinct from the soul’s essence, which is an actuality (ST 1a 77, Quest. on the Soul 12).

Yet even though Aquinas insists on a distinction between the soul and its powers, he rejects the common medieval view that living things have multiple souls or multiple substantial forms. Because of his commitment to the absolute unity of a substance, he thinks that nothing could count as a substance unless it possesses a unique substantial form that provides unity, at a time and over time, to the substance as a whole.

One thing simpliciter is produced out of many actually existing things only if there is something uniting and in some way tying them to each other. In this way, then, if Socrates were an animal and were rational in virtue of different forms, then these two, in order to be united simpliciter, would need something to make them one. Therefore, since nothing is available to do this, the result will be that a human being is one thing only as an aggregate, like a heap. (Quest. on the Soul 11c; also ST 1a 76.3–4, Quest. on Spiritual Creatures 3)

Such remarks engendered a long dispute between those who favored this sort of “unitarian” approach and those who took one or another “pluralist” position. The pluralists argued that living things contain one substantial form for their body (their bodily form, forma corporeitatis) and at least one further distinct form, their soul, in virtue of which they have life (Adams 1987 ch. 15; Cross 1998 ch. 4; Pasnau 2011 ch. 25). The principal argument in favor of pluralism was that it explained how the body of a living thing could persist after the departure of the living thing’s soul at death. Aquinas and other unitarians claimed that such persistence was merely apparent, and that strictly speaking the only thing that endures through a substance’s corruption is prime matter.

Given the tight connection that Aquinas describes between form and matter, it is hard to characterize his theory of souls in general as dualistic. To be sure, in some sense, material substances are a composite of substantial form and prime matter (with accidents on the outside, so to speak, unified only accidentally with the substance). Still, Aquinas takes pains to stress that it is the substance as a whole that properly exists. And he definitely does not think that material substances are a composite of form and body, since the material substance is the body. His unitarian framework deliberately makes it incoherent to speak of the body of a living thing (or of any substance) as something distinct from that substance.

The situation is much more complex, however, when we focus on the human case. If a dualist is someone who thinks that human beings consist in a material body and an immaterial, spiritual mind, then Aquinas clearly qualifies, even if he works very hard to get the result that these two aspects of human nature are unified as a single substance (Bazán 1997; Klima 1997 [2002]; Stump 2003 ch. 6). Although the human soul’s essential role is to actualize a human body, the human soul has a power—its intellect—that operates independently of the body. Aquinas has a variety of much discussed arguments aimed at showing that human thought, given its universal scope and abstract content, cannot be carried out through the brain or any other bodily instrument (ST 1a 75.2, 75.5; Quest. on the Soul 2; Klima 2001; Wood 2020). As a result, the human soul has a unique and puzzling status: it is both the form of a body and “an incorporeal and subsistent principle” (ST 1a 75.2c). From here, Aquinas further argues that the human soul is incorruptible (ST 1a 75.6, Quest. on the Soul 14). For although ordinary subsistent things—material substances—routinely come into and go out of existence, with the corruption of their bodies, a subsistent entity that is not a body has no natural basis for its ceasing to exist. Hence, once God creates a human soul (in coordination with the biological process of sexual reproduction), that soul exists forever.

Given that the human body is corrupted at death, the soul’s incorruptibility entails that, after death, it will continue to exist without the body. Aquinas devotes considerable attention to the question of how it will function in that separated state (ST 1a 89; Quest. on the Soul 15–20). Prior to the delicate but all-important question of what such lives will be like (a paradise or a hell), there is a still more basic question of whether a human person’s separated soul continues to be that same person. Recent commentators have been divided. Aquinas is very clear that, in this life, a human being is the whole composite substance, form and matter (ST 1a 75.4). Also clear is that Aquinas thinks our souls will not be separated from their bodies forever; in the fullness of time, on the Day of Judgment, they will be reunited with their resurrected bodies (SCG IV.79–97). The situation becomes less clear, however, when Aquinas argues, as he repeatedly does, that a resurrection of bodies is required because otherwise we would not survive. “Abraham’s soul’s having life would not suffice for Abraham’s being alive…. The life of the whole compound is required, soul and body” (Sentences IV. ad 2). This seems to show that Aquinas thinks a person’s soul, surviving apart from its body, is not sufficient for that person’s survival, and some scholars (the “corruptionists”) read Aquinas in this way (Toner 2009; Van Dyke 2012; Nevitt 2014). But to others (the “survivalists”) this looks like an incredible result, in tension with claims that Aquinas makes elsewhere and with fundamental Christian doctrine (Brown 2007; Brower 2014 ch. 12; Stump 2022).

6. Cognitive Theory

6.1 Perception

By definition, the living things that we call animals are those that have the power of perception. Aquinas accepts the conventional list of the five senses—sight, hearing, smell, taste, touch—and argues that we arrive at this list of five because there are five discrete kinds of qualities that make an impression on our bodies. These objects are the proper sensibles—color, sound, odor, flavor, hot–cold—so-called because they “make an impression on the senses primarily and per se” (ST 1a 78.3 ad 2). In contrast to these are the common sensibles—size, shape, number, motion, rest—which “do not move the senses primary and of themselves, but on account of a sensible quality, as a surface does on account of its color” (ibid.). Whereas each proper sensible is capable of being perceived only by its corresponding sense, the common sensibles are so-called because they can be grasped by multiple senses, as when we both see and hear a thing move. To these two categories of sense objects Aquinas adds a third category, the accidental sensibles, as when I see that someone is alive (Comm. de anima II.13.184–90). This is, however, not a purely sensory operation, but an act of seeing that occurs in conjunction with a conceptual judgment that the observed motions are a sign of life. (For discussions of the perceptual process see Pasnau 2002 chs. 6, 9; Lisska 2016; De Haan 2019; Cory 2022.)

Beyond these five external senses are the four internal senses that use the brain as their organ. Following the lead of Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna), Aquinas puts considerable weight on these sensory powers to explain the sophisticated behavior of animals. In contrast to the consensus over the number of external senses, there had been a great deal of historical disagreement over how many internal senses there are. Aquinas settles on this list of four:

  • the common sense;
  • imagination (or phantasia);
  • the estimative (or cogitative) power;
  • memory.

The precise role of these four faculties is not easy to evaluate on the basis of Aquinas’s limited and scattered remarks, but according to his most prominent account the common sense is what allows us to make cross-modal sensory judgments (seeing something as white and sweet) and to have second-order awareness, for instance “when someone sees that he is seeing” (ST 1a 78.4 ad 2). The imagination—Aquinas uses both imaginatio and phantasia to refer to this faculty—retains images acquired through the external senses. The estimative power perceives what the Arabic tradition referred to as the “intentions” (maʿānī) that lie behind the sensible qualities: for instance, that wolves are dangerous and that straw is useful for nest building. (Aquinas refers to the more sophisticated human capacity for grasping intentions as the cogitative power.) Memory preserves these intentions. All of the internal senses are richly engaged in human cognitive activity, which is to say that the brain—despite not being the power of intellect—plays a critical role in human cognition.

The senses are not wholly immaterial faculties in the way that the intellect is, but the respect in which Aquinas thinks they are material is a matter of some dispute. He remarks that the senses operate “through a corporeal organ but not through any corporeal quality” (ST 1a 78.1c). By this he intends a contrast with ordinary physical causation, as when a fire, through the quality of heat, brings water to a boil. In contrast, when we perceive heat, even though the skin is heated in the same way that water is, still the perception itself is not the skin’s being made hot. Rather, “the senses and intellect receive the forms of things spiritually and immaterially, in virtue of a kind of intentional existence” (Comm. de sensu 18.208–10). In general, Aquinas treats the ability to receive forms intentionally as a mark of the mental:

Things that cognize are distinguished from things that do not cognize in this: that the non-cognizers have nothing but their own form alone, whereas that which cognizes is naturally suited to have the form of another thing as well. (ST 1a 14.1c)

Such forms, received intentionally in the external senses, are known as sensible species. Received in the internal senses, they are known as phantasms. Received in the intellect, they are known as intelligible species. Such forms—for instance, the sensible species of heat—are that in virtue of which we perceive, for instance, the heat of external bodies. That such forms do not make possessor actually hot (etc.) is perhaps just what it is for a form to exist intentionally. But there is scholarly disagreement over what it means to say that such forms are “spiritual” and “immaterial” (Hoffman 2014).

As these passages make clear, perception (and cognition in general) works through the reception of the very form of the thing that is being perceived. This has led to much discussion over whether Aquinas thereby subscribes to a strong form of direct realism, according to which what we perceive (and what we think about) is the thing itself. In favor of this reading is that Aquinas seems entirely unconcerned about these intentionally existing species as intermediaries lying between us and the things themselves. Why should he be concerned, the thought goes, since the species just is the form itself of the thing out in the world? (see Perler 2000; Băltuță 2013) Against this reading is that the species (of heat, say) is not numerically the same form as the one that inheres in the fire, and that Aquinas does, at least sometimes, seem to think of these species as representations that mediate our access to external things (Pasnau 1997 ch. 3; Panaccio 2001; see also Brower and Brower-Toland 2008).

6.2 Thought

Aquinas thinks that a great deal of complex cognition occurs within the internal senses of the brain, but that those material powers are incapable of abstract thought. To be more precise, he thinks that material cognitive powers can represent things only as particulars, and that universal concepts can be formed only within the immaterial intellect. He writes,

If the intellective soul were composed of form and matter, then the forms of things would be received in it as individuals; then it would cognize only singular things, as happens in the sensory capacities, which receive the forms of things in a corporeal organ. (ST 1a 75.5c)

The senses, both external and internal, can represent only this or that particular cat. It takes the intellect to form the abstract concept of cat. Conversely, Aquinas thinks that the human intellect is incapable of grasping particulars (ST 1a 86.1). This means that when we engage in a routine task like apprehending that a thing is a cat we are simultaneously using both intellect and sense, using the senses to apprehend the particular, and using the intellect to conceptualize what it is. In our more theoretical reflections, we rely on the internal senses to frame images that aid us in the process of abstract reasoning.

Following Aristotle’s lead in De anima III.5, Aquinas distinguishes between two distinct intellectual powers, the possible intellect and the agent intellect. The first starts out in potentiality to all intelligibles, a tabula rasa, “like a tablet on which nothing has been written” (ST 1a 79.2c), and gradually becomes actualized, taking in universal concepts that are then stored there as dispositions. But because such concepts are not immediately available through sensory experience—one cannot grasp what it is to be a cat just by looking at a cat—there must also be an active intellectual power, “a power on the side of intellect to actualize intelligible things by abstracting the species from material conditions” (ST 1a 79.3c). By Aquinas’s time, generations of Aristotelians had already argued over the correct understanding of these two powers, with some treating the agent intellect as a single higher mind, separate from human beings, and perhaps even to be identified with God. Ibn Rushd (Averroes), the Spanish philosopher active a half century before Aquinas, had even proposed treating the possible intellect as a single higher power to which every human being has shared access. Aquinas, in contrast, thinks that each human being has their own intellect, agent and possible. That we all share in a single agent intellect is, he thinks, wrong but not incredible—it has affinities with the venerable Augustinian doctrine of divine illumination—but Aquinas regards the Averroistic doctrine of a separate possible intellect as not just contrary to the faith but entirely preposterous, since it would make it impossible to explain how we are each capable of individual acts of thought. As he describes the absurd implication in his treatise On the Unity of the Intellect against the Averroists, “if I think about stone and you do likewise, then it would be necessary that you and I have one and the same intellectual operation” (4.101–3; see Ogden 2022).

Aquinas distinguishes between three principal stages of intellectual operation: first, the formation of concepts; second, the composition of judgments (propositions) built from concepts; third, inferential reasoning from one judgment to another. These last two stages were the subject of intensive study within medieval logic, but Aquinas has relatively little to say about logic, and is most interested in the initial stage of concept formation. Here, the possible intellect passively receives concepts that the agent intellect has abstracted from sensory impressions (phantasms). The possible intellect starts out as a blank slate, which is to say that Aquinas rejects the theory of innate ideas, at least as far as the possible intellect is concerned. Moreover, he is very clear that all our concepts arise from sensory experience: “the source of our cognition comes from the senses” (ST 1a 84.6sc). From this vantagepoint, he looks more like an empiricist than a rationalist. The role of agent intellect, however, complicates the situation. Whereas the possible intellect starts out as unformed potentiality, the agent intellect has the actuality to abstract universal concepts from sensory experience. It is not easy to say how abstraction occurs; indeed, for the whole of the Aristotelian tradition, the agent intellect has been something of a black box whose operation is taken as a brute fact rather than analyzed. Sometimes Aquinas suggests that the transformation of singular content into universal content occurs via the conversion of material phantasms into immaterial intelligible species, but the link between immateriality and universality is not entirely clear. (On abstraction see King 1994, Cory 2015).

6.3 Knowledge and Science

Aquinas uses a variety of terms to talk about knowledge, including scientia, cognitio and notitia. Often he seems to use these terms interchangeably, and he shows no interest in trying to define anything like knowledge in its loose and popular sense. He is, however, very much interested in articulating what it would be to have an ideal grasp of some subject, and he refers to such a thing, speaking strictly, as scientia. This is what both the theologian and the philosopher seek, which is to say that this is what Aquinas himself seeks. Each of these fields, theology and philosophy, can be described as a single complex scientia—that is, as a science. We can also refer to the myriad individual conclusions obtained in these fields as scientiae—that is, as items of scientific knowledge. Philosophy itself, moreover, can be divided into various discrete fields of science: logic, physics, astronomy, biology, metaphysics, ethics, and so on. Until the seventeenth century the physical sciences were understood to be contained, in this way, within the field of philosophy. Accordingly, the domains of scientia, conceived most widely, were philosophy and theology.

The fundamentals of Aquinas’s thinking about knowledge in this ideal sense come from Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics. In particular, he takes the discussion in Book I chapter 2 to offer a definition of scientia (in Greek, epistēmē), which in his commentary he articulates as follows (quotations are from Comm. Post. An. I.4):

  • “to have scientia of something is to cognize it perfectly”;
  • to have scientia requires grasping the cause of the thing known;
  • scientia is a cognition with certainty of a thing”;
  • the object of scientia is true and “cannot stand otherwise”;
  • “to have scientia is the end or effect of a demonstrative syllogism”;
  • the premises of such a syllogism must be “true, primary, and immediate” and must be “better known, prior, and causes of the conclusion”;
  • such premises must concern the universal natures of things.

Each of these bullet points raises a host of further questions, but, in broad outline, Aquinas understands scientia as the apprehension, with certainty, of an entity, event or proposition, based on a demonstrative proof grounded in the essential nature of the thing in question. As befits intellectual understanding (§6.2), scientia will concern universal truths. Because it concerns the essences of things, it will concern necessary truths and will get at the underlying cause of a thing’s being so (MacDonald 1993).

Eventually, the demand that premises be “better known” leads back to the first principles of the science, which are self-evident (per se nota) in the sense that they are known to be true simply in virtue of their terms (Comm. Post. Analytics I.7.8). Nothing could be better known than such a principle, but because these principles are self-evident there is also no need for any further demonstration. Each science has its own starting points—its own first principles—which are not susceptible to demonstration within that science. But not all such first principles are strictly self-evident. Within physics, for instance, it is a first principle that there is motion, but that is neither absolutely necessary nor strictly self-evident. Accordingly, again following Aristotle, Aquinas orders the various sciences according to relations of “subalternation”, such that biology is subalternate to physics, and physics to metaphysics. In general, “the principles of a lower science are proved by the principles of a higher science” (Comm. Post. Analytics I.17.5). Among the natural speculative sciences—that is, setting theology and ethics aside—the preeminent science is metaphysics, or first philosophy, “from which all the other sciences follow, taking their principles from it” (Comm. Boethius De trin. 5.1c). (On the structure of the sciences see Maurer 1986; Wippel 1995a; Dougherty 2004.)

This sort of foundationalist, infallibilist theory of knowledge is now thought of as Cartesian, but Descartes is simply following the Aristotelian tradition for which Aquinas became the preeminent spokesman. For Aquinas himself, however, the account just described serves as an aspirational ideal rather than a description of something we have actually attained. In practice, even where we have demonstrative knowledge, we usually cannot trace the principles all the way back to ultimate first principles like the law of non-contradiction. Critical questions, like the non-eternity of the world (§3), are contingent on the free choice of God and so have to be taken on faith. Even in places where certainty is possible in principle, large gaps in our knowledge remain. In general, “our cognition is so weak that no philosopher could have ever completely investigated the nature of a single fly” (On the Apostles’ Creed [Collatio in symbolum Apostolorum], proem). Accordingly, Aquinas distinguishes among various non-ideal cases. A demonstration that grasps the cause of a thing is a demonstration propter quid, but often—as in proving God’s existence—the best we can have is a demonstration quia, which tells us only that a thing is so. Much of what we know holds true only for the most part, and so fails to be necessary, and often the premises of an argument cannot be traced back to self-evident principles, in which case our argument is dialectical rather than demonstrative, yielding a conclusion that is merely plausible (probabilis) rather than apodictic.

In all of this, Aquinas is following Aristotle and the later Aristotelian tradition fairly closely, and thus the framework for science and knowledge just sketched comes to be commonly accepted by the later scholastic tradition all the way into the seventeenth century.

7. Will and Freedom

The immaterial human mind, as Aquinas understands it, is not just the intellect. The mind is an ensemble of three discrete powers, agent and possible intellect working in conjunction with the will. The rise of the will as a faculty of the soul is a distinctively medieval idea, but has strong roots in Augustine and, before him, in late Stoicism. These late-ancient sources had ascribed a prominent role in human agency to desire (appetitus) or volition (voluntas), and particularly to those desires that we endorse as our own, and which thus give rise to voluntary action. Among these earlier authors, our will is conceived of as something that we need to control, if we are to lead our lives as we should. By Aquinas’s time, however, the will (voluntas) had come to be identified not just as a power of the soul but as the power that is principally in control of human agency, directing both our thoughts and our actions. Thus, whereas Augustine and Boethius had wondered about how we have free choice (liberum arbitrium) over our wills, Aquinas identifies the two, concluding that “the will and free choice are not two powers, but one” (ST 1a 83.4c). He was by no means the first to conceive of the power of will in this way, but the cogency and influence of his account ensured that this framework would dominate later discussions.

The will is one of three appetitive powers within us, distinguished from the irascible and concupiscible powers in being not a sensual appetite, the source of the passions (King 1998; Miner 2009), but a rational appetite, the source of voluntary agency. Its rationality consists in the way it is coordinate with intellect, taking as its inputs the intellect’s practical judgments regarding what is to be done. Since the will’s function is strictly appetitive, it cannot render its own practical judgments, and to that extent can act only on the basis of intellect: “every choice and actual will within us is immediately caused by an intelligible apprehension” (SCG III.85.3). But that is by no means to say that the will is determined by the intellect’s judgment, because ultimately our will has the power to control what we think about: “the will moves both itself and all other capacities. For I think when I want to, and likewise I use all my other capacities and dispositions because I want to” (Quest. on Evil 6c). To be sure, by its very nature, the will can desire only what is presented to it as a good (ST 1a2ae 8.1). Accordingly, since our ultimate happiness (beatitudo) is good in every respect, “human beings have an appetite of necessity for happiness” (ST 1a2ae 10.2c; see §8.1). But, with regard to any specific course of action, there are always multiple perspectives from which the situation can be judged, and the will can control how we think about things—whether, for instance, we decide to focus on how rewarding a thing would be or on how tiring it would be. Even in the case of our ultimate happiness, moreover, the will can choose not to think about it, and so even in that extreme case the will’s choices are not necessitated. On this basis Aquinas adamantly insists on human freedom of choice, and treats claims that the will is necessitated as “contrary to the faith and subverting all of the principles of moral philosophy” (Quest. on Evil 6c).

Up to this point, Aquinas’s position is fairly clear. There has been considerable controversy over the centuries, however, regarding whether Aquinas wants to go further and characterize the will’s agency as nondeterministic—as its being, in other words, a first and undetermined cause of free action. Within a few years of his death, after the Condemnation of 1277, views of this sort came to dominate scholastic philosophy, yielding a broad consensus that held until the rise of seventeenth-century anti-scholasticism. Readers of Aquinas have been sharply divided, however, over where he fits into that history. At first glance it might seem obvious that Aquinas is an opponent of determinism, given his adamant opposition to the will’s being necessitated. Yet Aquinas writes at a time at which the governing form of Aristotelianism, drawn from the Arabic tradition of Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Rushd, is explicitly deterministic. In general, Aquinas strives where he can to harmonize the faith with the mainstream of philosophical opinion, and here in particular he shows signs of endorsing causal determinism as applied to the created world. Thus he ascribes to Ibn Rushd (“the Commentator”) the doctrine that “from that which is open both ways (ad utrumlibet) no action follows, unless it is inclined one way by something else” (ST 1a 19.3 obj. 5). He hastens to reject this principle when applied to God, who is able to determine freely God’s own choices. But outside the case of God he accepts the principle: “a cause that is of itself contingent must be determined to its effect by something external” (ibid., ad 5). Accordingly, he explicitly insists that the will’s freedom does not require it to be its own first cause. Instead, he characterizes the will’s operations as entwined over time with the operation of intellect, running backward through an agent’s history, with one cause preceding another, all the way back to God’s initial creation of the human soul (Quest. on Evil 6, ST 1a 83.1 ad 3, ST 1a2ae 9.4c). This insistence on determining causes might seem to fit well with his strict conception of divine providence:

Everything that happens here, insofar as it is brought back to the first divine cause, is found to be ordered rather than to exist accidentally, even if in comparison to other causes it is found to exist accidentally. This is why the Catholic faith says that nothing in the world happens aimlessly or fortuitously, and that all things are subject to divine providence. (Comm. Metaphys. VI.3.26; see Goris 1997)

On this reading of Aquinas, causal determinism fits with God’s preordained plan for the universe, and freedom is thus compatible with both causal and theological determinism (Hause 1997; Kenny 1993 ch. 6; Loughran 1999; Pasnau 2002 ch. 7; Shanley 2007).

Many scholars, however, have denied that Aquinas is any sort of compatibilist. That there is room for doubt is suggested in a passage that, at first, looks to support a compatibilist account:

Freedom does not necessarily require that what is free be the first cause of itself, just as one thing’s being the cause of another does not require that it be the first cause of that other. God, then, is the first cause, moving both natural and voluntary causes. And just as his moving natural causes does not take away from their acts’ being natural, so his moving voluntary causes does not take away from their actions’ being voluntary. Instead, he makes this be so for them, because he works within each thing in accord with its own character. (ST 1a 83.1 ad 3)

Although the passage begins in a way that looks friendly to causal determinism, the passage goes on to suggest the situation is more complicated. For although God is the first cause of our voluntary actions, God’s efficacy there is different from how it is with natural causes: God somehow acts on the will in a way that “does not take away” from its voluntariness. And Aquinas takes just the same line in explaining how divine providence is consistent with human freedom (ST 1a 23.6c; SCG III.72–73; Comm. Metaphys. VI.3.30–32; Comm. De interp. I.14.22).

Among those who think that Aquinas’s God leaves room for indeterministic human agency, there remains a fundamental difference of opinion. Some (e.g., Stump 2003 ch. 9) think that such freedom, for Aquinas, requires only that the will be an ultimate source, a first creaturely cause. Others think that, in addition to this, Aquinas further requires the leeway to choose among alternative possibilities (e.g., Hoffmann and Michon 2017). Either way, a libertarian reading of Aquinas is likely to stress his claim that the will is a self-mover: “Just as the will moves other capacities, so it also moves itself” (Quest. on Evil 6c; Gallagher 1994). This is an idea, moreover, that Aquinas had urged from his very first discussion of free choice in his Sentences commentary, where he argued that free choice is possessed only by beings who “determine for themselves their end and their action toward that end” (Sentences II.25.1c). In some sense, then, the will is free because it is self-determining. This distinguishes it from natural, non-voluntary agents, whose determination comes from without. Aquinas’s focus on the will’s role in such self-determination—a tendency that becomes more prominent in his later works—makes it reasonable to include him in the thirteenth-century movement away from ancient intellectualism and toward a voluntaristic conception of human nature. In emphasizing the will’s overarching control, Aquinas can appeal to the critical importance of the will’s various operations and dispositions. The act of love, foundational to any Christian ethics, is an operation of will. The dispositions of justice and charity—the central virtues of philosophy and theology, respectively—are both virtues of the will. But it is not clear that Aquinas goes so far—as Peter John Olivi, Henry of Ghent, and Scotus, among many others, soon would—as to exempt the will from the determinism that was agreed to characterize the rest of the natural world. There remains a lively debate among scholars over this issue.

8. Ethics

Aquinas’s ethics is difficult to study because it is so vast and multifaceted. Around half of the Summa theologiae, the massive second part, is concerned with moral questions, suggesting something of the importance Aquinas ascribes to ethics in theology. To bring some order to this large topic, we can distinguish between three parts of the theory:

  • his conception of happiness as the goal of human life;
  • his framework for the moral law, grounded in a theory of natural law;
  • his understanding of the virtues as essential to human happiness.

(For wide-ranging treatments of Aquinas’s ethics see McInerny 1997; MacDonald and Stump 1998; Pope 2002; Irwin 2007: chs 16–24; DeYoung, McCluskey, and Van Dyke 2009; McCluskey 2017.)

8.1 Happiness

Aquinas’s worldview is thoroughly teleological, inasmuch as he holds “it is necessary that all agents act for the sake of an end” (ST 1a2ae 1.2c). There is a distinction to be drawn, however, between those agents that are unable to understand their end and rational agents, who “move themselves to their end because they have control over their acts through free choice” (ibid.). It is for rational agents that ethical questions arise. Aquinas follows Aristotle in supposing that human choices must be ordered toward a single ultimate end: “there must be some ultimate end on account of which all other things are desired, whereas this end itself is not desired on account of anything else” (Comm. Nic. Ethics I.1.22). This ultimate end, whatever it is, can be referred to as happiness (beatitudo). In the Treatise on Happiness from the start of ST 1a2ae, after working through various predictably unsatisfactory candidates for our ultimate end—not riches, not honor, not pleasure, and so on—Aquinas arrives at the view that happiness consists primarily in intellectual contemplation. And since the highest truth and the greatest good are of course God, our ultimate happiness must lie there: “final and complete happiness can consist in nothing other than the vision of the divine essence” (ST 1a2ae 3.8c). Human beings possess this most fully in the life to come (Brown 2021), but even in this life Aquinas’s conception of happiness is strongly intellectualist: “it is clear that people who give themselves to the contemplation of truth are the happiest a person in this life can be” (Comm. Nic. Ethics X.12.2110).

This eudaimonistic framework—to use the Greek term for ethical theories aimed at happiness—shapes all of Aquinas’s ethical thinking. It is perhaps the most striking instance of his confidence in Aristotelianism as the proper philosophical foundation for a Christian worldview. Predictably, that confidence was met with various sorts of challenges. One concerns his insistence that our ultimate end is intellectual rather than volitional. For many subsequent theorists, Christian and secular, the ultimate end of human life should not be intellectual contemplation but instead should be love. Aquinas agrees—indeed, he stresses—that love is an essential complement to happiness, pulling us toward our end and rejoicing in its grasp. Still, the goal of life properly speaking is to understand God and God’s creation (ST 1a2ae 3.4). (For nuanced discussions see Stenberg 2016a and Stump 2022.)

A second concern, which troubles eudaimonism in all of its forms, is that Aquinas rests the foundations of ethics on a self-directed concern for our own happiness. That is liable to look like a doubtful strategy for any ethical theory, and particularly for Judeo–Christian ethics given its radically altruistic orientation, as epitomized in the twin injunctions to “Love the Lord your God with all your heart and with all your soul and with all your mind” and to “Love your neighbor as yourself” (Matthew 22:37–39, quoting Deuteronomy 6:5 and Leviticus 19:18). On its face, the eudaimonistic approach might seem to conflict directly with these injunctions, given the way that it grounds all human agency in our ultimate pursuit of happiness:

The will naturally tends towards its ultimate end: for every human being naturally wills happiness. And this natural willing is the cause of all other willings, since whatever a human being wills, he wills for the sake of an end. (ST 1a 60.2c)

Aquinas is unflinching in his insistence that our final end is our own happiness. But it has to be remembered that ‘happiness’ is just a generic label for the human activity that is ultimately best for us. And what is ultimately best for us is not the selfish pursuit of our own wellbeing, which is surely an ambition that would make anyone miserable. What we should seek, as we have seen already, is an understanding of the world and its Creator. This, again speaking teleologically, is what we were created to do. By pursuing this substantive goal, and actualizing our intellectual capacities to the utmost, we make ourselves as good as we can be, and we contribute to the universe as a whole’s being as good as it can be. How does such intellectual activity ground a theory of ethics? It does so because when we understand God and the created order, we understand why we should love God preeminently and why we should love our neighbor. But to see how these ideas get developed, we need to turn to his theory of the moral law. (For general discussions of Aquinas’s eudaimonistic framework see MacDonald 1991b; Bradley 1997; Kenny 1998; Osborne 2005; Stenberg 2016b.)

8.2 Natural Law

Aquinas’s moral theory does not offer the sort of brief and comprehensive criterion for rightness and wrongness that draws students toward consequentialism or Kant’s moral philosophy. What he offers instead is a deep and systematic explanation of where morality comes from, yielding a moral code that is impressively responsive to the changing circumstances of human life.

The key text for Aquinas’s thinking about the moral law is his Treatise on Law (ST 1a2ae 90–108). There he distinguishes between four kinds of law that play a role in guiding right human action:

  • eternal law: God’s plan of governance for the world (q. 93);
  • natural law: the distinctive way rational beings participate in the eternal law (q. 94);
  • human law: particular developments of natural law worked out by human reason (qq. 95–97);
  • divine law: divinely revealed laws directing human beings to their end (qq. 98–108).

The eternal law governs everything, but can serve to guide us only when it is somehow transmitted to us. One way in which it is transmitted is through divine law, preeminently through the Bible, and here Aquinas distinguishes between the old law of the Hebrew Bible (qq. 98–105) and the new law described in the Gospel (qq. 106–8). The other form of transmission, philosophically the most interesting part of his account, is the natural law. Whereas human law is the contingent result of social and political organization, the natural law is innate within us. Since Aquinas thinks that God orders everything to its proper end (§8.1), there is a sense in which all things follow a natural law by which they participate in the eternal law. But when Aquinas refers to natural law in a moral context, he means the distinctive way in which rational agents have been ordered to achieve their proper end; hence he has in mind a law that governs the mind. Thus, “the law of nature is nothing other than the light of intellect, placed within us by God, through which we grasp what is to be done and what is to be avoided” (On the Ten Commandments [Collationes in decem praeceptis] proem).

So described, natural law might be nothing more than an innate inclination to accept a fixed set of moral laws prescribed by God. In fact, however, Aquinas’s theory offers something more complex and nuanced, because he thinks the moral law arises not out of brutely innate inclination but out of rational reflection on the good (Finnis 1998 ch. 3; Rhonheimer 1987 [2000]). Mirroring the way he develops theoretical science out of first principles (§6.3), he thinks moral reasoning also rises out of self-evident first principles, the grasp of which is the defining task of the intellect’s power of synderesis (ST 1a 79.12). The most fundamental such precept is this:

The good should be done and pursued, and the bad should be avoided. (ST 1a2ae 94.2c)

Aquinas takes this to be self-evident, because he accepts Aristotle’s claim at the start of the Nicomachean Ethics that the good is what all things desire. By beginning here, Aquinas builds into the ground floor of his account a substantive story about moral motivation. The story requires tying the ensuing development of his theory to facts about what human beings actually desire; without that tie, the theory would equivocate on what it means by the good. Aquinas explicitly recognizes as much, remarking that “the order of the precepts of natural law accords with the order of natural inclinations” (ST 1a2ae 94.2c). At this point, Aquinas could appeal to eudaimonism: that all human beings desire happiness as their ultimate end (§8.1). A very thin conception of natural law might suppose that human beings are given only this much innate direction, and thereafter left to sort out for themselves what will make them happy. But Aquinas’s conception of natural law is much thicker, both in the sense that he articulates a rich and substantive notion of the happiness that is our ultimate end (as above), and in the sense that he thinks we have been given various further innate inclinations, intended to provide us with specific guidance toward that ultimate end. Among these are inclinations to preserve our own lives, toward sexual activity, toward educating the young, toward knowing the truth about God, and toward living in society (ST 1a2ae 94.2c; see also SCG III.129). These innate inclinations, combined with the first practical principle (“The good should be done…”) and Aquinas’s substantive conception of happiness, are the foundations from which arises a comprehensive account of the moral law, relying on conscience as the rational activity of working out what ought to be done from a moral point of view (ST 1a 79.13).

Inasmuch as the moral point of view is no different from the point of view that seeks our own happiness, Aquinas shares with ancient ethics the conviction that rational self-interest provides an adequate foundation for morality (Irwin 2007: ch. 19). But the weight Aquinas puts on our innate inclinations in shaping the moral law gives his account a distinctive character. Among its champions, this approach has been celebrated for the way it grounds traditional values in facts about human nature. To its critics, the view looks intellectually dubious twice over: on scientific grounds inasmuch as it makes false claims about the universality of various inclinations (Massey 1999); and philosophically inasmuch as it grounds normativity in metaethics on descriptive facts about human nature. Such criticisms, however, miss the philosophical sophistication of the overarching framework. To be sure, we now understand the diversity of human inclinations—for instance, regarding gender and sexuality—much better than we did even a century ago. Aquinas’s theory can survive when we update these assumptions, and indeed may generate surprisingly modern results (Oliva 2015). As for the complaint that the theory conflates normativity with nature, that would have real force only supposing that we had some better account of the basis of normative value. As things are, if there is a God, then it seems plausible to suppose that God would want us to be happy and would create our natures to guide us in seeking such happiness. On the other hand, if there is no God, then it is not clear what foundation for ethics there might be other than facts about the nature of human beings and how we best thrive in the world we live in. (The literature on the natural law in Aquinas is large and contentious. For a sample see Grisez 1965; Lisska 1996; Murphy 2001; Jensen 2015; Porter 2018. For an introduction to the variety of recent perspectives see Angier 2021. For a sense of the complexity of the contested issues see Aquinas’ moral, political, and legal philosophy.)

8.3 Virtue Theory

The theory of natural law gives us Aquinas’s moral theory: it identifies the foundations of ethics and frames the general contours of the moral law. For us to adhere to that law, however, it is not enough to trust to the light of intellect and our natural inclinations. Reliably moral agents must, in addition, cultivate the right sorts of virtuous dispositions. Accordingly, Aquinas develops a complex virtue ethics to frame his account of our moral psychology.

The virtues are a certain kind of psychological disposition (habitus): they are the perfections of those powers of the soul that are under our voluntary control. Aquinas devotes roughly a quarter of the Summa theologiae—mainly the 2a2ae—to his theory of the virtues, and also dedicates a series of disputed questions to the subject. He takes from Aristotle the familiar idea that it is through the repetition of certain kinds of actions that we acquire the virtues (as well, of course, as the vices): by acting honestly we acquire, over time, the virtue of honesty. Less familiarly, he imposes a very high standard on what counts as a virtue: it must be incapable of giving rise to an immoral act.

Two things are required for an act’s perfection: first, the act must be right; second, the [underlying] disposition must be incapable of being the source of a contrary act. For that which is the source of good and bad acts cannot, of itself, be the perfect source of a good act. (Quest. on the Virtues in General 2c)

This is not to say that a person with the virtue of honesty cannot be dishonest. Just as virtues can be acquired through practice, so they can be lost through the wrong kind of practice, and that loss must begin somewhere. Still, in such a case, the dishonesty will not arise through the virtue. Any characterization of a virtue that would make its possession a mixed blessing would have failed to delimit a true virtue.

The reason that the virtues are so important to Aquinas’s ethics is that he thinks that we cannot, over time, act morally without them. He highlights three reasons why moral activity requires the virtues (Quest. on the Virtues in General 1c):

  • for uniformity of action, avoiding unreliable vicissitudes;
  • to be prompt in that action, rather than needing constantly to deliberate;
  • to take pleasure in the action, as a kind of second nature.

These are not meant to be necessary conditions on an act’s goodness, but Aquinas thinks they are required for a person’s actions to count as wholly praiseworthy. In contrast to the effortful calculations of a utilitarian striving to maximize the beneficial consequences of every act, he thinks moral goodness requires a dispositional stability in our underlying psychology. And given morality’s ultimate basis in Aquinas’s overarching theory of happiness, it should be no surprise that he thinks happiness, in this life, consists in our acting through these virtues (ST 1a2ae 5.5–6).

Among the many fine-grained distinctions that Aquinas makes between various virtues and vices, he treats as preeminent the traditional four cardinal virtues and the three theological virtues. The cardinal virtues are

  • prudence: the perfection of the intellect’s practical reasoning (ST 2a2ae 47–51);
  • justice: the will’s stable disposition to give to each individual what is due to him (ST 2a2ae 58);
  • bravery: the strength of the irascible appetite in pursuing what is in accord with reason (ST 2a2ae 143);
  • temperance: the moderation of the concupiscible appetite with respect to its desires that conflict with reason (ST 2a2ae 141).

Unlike some of his contemporaries, who argued that all the virtues should be dispositions of the will (Kent 1995), Aquinas thinks that each of these four virtues perfects a different power of the soul. Bravery and temperance, indeed, are not perfections of rational powers at all. They are, however, defined in terms of right reason, and this both connects his virtue theory to the theory of natural law and helps to explain why the virtues cannot be the cause of immoral actions. The person who is “brave” in a foolhardy way would not strictly count as brave. Deepening the connection between these virtues and right reason is that Aquinas treats the intellectual virtue of prudence (prudentia, or phronēsis in Greek) as foundational to all the other cardinal virtues: “rightness and full goodness in all the other virtues comes from prudence” (Quest. on the Virtues in General 6c; see Westberg 1994). Without prudence, none of the other virtues are possible. Conversely, prudence itself requires the proper disposition of our various appetitive powers. Accordingly, Aquinas endorses the traditional doctrine of the unity of the virtues: one cannot have any of them without having all of them (ST 1a2ae 65.1).

Although the four cardinal virtues, as their name suggests, have historically been given pride of place within philosophy, Aquinas gives greater preeminence to the theological virtues that Paul describes in 1 Corinthians 13:

  • faith: the intellectual disposition to assent to what is not apparent (ST 2a2ae 1–7);
  • hope: the will’s dispositional confidence in achieving a good that is difficult to obtain (ST 2a2ae 17–18);
  • charity: the will’s disposition for perfect love (ST 2a2ae 23–27).

For these to count as theological virtues, rather than as generic dispositions, they must each be further defined as having God as their object. They must also be understood to be infused in us by God, because the humanly attainable versions of these virtues are not sufficient for our moral perfection (ST 1a2ae 62.1). Indeed, for similar reasons, moral perfection requires that even the cardinal virtues be infused by God (ST 1a2ae 63.3). To receive the virtues from God requires grace, which is something we can never fully merit, and which God freely chooses to give or to withhold: “no matter how much someone prepares himself, he does not receive grace from God necessarily” (ST 1a2ae 112.3sc). Only through this grace, and the infused virtues it brings, can we achieve the perfect happiness that is our ultimate end. (On the cardinal virtues see Hause 2007; Stump 2011. On the theological virtues see Wawrykow 2012; Porter 2019. On the infused cardinal virtues see Mattison 2011; Goris and Schoot 2017; Knobel 2021. On grace see Torrell 1996 [2003] chs. 6–9; Stump 2018 ch. 7; Hoffmann 2022.)

9. Influence

During his lifetime, Aquinas was recognized as an extraordinary figure both for his intellectual achievements and for his personal sanctity. The immense number of surviving manuscripts and the wide range of his influence testifies to the first. As for the second, his death in Fossanova immediately gave rise to the sort of veneration reserved for the saints: claims of miracles at once arose, and a long-running dispute began over where the holy relic of his body would be kept. This process culminated in his canonization on July 18, 1323.

These developments notwithstanding, many of Aquinas’s specific views—particularly in philosophy—were extremely controversial. Among the 219 articles condemned in Paris in 1277 are a significant number that seem to implicate Aquinas’s teachings (Hissette 1977; Wippel 1995b). It would have been lost on no one at the time that these articles were promulgated three years, to the day, after his death. It seems likely that the authorities in Paris were planning an explicit censure of certain of Aquinas’s core theses—especially his unitarian theory of substantial form (§5) and his conception of prime matter as pure potentiality (§4)—until higher authorities cut this process short (Torrell 1993 [2022] ch. 16). Later in March 1277, in Oxford, Archbishop Robert Kilwardby condemned a series of theses that explicitly includes those two distinctively Aquinian doctrines. Also around this time, the Franciscan William de la Mare published a lengthy Correctorium fratris Thomae, with verbatim quotations from Aquinas’s corpus paired with putative “corrections”. Soon after, various disciples of Aquinas rallied to his defense, in a series of works entitled the Correctorium Corruptorii Thomae (Glorieux 1927; Jordan 1982). For the quarter century after Aquinas’s death, scholasticism took shape around his Dominican supporters and his Franciscan critics.

In the early fourteenth century, Aquinas’s influence had to compete against the emergence of two brilliantly original Franciscans: first Scotus and his expansive realism; then William Ockham and his parsimonious nominalism. In the face of these and many other complex crosscurrents, Aquinas’s views came to seem both less urgent and less dangerous. Two years after his canonization, the bishop of Paris clarified that the 1277 condemnations should not be held to apply to Aquinas’s teaching, though the bishop made clear that this should not be taken as an endorsement. Among the many emerging rival views, Aquinas continued to have his vociferous supporters, particularly among the Dominicans, who were statutorily required to promote his teaching. In the early fifteenth century, John Capreolus emerged as a champion of Thomism as a systematic philosophy, and a century later Cajetan (Thomas de Vio) made further systematic developments. In 1567, Pope Pius V numbered Aquinas among the doctors of the Church, a title previously reserved for the ancient Church fathers. When the Jesuit order came to prominence, around this same time, its members—including Francisco Suárez—were enjoined to adhere to those views that were safest and best established, and especially to those of Aquinas, “because of his authority and his more secure and approved teachings” (Pasnau 2011, 436).

Even as Thomism gradually became ascendant within scholastic Aristotelianism, that whole tradition started to look more and more hidebound, as it moved into its increasingly mannerist and then baroque stages. Martin Luther’s hostility toward the Roman Catholic Church mirrored his hostility toward scholastic philosophy and theology: “soon no Thomist, Albertist, Scotist, or Ockhamist will be left in the world, but all will be simple children of God and true Christians” (Oberman 1966, 18–19). The Italian humanists attacked from a different direction, prizing historical scholarship over intricate metaphysics. By the seventeenth century, Thomas Hobbes and his contemporaries flaunted their scorn for the scholastics, who “converse in questions of matters incomprehensible” (Leviathan viii.27). It would not be until the eighteenth century, however, that these “moderns” began to drive the Thomists and other scholastics out of the universities. (On the reception of Aquinas over the centuries see Levering and Plested 2021.)

In 1879, Pope Leo XIII called for a revival in the study and teaching of Aquinas. One fruit of this encyclical was the founding of the definitive Leonine edition of Aquinas’s work. Another was a renewal of the old Thomistic picture of Aquinas as standing at the summit of philosophical and theological achievement, leaving subsequent developments—from Scotus to Descartes, Kant and beyond—to be dismissed as just so much decline and decay. Such zeal was hardly likely to be sustained for long, however, and the twentieth century witnessed a flourishing of Thomisms of all kinds, in scholars like Jacques Maritain, Etienne Gilson, Elizabeth Anscombe, and Alasdair MacIntyre. As more recent scholarship has deepened our understanding both of Aquinas and of his successors, we now have a much fuller picture of the richness of later medieval philosophy. Aquinas today, viewed as a philosopher, looks not so much like the culmination of an era, but rather like the brilliant beginning of Europe’s philosophical renaissance.


A. Aquinas’s Works

The definitive version of the original Latin, the Leonine edition, is slowly coming to completion:

Thomas Aquinas. Opera omnia, ed. Fratres Praedicatores (Rome: Commissio Leonina, 1882–), 50 vols.

Recent volumes are particularly useful for the extensive scholarly notes, which trace in detail the antecedents to Aquinas’s thought.

Readers satisfied with a roughly accurate Latin text may find it more convenient to consult online the searchable Corpus Thomisticum. This essential resource also provides electronic versions of many of the Leonine volumes, information on the best editions of works not yet available in the Leonine edition, and Schütz’s very useful Thomas-Lexikon.

Most of Aquinas is available in English translation, and is often available online. Thérèse Bonin maintains a comprehensive catalog. Listed here are only a few especially noteworthy translations.

Given the size and range of the corpus, no single-volume anthology can be adequate. Among the many attempts is

Thomas Aquinas. Basic Works, ed. Jeffrey Hause and Robert Pasnau (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2014).

This collection is based in part on a series of translations, the Hackett Aquinas, which offers a translation and commentary on key texts.

What follows lists the principal works and those minor works that have special philosphical interest. Not all of the dates are certain. For further details see the “Brief Catalogue” in Torrell 1993 [2022].

A1. Encyclopedic Theological Treatises

  • Scriptum super libros Sententiarum (The Commentary on Peter Lombard’s Sentences) (1252–56)

    A massive and wide-ranging work, composed during Aquinas’s term as bachelor of theology and the first part of his first term as master of theology. Until the Leonine version is published, the best Latin text is the edition by Pierre Mandonnet and Maria F. Moos (Paris: P. Léthielleux, 1929–47), which is complete through book IV distinction 22. The Aquinas Institute (Wyoming) is producing an online English translation that is nearing completion and looks to be of high quality.

  • Summa contra gentiles (1259–65)

    This is Aquinas’s second-most important work, after the Summa theologiae. Remarkably, the autograph manuscript has survived for much of this work and can be admired online (although Aquinas’s handwriting is notoriously difficult to read, even for experts). The best complete English translation, with the Latin text in a parallel column, is available online.

  • Summa theologiae (1267–73, unfinished after 3a 90)

    Aquinas’s masterpiece, which he began in Rome and worked on until near the end his life. The Leonine volumes for this work, from the nineteenth century, are no longer considered adequate, and will eventually be reedited. The best (and now mostly complete) full English translation is that of Alfred Freddoso, available online.

A2. Disputed Questions

  • On Truth (1256–59)

    Aquinas’s first and largest set of disputed questions, from his first term as master in Paris. The title refers to just the first of the 29 questions; the other 28 (making a total of 253 articles) take up many wide-ranging topics.

  • On God’s Power (1265–66)
  • On the Soul (1266–67)
  • On Spiritual Creatures (1267–68)
  • On Evil (De malo) (1270–71)
  • On the Virtues (1271–72)
  • On the Union of the Incarnate Word (1272)
  • Quodlibetal Questions (1256–59, 1268–72)

    By tradition, masters at Paris participated in disputations during Advent and Lent at which audience members might propose any topic at all. Aquinas’s large and varied collection of Quodlibetal Questions is split between his two terms as master, with quodlibets 7–11 dating from his first term and quodlibets 1–6 and 12 dating from his second term. There is now an English translation by Nevitt and Davies (OUP 2019).

A3. Brief Works (Opuscula)

  • On the Principles of Nature (De principiis naturae) (early 1250s)

    A rather conventional summary of medieval natural philosophy, written no later than Aquinas’s term in Paris as a bachelor and perhaps, judging from its content, even earlier than that. Its brevity and philosophical focus makes it useful for novices today. Stump and Chanderbhan translate it in the Hackett Basic Works volume.

  • On Being and Essence (De ente et essentia) (1252–56).

    A famous brief treatise on various foundational questions in metaphysics, dating from Aquinas’s time as bachelor in Paris. Peter King translates it in the Hackett Basic Works volume.

  • Compendium theologiae (begun in the early 1260s, unfinished)

    A relatively brief digest of material found at much greater length in the Summa theologiae and elsewhere.

  • On Kingship (De regno, or De regimine principum) (1266–67?, unfinished)
  • On the Unity of the Intellect (De unitate intellectus contra Averroistas) (1270)
  • On the Eternity of the World (1271)
  • On Separate Substances (1271 or later, unfinished)
  • On the Mixture of Elements (1269?)
  • On the Hidden Workings of Nature (De occultis operationibus naturae) (1268–72?)
  • On the Motion of the Heart (De motu cordis) (1273?)

A4. Philosophical Commentaries

Aquinas left many of his commentaries unfinished. Published versions sometimes incorporate material added by disciples, intended to complete the work.

  • De anima (1267–68)
  • De sensu et sensato (1268–69)
  • Physics (1269–70)
  • De interpretatione (Peri hermeneias) (1271, unfinished from ch. 10, 19b26)
  • Posterior Analytics (1271–72)
  • Nicomachean Ethics (1271–72)
  • Politics (around 1269–72, unfinished after III.8, 1280a7)
  • Metaphysics (around 1270–73)
  • De caelo et mundo (1272–73, unfinished from III.4, 302b29)
  • Meteorology (1273, unfinished after II.5, 363a20)
  • On Generation and Corruption (1272–73, unfinished after I.5, 322a33)
  • Boethius’s De trinitate (1257–59, unfinished)
  • Boethius’s De hebdomadibus (1271–72?)
  • Pseudo-Dionysius’s On the Divine Names (1266–68)
  • Liber de causis (1272)

A5. Biblical Commentaries

  • Isaiah (1251–52)
  • Jeremiah (1251–53)
  • Job (1263–65)
  • Catena aurea (1263–1268) — a continuous exposition of the Gospels, interweaving Patristic glosses
  • Matthew (1269–70)
  • John (1270–72)
  • Paul (1261?–73) — a sequence of commentaries covering all of the Pauline epistles
  • Psalms (1272–73, unfinished after Psalm 54)

B. Secondary Sources

Listed here are only works cited in the entry, which deliberately focuses on English-language sources. There are of course rich bodies of scholarship in many other languages.

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, 1987, William Ockham, 2 volumes, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Amerini, Fabrizio, 2009 [2013], Tommaso d’Aquino: Origine e fine della vita umana, Pisa: Edizioni ETS. Translated as Aquinas on the Beginning and End of Human Life, Mark Henninger (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Angier, Tom, 2021, Natural Law Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108580793
  • Ashworth, E. Jennifer, 2014, “Aquinas on Analogy”, in Jeffrey Hause (ed.), Debates in Medieval Philosophy, New York: Routledge, 232–42.
  • Băltuță [Baltuta], Elena, 2013, “Aquinas on Intellectual Cognition: The Case of Intelligible Species”, Philosophia, 41(3): 589–602. doi:10.1007/s11406-013-9481-y
  • Bazán, Bernardo C., 1997, “The Human Soul: From and Substance? Thomas Aquinas’s Critique of Eclectic Aristotelianism”, Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 64: 95–126.
  • Bradley, Denis J. M., 1997, Aquinas on the Twofold Human Good: Reason and Human Happiness in Aquinas’s Moral Science, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Brower, Jeffrey E., 2014, Aquinas’s Ontology of the Material World: Change, Hylomorphism, and Material Objects, New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198714293.001.0001
  • –––, 2016, “Aquinas on the Problem of Universals”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 92(3): 715–35. doi:10.1111/phpr.12176
  • Brower, Jeffrey E., and Susan Brower-Toland, 2008, “Aquinas on Mental Representation: Concepts and Intentionality”, Philosophical Review, 117(2): 193–243. doi:10.1215/00318108-2007-036
  • Brown, Christopher M., 2007, “Souls, Ships, and Substances”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 81(4): 655–68. doi:10.5840/acpq20078147
  • –––, 2021, Eternal Life and Human Happiness: Philosophical Problems, Thomistic Solutions, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Cohoe, Caleb, 2013, “There Must Be a First: Why Thomas Aquinas Rejects Infinite, Essentially Ordered, Causal Series”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 21(5): 838–56. doi:10.1080/09608788.2013.816934
  • Cory, Therese Scarpelli, 2015, “Rethinking Abstractionism: Aquinas’s Intellectual Light and Some Arabic Sources”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 53(4): 607–46. doi:10.1353/hph.2015.0074
  • –––, 2022, “The Nature of Cognition and Knowledge”, in Stump and White (eds) 2022: 153–83 (ch. 7). doi:10.1017/9781009043595.011
  • Cross, Richard, 1998, The Physics of Duns Scotus: The Scientific Context of a Theological Vision, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198269748.001.0001
  • Dales, Richard C., 1990, Medieval Discussions of the Eternity of the World, Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004246676
  • Davies, Brian, 2018, “The Summa Theologiae on What God Is Not”, in Hause (ed.) 2018: 47–67.
  • Davies, Brian and Eleonore Stump (eds.), 2012, The Oxford Handbook of Aquinas, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780195326093.001.0001
  • De Haan, Daniel, 2019, “Aquinas on Sensing, Perceiving, Thinking, Understanding, and Cognizing Individuals”, in E. Băltuță (ed.), Medieval Perceptual Puzzles: Theories of Sense Perception in the 13th and 14th Centuries, Leiden: Brill, 238–68.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, 2007, “St. Thomas and Analogy: The Logician and the Metaphysician”, in R. E. Houser (ed.), Laudemus viros gloriosos: Essays in Honor of Armand Maurer, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 132–45.
  • DeYoung, Rebecca Konyndyk, Colleen McCluskey, and Christina Van Dyke, 2009, Aquinas’s Ethics: Metaphysical Foundations, Moral Theory, and Theological Context, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Dougherty, Michael V., 2004, “On the Alleged Subalternate Character of Sacra Doctrina in Aquinas”, Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association, 77: 101–10. doi:10.5840/acpaproc20037716
  • Elders, Leo, 2009, “The Aristotelian Commentaries of St. Thomas Aquinas”, Review of Metaphysics, 63(1): 29–53.
  • Finnis, John, 1998, Aquinas: Moral, Political, and Legal Theory, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Frost, Gloria, 2022, Aquinas on Efficient Causation and Causal Powers, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781009225403
  • Gallagher, David M., 1994, “Free Choice and Free Judgment in Thomas Aquinas”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 76(3): 247–77. doi:10.1515/agph.1994.76.3.247
  • Glorieux, Palémon, 1927, Les premières polémiques Thomistes: le Correctorium Corruptorii “Quare”, Kain: Le Saulchoir.
  • Goris, Harm J. M. J., 1997, Free Creatures of an Eternal God: Thomas Aquinas on God’s Infallible Foreknowledge and Irresistible Will, Leuven: Peeters.
  • Goris, Harm J. M. J and Henk J. M. Schoot, 2017, The Virtuous Life: Thomas Aquinas on the Theological Nature of Moral Virtues, Leuven: Peeters.
  • Grisez, Germain, 1965, “The First Principle of Practical Reason: A Commentary on the Summa Theologiae, 1–2, Question 94, Article 2”, Natural Law Forum, 10: 168–201.
  • Hause, Jeffrey, 1997, “Thomas Aquinas and the Voluntarists”, Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 6(2): 167–82. doi:10.5840/medievalpt1997628
  • –––, 2007, “Aquinas on the Function of Moral Virtue”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 81(1): 1–20. doi:10.5840/acpq200781145
  • ––– (ed.), 2018, Aquinas’s Summa Theologiae: A Critical Guide, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781316271490
  • Hissette, Roland, 1977, Enquête sur les 219 articles condamnés à Paris le 7 mars 1277, Louvain: Publications universitaires.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1651 [1994], Leviathan, E. Curley (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Hochschild, Joshua P., 2019, “Aquinas’s Two Concepts of Analogy and a Complex Semantics for Naming the Simple God”, Thomist, 83(2): 155–84. doi:10.1353/tho.2019.0013
  • Hoffman, Paul, 2014, “Aquinas on Spiritual Change”, in Robert Pasnau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Medieval Philosophy, volume 2, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 98–103. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198718468.003.0005
  • Hoffmann, Tobias, 2022, “Grace and Free Will”, in Stump and White (eds.) 2022: 233–56 (ch. 10). doi:10.1017/9781009043595.015
  • Hoffmann, Tobias and Cyrille Michon, 2017, “Aquinas on Free Will and Intellectual Determinism”, Philosophers’ Imprint, 17(10): 1–36. [Hoffmann and Michon 2017 available online]
  • Irwin, Terence, 2007, The Development of Ethics: A Historical and Critical Study (Volume 1: From Socrates to the Reformation), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198242673.001.0001
  • Jenkins, John I., 1996, “Expositions of the Text: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Commentaries”, Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 5(1): 39–62. [Jenkins 1996 available online]
  • Jensen, Steven J., 2015, Knowing the Natural Law: From Precepts and Inclinations to Deriving Oughts, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Jordan, Mark D., 1982, “The Controversy of the Correctoria and the Limits of Metaphysics”, Speculum, 57(2): 292–314. doi:10.2307/2847458
  • Kenny, Anthony, 1969, The Five Ways: St. Thomas Aquinas’s Proofs of God’s Existence, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 1993, Aquinas on Mind, London/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203004944
  • –––, 1998, “Aquinas on Aristotelian Happiness”, in MacDonald and Stump (eds) 1998: 15–27.
  • Kent, Bonnie, 1995, Virtues of the Will: The Transformation of Ethics in the Late Thirteenth Century, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • King, Peter, 1994, “Scholasticism and the Philosophy of Mind: The Failure of Aristotelian Psychology”, in Tamara Horowitz and Allen I. Janis (eds.), Scientific Failure, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 109–38.
  • –––, 1998, “Aquinas on the Passions”, in MacDonald and Stump (eds) 1998: 101–32.
  • –––, 2000, “The Problem of Individuation in the Middle Ages”, Theoria, 66: 159–84. doi:10.1111/j.1755-2567.2000.tb01161.x
  • Klima, Gyula, 1997 [2002], “Man = Body + Soul: Aquinas’s Arithmetic of Human Nature”, in Timo Koistinen and Tommi Lehtonen (eds.), Philosophical Studies in Religion, Metaphysics, and Ethics: Essays in Honour of Heikki Kirjavainen, Helsinki: Luther Agricola Society. Reprinted in Brian Davies (ed.), Thomas Aquinas: Contemporary Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002, 257–73 (ch. 10).
  • –––, 2000, “Aquinas on One and Many”, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 11: 195–215.
  • –––, 2001, “Aquinas’ Proofs of the Immateriality of the Intellect from the Universality of Thought”, Proceedings of the Society for Medieval Logic and Metaphysics, 1: 19–28.
  • Knobel, Angela, 2021, Aquinas and the Infused Moral Virtues, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, 1997, The Metaphysics of Theism: Aquinas’s Natural Theology in Summa Contra Gentiles I, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/019924653X.001.0001
  • –––, 1999, The Metaphysics of Creation: Aquinas’s Natural Theology in Summa Contra Gentiles II, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0199246548.001.0001
  • Leftow, Brian, 1990, “Aquinas on Time and Eternity”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 64(3): 387–99. doi:10.5840/acpq199064315
  • –––, 2003, “Aquinas on Attributes”, Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 11(1): 1–41. doi:10.1017/S105706080300001X
  • Legge, Dominic, 2022, “Thomas Aquinas: A Life Pursuing Wisdom”, in Stump and White (eds) 2022: 7–28 (ch. 1). doi:10.1017/9781009043595.003
  • Levering, Matthew and Marcus Plested (eds), 2021, The Oxford Handbook of the Reception of Aquinas, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780198798026.001.0001
  • Lisska, Anthony J., 1996, Aquinas’s Theory of Natural Law: An Analytic Reconstruction, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198269670.001.0001
  • –––, 2016, Aquinas’s Theory of Perception: An Analytic Reconstruction, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198777908.001.0001
  • Loughran, Thomas J., 1999, “Aquinas, Compatibilist”, in F. Michael McLain and W. Mark Richardson (eds), Human and Divine Agency: Anglican, Catholic, and Lutheran Perspectives, New York: University Press of America, 1–39.
  • MacDonald, Scott, 1991a, “Aquinas’s Parasitic Cosmological Argument”, Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 1: 119–55. [MacDonald 1991a available online]
  • –––, 1991b, “Ultimate Ends in Practical Reasoning”, Philosophical Review, 100(1): 31–66. doi:10.2307/2185514
  • –––, 1993, “Theory of Knowledge”, in Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump (eds.), Cambridge Companion to Aquinas, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 160–95. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521431956.007
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump (eds), 1998, Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Marmodoro, Anna and Ben Page, 2016, “Aquinas on Forms, Substances and Artifacts”, Vivarium, 54(1): 1–21. doi:10.1163/15685349-12341310
  • Martin, C. F. J., 1997, Thomas Aquinas: God and Explanations, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Massey, Gerald J., 1999, “Medieval Sociobiology: Thomas Aquinas’s Theory of Sexual Morality”, Philosophical Topics, 27(1): 69–86. doi:10.5840/philtopics199927117
  • Mattison, William C., 2011, “Can Christians Possess the Acquired Cardinal Virtues?” Theological Studies, 72(3): 558–85. doi:10.1177/004056391107200304
  • Maurer, Armand, 1986, “Introduction”, in Thomas Aquinas, The Division and Methods of the Sciences: Questions V and VI of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius, 4th revised edition, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, VII–XLI.
  • McCluskey, Colleen, 2017, Thomas Aquinas on Moral Wrongdoing, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781316796917
  • McInerny, Ralph, 1996, Aquinas and Analogy, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • –––, 1997, Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas, revised edition, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Miner, Robert C., 2009, Thomas Aquinas on the Passions: A Study of Summa theologiae 1a2ae 22–48, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511576560
  • Montagnes, Bernard, 1963 [2004], La Doctrine de l’analogie de l’être d’après Saint Thomas D’Aquin, Louvain: Publications universitaires. Translated as The Doctrine of the Analogy of Being according to Thomas Aquinas, E. M. Macierowski and Pol Vandevelde (trans), Andrew Tallon (ed.), Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 2004.
  • Murphy, Mark C., 2001, Natural Law and Practical Rationality, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nevitt, Turner C., 2014, “Survivalism, Corruptionism, and Intermittent Existence in Aquinas”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 31(1): 1–19.
  • Oberman, Heiko A. (ed.), 1966, Forerunners of the Reformation: The Shape of Late Medieval Thought, New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston.
  • Ogden, Stephen R., 2022, Averroes on Intellect: From Aristotelian Origins to Aquinas’ Critique, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780192896117.001.0001
  • Oliva, Adriano, 2015, Amours: L’église, les divorcés remariés, les couples homosexuels, Paris: Cerf.
  • Osborne, Thomas M., Jr., 2005, Love of Self and Love of God in Thirteenth-Century Ethics, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Panaccio, Claude, 2001, “Aquinas on Intellectual Representation”, in Dominik Perler (ed.) Ancient and Medieval Theories of Intentionality, Leiden: Brill, 185–202. doi:10.1163/9789004453296_012
  • Pasnau, Robert, 1997, Theories of Cognition in the Later Middle Ages, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002, Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa theologiae 1a 75–89, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511613180
  • –––, 2011, Metaphysical Themes 1274–1671, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199567911.001.0001
  • –––, 2018, “On What There Is in Aquinas”, in Hause (ed.) 2018: 10–28.
  • Pawl, Timothy, 2012, “The Five Ways”, in Davies and Stump (eds.) 2012: 115–31 (ch. 9). doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780195326093.013.0010
  • Perler, Dominik, 2000, “Essentialism and Direct Realism. Some Late Medieval Perspectives”, Topoi, 19(2): 111–22. doi:10.1023/A:1006425008627
  • Pini, Giorgio, 2012, “The Development of Aquinas’s Thought”, in Davies and Stump (eds) 2012: 491–510 (ch. 37). doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780195326093.013.0038
  • Pope, Stephen J. (ed.), 2002, The Ethics of Aquinas, Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
  • Porro, Pasquale, 2012 [2016], Tommaso d’Aquino: Un Profile storic-filosofico, Roma: Carocci editore. translated as Thomas Aquinas: A Historical and Philosophical Profile, Joseph G. Trabbic and Roger W. Nutt (trans.), Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 2016.
  • Porter, Jean, 2018, “The Natural Law”, in Hause (ed.) 2018: 170–87.
  • –––, 2019, “Moral Virtues, Charity, and Grace: Why the Infused and Acquired Virtues Cannot Co-Exist”, Journal of Moral Theology, 8(2): 40–66.
  • Rhonheimer, Martin, 1987 [2000], Natur als Grundlage der Moral: die personale Struktur des Naturgesetzes bei Thomas von Aquin: eine Auseinandersetzung mit autonomer und teleologischer Ethik, Innsbruck: Tyrolia-Verlag. Translated as Natural Law and Practical Reason: A Thomist View of Moral Autonomy, Gerald Malsbary (trans.), (Moral Philosophy and Moral Theology 1), New York: Fordham University Press, 2000.
  • Rota, Michael W., 2004, “Substance and Artifact in Thomas Aquinas”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 21(3): 241–59.
  • Shanley, Brian J., 2007, “Beyond Libertarianism and Compatibilism: Thomas Aquinas on Created Freedom”, in Richard Velkley (ed.), Freedom and the Human Person, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 70–89.
  • Shields, Christopher and Robert Pasnau, 2016, The Philosophy of Aquinas, 2nd edition, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199301232.001.0001
  • Stenberg, Joseph, 2016a, “Aquinas on the Relationship Between the Vision and Delight in Perfect Happiness”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 90(4): 665–80. doi:10.5840/acpq201691499
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  • Stump, Eleonore, 2003, Aquinas, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203928356
  • –––, 2010, Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199277421.001.0001
  • –––, 2011, “The Non-Aristotelian Character of Aquinas’s Ethics: Aquinas on the Passions”, Faith and Philosophy, 28(1): 29–43. doi:10.5840/faithphil201128114
  • –––, 2018, Atonement, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198813866.001.0001
  • –––, 2022, “The Nature of Human Beings”, in Stump and White (eds) 2022: 126–50 (ch. 6). doi:10.1017/9781009043595.009
  • Stump, Eleonore and Thomas Joseph White (eds.), 2022, The New Cambridge Companion to Aquinas, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781009043595
  • Toner, Patrick, 2009, “Personhood and Death in St. Thomas Aquinas”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 26(2): 121–38.
  • Torrell, Jean-Pierre, 1993 [2022], L’Initiation à Saint Thomas d'Aquin: Sa personne et son oeuvre, Paris: Cerf. Translated as Saint Thomas Aquinas (Volume 1: The Person and His Work), Matthew K. Minerd and Robert Royal (trans), 3rd edition, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 2022.
  • –––, 1996 [2003], Saint Thomas d’Aquin, Maître Spirituel, Paris: Cerf; translated as Saint Thomas Aquinas (Volume 2: Spiritual Master), Robert Royal (trans.), Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 2003.
  • Van Dyke, Christina, 2012, “The End of (Human) Life as We Know It: Thomas Aquinas on Persons, Bodies, and Death”, Modern Schoolman, 89(3): 243–57. doi:10.5840/schoolman2012893/416
  • Wawrykow, Joseph P., 2012, “The Theological Virtues”, in Davies and Stump (eds.) 2012: 287–307 (ch. 22). doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780195326093.013.0023
  • Westberg, Daniel, 1994, Right Practical Reason: Aristotle, Action, and Prudence in Aquinas, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Wippel, John F., 1995a, “‘First Philosophy’ according to Thomas Aquinas”, in his Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 55–67.
  • –––, 1995b, “Thomas Aquinas and the Condemnations of 1277”, Modern Schoolman, 72(2): 232–72. doi:10.5840/schoolman1995722/317
  • –––, 1995c, “Thomas Aquinas on the Possibility of Eternal Creation”, in his Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 191–214.
  • –––, 2000, The Metaphysical Thought of Thomas Aquinas: From Finite Being to Uncreated Being, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wood, Adam, 2020, Thomas Aquinas on the Immateriality of the Human Intellect, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Thomas Aquinas in English: A Bibliography. A complete guide to English translations, faithfully maintained for many years by Thérèse Bonin.
  • The Aquinas Institute (Wyoming) is developing a sophisticated online reader, which displays Latin and English in parallel columns. This is a remarkably comprehensive and carefully designed tool, particularly useful for students seeking to read the Latin with the aid of an adjacent translation. It also offers a useful search function, in Latin and English. The translations, however, are often old and sometimes unreliable. Readers seeking translations for the purposes of careful study should take the time to seek out the best available version.
  • Corpus Thomisticum. The entire Latin corpus is available here, along with a sophisticated search engine (the Index Thomisticus) and many further resources for scholars.
  • Past Masters—available only through institutional subscriptions—offers most of Aquinas’s texts in English translation, in searchable form, although their translations are not always the best ones available.
  • McInerny, Ralph and John O’Callaghan, “Saint Thomas Aquinas”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta & Uri Nodelman (eds.), URL = <>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]


Thanks for their help and advice to Jeffrey Brower, Jeffrey Hause, Scott MacDonald, John Martino, Matthew Minerd, Christopher Shields, Joseph Stenberg, Matthew Wennemann, and Thomas Williams. Special thanks to Ed Zalta, the unmovable prime mover behind it all.

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Robert Pasnau <>

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