Notes to The Historical Controversies Surrounding Innateness

1. Kirk & Raven (1957), fragment 454, p. 343

2. Kirk & Raven (1957), fragment 538, p. 394

3. The key passages are Meno 80a–86c

4. The key passages are Phaedo 73c–78b

5. The Aristotelian account of perception, thought, and forms grows out of many sources, especially De Anima, iii, chapters 4–7.

6. Chomsky regularly uses the term ‘rationalist’ to describe his position, but his point is to stress the continuity of his linguistic nativism with the nativism of the Rationalist tradition. He does not share the traditional Rationalist commitment to a non-empirical form of intellectual insight into the ultimate nature of the the empirical world. Chomsky (1975) chapter 2, for example, argues that a priori and modal knowledge are based on wholly contingent features of our common-sense understanding and language system. This is the dominant view among nativist cognitive scientists.

7. Enquiry, sec. 2, footnote 1

8. Treatise, 1.1.1. paragraph 10

9. Callanan 2013: p3 fn6 provides a scorecard of opposing views on whether Kant is appropriately classified as a nativist. The following passage establishes the clear sense in which he is:

But there is also an original acquisition (as the teachers of natural right call it), and this of that which did not yet exist at all, and so did not belong to anything prior to this act. According to the Critique, these are, in the first place, the form of things in space and time, second, the synthetic unity of the manifold in concepts; for neither of these does our cognitive faculty get from objects as given therein in-themselves, rather it brings them about, a priori, out of itself. There must indeed be a ground for it in the subject, however, which makes it possible that these representations can arise in this and no other manner, and be related to objects which are not yet given, and this ground at least is innate. (On a Discovery, 8: 221, in Kant 2002: 312)

10. One could argue that Kant had only a cursory understanding of the versions of the Innateness doctrine as defended by Leibniz and Descartes, and that if he had understood them better, he might have understood his own place in the debate differently. Vanzo 2018, for instance, makes a plausible case that Kant did not fully appreciate the affinities of his position with Leibniz’s nativist views. One might also argue that Kant misunderstood Descartes view on the warrant for innate ideas.

11. “Crusius alone knew of a middle way: namely that a spirit who can neither err nor deceive originally implanted these natural laws in us. But, since false principles are often mixed in as well – of which this man’s system itself provides not a few examples – then, with the lack of sure criteria for distinguishing an authentic origin from a spurious one, the use of such a principle looks very precarious, since one can never know for sure what the spirit of truth or the father of lies may have put into us” (Prolegomena, 4: 319, in Kant 2002: 112).

12. The general idea here seems to be that Kant needs the Categories to play a normative, and not just a psychological role. For discussion see Beiser 2002: 168; See also Kemp Smith 1999: 290.

13. “… the concepts met with in metaphysics are not to be sought in the senses but in the very nature of the pure understanding, and that not as innate concepts but as concepts abstracted from the laws inherent in the mind (by attending to its actions on the occasion of an experience), and therefore as acquired concepts. … Such concepts never enter into any sensory representations as parts, and thus they could not be abstracted from such a representation in any way at all” (Inaugural Dissertation, §8, 2: 395, in Kant 1992a: 387–8).

14. The Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis [ref] that the particular language we speak inevitably shapes the structure of our thoughts is an example of a view that embraces just this possibility.

15. A clear statement of the view can be found in Ayer (1936)

16. Quine (1951) presents this position as a purification of the classical Empiricist stance.

17. Chomsky (1965) forcefully presents the poverty of the stimulus arguments against Empiricist accounts of language acquisition, and sketches a nativistic alternative.

Copyright © 2019 by
Jerry Samet <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free