The Historical Controversies Surrounding Innateness

First published Thu Jun 19, 2008; substantive revision Wed Mar 27, 2019

We are as we are and we live as we do because of the interplay of our inherent natures and the world around us. This much is uncontroversial. But it is natural to wonder about the extent of the contributions of the two broad factors and about the nature of the interactions. This is where the innateness controversy begins. In the history of philosophy, the focus of the innateness debate has been on our intellectual lives: does our inherent nature include any ideas, concepts, categories, knowledge, principles, etc, or do we start out with blank cognitive slates (tabula rasa) and get all our information and knowledge from perception. Nativists defend some variant of the first option, while Empiricists lean towards the second.

To modern ears this sounds like a straightforward empirical question that can only be addressed scientifically. But even if we grant that the philosophical controversy was to some extent premature – like Greek speculations about the ultimate constituents of the world – it is important to understand that the question loomed large in philosophy not only because of its inherent interest, but primarily because of what followed – or was thought to follow – from the competing positions. The innateness question was taken as a lynchpin in settling questions in morality, religion, epistemology, metaphysics, and so on.

A survey of the philosophical career of innateness reveals that although it is an easy doctrine to attack, it is a hard one to kill. Innateness has been in the philosophical limelight in two periods – each time flaring, and then receding. In the ancient world, it played a pivotal role in Plato’s philosophy, but was excluded from the Aristotelian system that came to dominate subsequent philosophical thinking. In the 17th and 18th century, it was revived. It played an important role in Descartes’ theory of knowledge, Locke mounted a sustained assault against it at the very beginning of his Essay, and Leibniz produced a detailed rebuttal against Locke. But the Lockean Empiricist approach carried the day, and innateness was written off as a backward and discredited view. Nineteenth century Kantianism, although potentially friendlier to innateness, left it on the sidelines as philosophically irrelevant. Recently, however, prompted by Noam Chomsky’s claims that findings in linguistics vindicate Nativism against Empiricism (see Chomsky 1965 for an early example), innateness has made a strong comeback; it is once again the subject of philosophical and scientific controversy.

1. Prehistory: Empedocles vs. Anaxagoras

Even before the competing positions on innateness were delineated, reflective thinkers were drawn to one or the other pole of the controversy. We can already see a precursor of the debate in the opposing theories of knowledge of the pre-Socratic philosophers Empedocles and Anaxagoras.

The poetic Empedocles, who speculated that reality is the product of ever-recurring cycles of Love and Strife, held that sensation, perception, and even wisdom, is a matter of knowing “like by like”.[1] His rival Anaxagoras held that “perception is by opposites”.[2] One way to read these obscure fragments is to see them as emblematic of two different ways of thinking about the mind. For Empedocles, the mind is made for the world. Mind grasps reality because it is pre-tuned to the world and resonates with it. For Anaxagoras, the world has to impress itself upon us; to shape our unformed minds into its form. This image of the world ‘informing’ the knower becomes the tabula rasa of 17th century Empiricism. But there is another connection. Empedocles, with his cycles of Love and Strife, is unabashedly speculative. Anaxagoras, on the other hand, comes down to us as “dry, clear-headed, …[having a] common sense attitude”. This difference in intellectual personality is reflected in the subsequent debate. Empedocles would be very much at home with the Nativistic Rationalist philosophers and their “rather dreamlike vision of the universe”, as Bernard Williams has put it. The British Empiricists are more likely to share Anaxagoras’ commonsensical impatience with such flights of fancy.

One last parallel worth noting while we have these early figures in view is the very radical nature of Empedocles’ Nativism. The fragment can be read as saying that all our modes of understanding are somehow mirrored in our makeup. Despite their very different philosophical commitments and interests, ancient, modern, and contemporary Nativists are all drawn to this totalistic version of the doctrine. It is not so much that they all defend this radical position, but they are all at least attracted to it. The prevailing thought is that something about the nature of concepts (ideas, knowledge etc.) per se pushes us to the Nativist position.

3. Plato (and the Aristotelian Tradition)

As with most philosophical matters, Plato is the first in the Western tradition to address the innateness question directly and to work out some of its broader implications. The issue first comes up in the Meno, where he puts forth the doctrine of anamnesis, which holds that all learning is recollection, that everything we will ever learn is already in us before we are taught.[3] According to this view, perception and inquiry remind us of what is innate in us. In the dialogue, Socrates supports this view by showing that by simply asking an uneducated slave the right questions, the slave can ‘discover for himself’ a version of the Pythagorean theorem. Socrates does not elaborate the anamnesis claim as much as we would like. Among other things, it is not clear what counts as knowledge in this context, what exactly is innate, or how the innate interacts with perception and/or inquiry to give rise to knowledge. Still, Nativists have treated the slave-episode in the Meno as a touchstone for their view (‘Platonism’ has at different times referred to the innateness doctrine). Apart from the interpretive problems just noted, the Meno has never been treated as a significant defense of Nativism, because it is too easy to doubt Socrates’ claim that the slave has not been told the solution. Skeptics see Socrates’ ‘questioning’ as really implicitly feeding the slave the right answers. The upshot is that the demonstration has remained famous as a pedagogical tour de force, but not as a compelling defense for the doctrine of recollection.

In the later dialogue Phaedo, Socrates argues that the notion of equality involved in perceiving a pair of sticks as equal could not have its source in experience and therefore must be innate.[4] Here the focus is not on knowledge per se, but on concept-application, and Plato introduces the theory of forms as part of his explanation: we have an innate grasp of the form Equality, and this (grasp of the) form is somehow involved in our perceiving sticks as equal. Here again the case is less than compelling for at least two reasons: first, it is hard to pin down exactly how the equality argument is supposed to go, and second, we are still not sure about the content of Plato’s theory of forms.

Despite the weaknesses in the arguments, Plato’s discussions begin to put key Nativist pieces into play. One could argue, following Whitehead’s famous remark, that all the key elements in subsequent Nativist theorizing are anticipated in Plato. Especially important is (i) the form of argument (now termed the poverty of the stimulus argument): some x must be innate because of the inadequacy of sensory experience, and (ii) the focus on mathematical knowledge and concepts.

Though the innateness doctrine is, strictly speaking, an hypothesis about cognitive development, it is attractive to Plato because of its deeper metaphysical and methodological consequences. In the Meno, innateness solves what is sometimes termed the paradox of inquiry. The paradox: inquiry into the nature of x only makes sense if we don’t know the nature of x, and we have a way to determine if a candidate account of x’s nature is correct. But if we don’t know the nature of x, how are we supposed to determine whether a solution is correct? Plato’s anamnesis solution sees inquiry as a kind of deep memory recall. The right answer to our question is already within us. Inquiry, when successful, reminds us of that answer, in the same way that we are reminded of the name that goes with a face. Once the name is consciously brought to mind, we (somehow) know we have it. In this way, innateness provides a rationale for Socrates’ philosophical practice. We once grasped the transcendent Ideas that represent the real nature of things. The trace of that earlier understanding remains in our souls, waiting to be awakened by inquiry. So it makes sense to embark on a philosophical search for the nature of Truth, Justice, Piety, Courage, and so on.

Given innateness, Socrates ultimately arrives at a doctrine of pre-existence – that there is a stage of our existence, before this life, in which we came by our knowledge – and he goes on to use pre-existence in an argument for the immortality of the soul. This connection between innateness and immortality prompts Socrates’ deathbed discussion of innateness in the Phaedo, where the topic of discussion is the immateriality and immortality of the soul. Plato seems to be aware that the connection between Nativism and immortality is tenuous, but the purported tie will haunt (or edify, depending on one’s perspective) Nativism as it evolves in the modern period.

Plato is the ur-Nativist, so one might have expected Aristotle to be the ur-Empiricist. They do disagree on innateness, but assigning Aristotle a place in the innateness controversy is complicated. Aristotelian thinking rejects Platonic Nativism, in large part because it rejects Plato’s poverty of the stimulus argument. The key here is the Aristotelian rejection of the theory of transcendent forms. For Aristotelians, the form of a thing is not a transcendent reality that the thing strives for and fails to reach, but is rather part and parcel of the thing itself. Material things are forms embodied in matter. For Aristotle, our grasp of the nature or form of things is based in perception, which he understands as a process in which the form of things – the sensible as well as the intelligible form – is conveyed to the mind (and the matter left behind).[5] So there is no poverty of the stimulus to motivate the Nativist account. Variations on this anti-Nativist approach dominated European thought for two millennia, and Aristotle’s more down-to-earth and less-speculative approach to philosophy is reflected in 17th and 18th century Empiricism. But it would obscure too many differences – especially in their views of perception and reason – to put Aristotle at the head of the Empiricist line.

4. The Rationalist Deployment of Nativism: Descartes & Leibniz

Intelligibility is at the heart of the revival of the innateness doctrine in the modern period. From the very start of the Western tradition, it has been widely accepted that we not only sense the world, but that we also make sense of it; that it is not only sensible but also intelligible. Platonism explains intelligibility in terms of the innate forms that we are reminded of by sense-experience. Aristotelianism explains intelligibility in terms of a richer theory of perception – viz., it holds that we receive the intelligible nature of things from the things themselves. The scientific revolution of the 17th century, with its stress on the distinction between primary and secondary qualities and its materialist conception of the physical world, undercut the Aristotelian view of perception completely. The problem can be illustrated with the new account of vision. What happens when we see, according to the new scientific picture, is that light bouncing off an object carries a pattern of motion to the eye. These motions cause motions in the brain, and (somehow) conscious visual experience results. How can we explain the richness of our conception of the world given that only motions reach the sense organs? There seems to be no natural way to incorporate the transmission of Aristotelian intelligible forms into this account, so the problem of intelligibility returns. In the Second Meditation, Descartes exposes this gap between what the senses receive and what the mind knows and understands. Considering a piece of wax, which presents itself to us as a contingent set of actual and possible sensory images, he asks how we come to understand it in the way scientists must – as an inherently colorless, odorless, persistent object with an underlying nature that is subject to mathematical laws? The answer, for Descartes, is that we all have an abstract, non-sensory idea of a physical object. Sense-perception makes it possible for us to ‘fill out’ this abstract idea with the contingent details of our actual situation. But intelligibility, our most general understanding of the world – of physical objects, of space, of causality, of God, and so on – is grounded in these abstract ideas. But where do these general abstract ideas come from, given the ‘poverty’ of sense? Nativism now seems an attractive answer. We must come into the world pre-loaded with the categories (concepts, principles, general ideas, etc) that will enable us to make sense of what we actually see, hear, etc. Reason can mine this innate endowment to arrive at an apriori understanding of things.

One can see the concept of innateness at work behind the scenes in Descartes’ wax argument, but that passage is designed more to rid us of the idea that our deepest understanding of things comes from the senses than to defend innateness. It is in working out the implications of the wax discussion that we arrive at an innate abstract concept of spatial extension. Innateness is also at work, but again behind the scenes, in the central argument of the Meditations that takes us from the fact that we have an idea of God to the existence of God outside the mind. This (innate) idea of an infinite being (God’s ‘signature’ in us his creatures, as Descartes has it) is what makes it possible for us to know that there is a world beyond our thoughts and that our thoughts are not systematically mistaken. But in the discussion in Meditation III, Descartes again does not feature the concept of innateness – when and how we’ve come by our idea of God is less to the point than that we have it and could not have constructed it from our thoughts about our own mind. What’s more, that argument takes as a given a causal principle to the effect that the cause of an idea must have at least as great a ‘degree of formal reality’ (read: reality) as the ‘objective reality’ (read: the degree of reality of the object/content) of the idea. The principle is arcane, and it’s hard to imagine how Descartes could have explained its availability to the Meditator except by claiming that it rests on a clear and distinct insight into the nature of causality, which would presumably have to be given innately. In both these arguments, as in most of his main works, Descartes does not address the concept of innateness head-on (the outburst in his Notes Directed Against a Certain Program, which includes a defense of the radical view that all our ideas are innate, is the most notable exception). Part of the problem might be that it is not easy to integrate the claim that there are innate ideas or principles with Descartes’ identification of mind and consciousness. What is innate is in the mind prior to experience. He suggests at one point that ideas may be in the mind innately in the way that gout may run in a family. To the extent that this is read as a propensity theory, it will come in for heavy criticism in the Empiricist attack on innateness.

Leibniz, the other important Rationalist defender of innateness, elaborates the theory in a number of important ways in his New Essays on Human Understanding. He famously challenges Locke’s analogy of the mind as blank slate with a competing image of the mind as a block of marble whose veins already mark out the shape of Hercules (52). A more significant point is his sharpening of the poverty of the stimulus claim. He argues that our experience of the world is always of contingent particulars, but our knowledge can be general, and sometimes necessary (50). Going back to the Meno example, the slave can see that the squares Socrates has scratched out in the dirt stand in a certain relation, but he ends up knowing that such a connection must hold of any possible set of squares that meets Socrates’ initial description; that it holds – to use a phrase Leibniz introduced – in all possible worlds. Leibniz argues that rationality must involve more than induction from contingent experience. It must ultimately rely on innate ideas and principles that allow us to grasp not just how things happen to be, but also why they must be that way.

Leibniz also addresses the question of how the innateness doctrine needs to be integrated into a broader epistemology and theory of mind. Among his most important contributions in this area: (i) the defense of unconscious mental states (53), (ii) the suggestion that not all of our innate endowment needs to be realized as (unconscious) ideas and thoughts, but might instead be ‘procedural’ – inborn ways of thinking and reasoning (84), (iii) a clear distinction between something’s being innate in us and its being known innately, and (iv) the provocative idea, also hinted at in Descartes, that our innate endowment is not simply a grab-bag of elements that God thought it would be good for us to start out with, but is in some way a systematic reflection of our nature – for example, the fact that we are substances and can reflect on our natures somehow provides us with the innate idea of substance (as Leibniz has it: we are “innate to ourselves” (51–2)). Leibniz, like Plato, saw the innateness issue as being the most important point of disagreement between himself and Locke, and perhaps as the central issue in philosophy. He suspected that Locke’s anti-Nativism was an indirect attack on the immaterial soul and therefore a challenge to the idea of the afterlife and immortality, and therefore a challenge to religion, to ethics, and to public order.

Finally, we note that there are really two distinct but related Leibnizian philosophies. The foregoing represents Leibniz’s attempt to ‘mainstream’ his thought and contribute to the broader 17th century controversy over science, epistemology, and innateness. But there is another Leibniz that we find in his more speculative, more Empedoclean, metaphysical writings, particularly the Monadology. Leibniz’ goal there is presciently like the work of contemporary string theorists – i.e., to look behind the scientific picture and lay out the still-deeper ontological and metaphysical nature of reality. The relevant point for us is that the ultimate simple elements in this system – the individual ‘monads’ – contain representations of the world beyond themselves, but these representations are not caused by the world. For Leibniz, world-to-mind causality is only an appearance. The reality is that each monad contains, as part of its essential nature, a preloaded set of representations of the world. The sequential ‘unfolding’ or ‘playing out’ of these representations can be thought of, in the case of minds, as a stream of consciousness. But the monads do not interact; instead, the streams are coordinated by a pre-established divine harmony (Leibniz’s analogy is a pair of synchronized clocks). The upshot of all this is that we arrive (again) at the radical conclusion that all thought and experience is innate. There can be no external origin for a mental element in Leibniz’s monadology, and the same can be said for the metaphysics of Spinoza, the third of the great Rationalists.

The three Nativist thinkers we have so-far discussed also happen to be Rationalists; that is, they all hold that Reason allows us to go beyond experience and to arrive at a more profound grasp of the world. There is a natural affinity between Nativism and Rationalism, but it needs to be stressed that despite the tendency to identify the two, they are different. Nativism is about the initial conditions of our mental life. Rationalism is about the character of what we can know. Nativism is a supporting element in these larger Rationalist philosophies. But this raises a question that perceptive critics of 17th century Rationalism asked – viz., even if it were granted that there are innate concepts and principles, how can they support Rationalism unless we know independently that they are correct? Otherwise, we have no warrant to hold that these innate materials reveal the ultimate nature of the world (let alone all possible worlds). It is tempting to think that the 17th century response would be to add the premise that such innate ideas and principles are God-given, and God would not deceive us. But this reply is inadequate. First, it is hard to avoid the charge of circularity, but second, it is also dogmatic about God’s plans. How do we know, as one critic put it, that the (purported) innate materials we start with are not meant to be burnt away by experience, in the manner of the natural wild growth of soil before it is cultivated?

As it happens, the Rationalist can resist the temptation to invoke God, and avoid the dead-end to which it leads. For Descartes, the presence in us of innate materials is of course a contingent fact, but the warrant for the deeper truths we derive from what is innate does not involve any premises about their origin. It is because we have innate ideas that we can think of mind and extension in the abstract way we do. But the principle that matter (extension) cannot think is an a priori truth (according to Descartes) because we see clearly and distinctly that it is holds. Clarity-and-distinctness as a criterion of truth raises its own difficulties, but the difficulties are not the obvious and devastating ones raised above. Once we disentangle Nativism from Rationalism, we can look back and identify the non-Nativist Rationalist elements in Aristotle, and see Rationalist elements in the Empiricist and arch anti-Nativist Locke. Both present us with forms of Rationalism without Nativism. By the same light, contemporary nativists inspired by Chomsky’s Linguistic Nativism are emphatically anti-Rationalist.[6]

5. Empiricism and the Attack on Nativism: Locke and Hume

The modern debate about innateness really begins with Locke’s polemic against innate principles and innate ideas in the opening chapters of his Essay Concerning Human Understanding, which happens to also be the founding document of modern Empiricism. The point of the polemic is to delegitimize innateness as a candidate explanation of our knowledge and understanding, and to thereby leave the field to the Empiricist account that is developed in the rest of the Essay. The thrust of Locke’s arguments is two-fold: first, that the facts Nativists cite in favor of their views are not facts at all; second, that even if the facts were granted for the sake of argument, Empiricist accounts are preferable, because they are simpler. The simplicity resides in the fact that both parties accept a role for experience in knowledge acquisition. Empiricists presume there is only experience; Nativists think there is experience plus innate principles and ideas. If we can account for knowledge without innate ideas, principles, and so on, the Empiricist wins. Given the logic of the situation as Locke understands it, the whole polemical negative attack on innateness is almost beside the point. The real epistemological prize he is after can only be won by providing a satisfactory positive innateness-free account of how knowledge is produced from experience. But Locke is probably right in thinking that his Empiricist doctrines will be more convincing if there is no Nativist alternative to challenge them.

Why, according to Locke, is Nativism not only unnecessary but illegitimate? One prominent theme is that if there were innate principles in the mind – his example is Whatsoever is, is – we would be aware of them, and they would therefore be universally assented to. But, he argues, children and idiots cannot even make sense of such claims, let alone assent to them. He goes on to argue that various fallback positions – assent when they understand, assent when they begin to reason, capacity to assent under appropriate conditions – all reduce the claim to a sort of triviality. The upshot is that innateness is either a real alternative to Empiricism but obviously false, or trivially true but not incompatible with Empiricism.

Underlying much of Locke’s attack is the Cartesian view that to claim something is ‘in the mind’, innately or not, is to give it a place in our conscious awareness. Leibniz’s bold hypothesis of non-conscious mental states would, if successful, sweep aside most of Locke’s arguments against innateness. But we need to keep in mind that the polemics in the Essay, though they were historically influential, are almost a sideshow. The real issue is whether the Empiricist can construct a satisfactory account of human knowledge without adverting to any innate ideas and principles. To meet this challenge, Locke (and to an even greater extent Hume) offered what may be termed adequacy of the stimulus counterarguments. Locke constructs a theory of experience (perception and reflection) as the source of all our ideas, sketches an account of the mental faculties that can be brought to bear on these ideas, and applies these materials to our ideas of infinity, number, space, substance, our understanding of general principles of causality, and so on. These were the abstract ideas and principles that Rationalists had claimed could not be derived from perceptual experience. Locke wants to demonstrate that such ideas and principles can be acquired without the need for any innate ‘pre-seeding’. Locke believes that the key to intelligibility and understanding lies in a proper appreciation of what our faculty of Reason can accomplish when set to work on the ideas received in our experience.

In considering Locke’s execution of this plan in the Essay we discover a trend that grows stronger in subsequent Empiricist thinkers like Hume and his 19th and 20th century successors. One can be easily misled into thinking that there was a general agreement on both sides of this controversy about the explanandum: we can call that our understanding, or simply the intelligibility of the world. The innateness controversy would then be about which theory can provide the best explanation of this agreed-upon ‘Understanding’. But this positivistic paradigm of the dynamics of theory-selection does not fit the real debate. A Kuhnian perspective is closer to the truth. Empiricists inevitably reconfigured the explanandum – some elements of the original explanandum were to be (better) explained by the Empiricist account, but a good deal of it was to be explained away as Rationalist over-reaching. Our earlier example of Descartes’ a priori claim that matter cannot think is a case in point. Locke’s system was criticized for not being able to exclude the possibility of thinking matter. But for Locke, that possibility was not excludable, despite Descartes’ clear and distinct perception to the contrary. So Locke does not accept the explanatory burden of providing an Empiricist account of how it is that the Understanding grasps the falsity of materialism and the truth of dualism. Our knowledge of the world does not extend as far as the Rationalist thinks, and the true explanatory burden is therefore lighter than the Rationalist makes it out to be. This pattern of explaining away reaches its culmination in Hume, who sees more clearly than Locke that the fact that the mind can make the world intelligible is itself a philosophical presumption that needs to be explained away. Hume replaces it with a naturalistic account of how we track the way the world appears to us, and collate the results to guide us in the future. Our understanding of the world, in Hume’s philosophy, is thinned out into something the Rationalists would not count as Understanding at all; his conception of human reason is, appropriately enough, a pale shadow of their Reason.

The doctrinally pure(r) Empiricism that we find in Hume also contains a surprising twist for the innateness doctrine. The alternative to innateness, at least in Locke’s shorthand form, is that ideas come via the senses from the world outside us. But it can be argued that Hume’s Empiricism has no room for thinking of a world outside us, and certainly not for ideas as copies of properties of things or as caused by things in that world (a point also stressed by the other prominent British Empiricist, Bishop Berkeley). Hume, perhaps a bit tongue-in-cheek, tells us that the innateness debate is totally wrong-headed and that as he sees it, all our impressions are innate, in that they are original to the mind.[7] Along these lines, one can argue that for Hume, innateness is a red herring. What matters to Empiricism is not the history of ideas in the mind and the before or after, but the nature of those ideas. Specifically, what’s foundationally important for Humean Empiricism is not anti-Nativism, but what we might call experientialism, the thesis that all our ideas are representations of particular sensory states. We can summarize this and say they must be ‘copies of experiences’, but for Hume, it has no philosophical import if we one day learn how to tinker with a fetus to produce in its mind an ‘innate’ representation of the taste of chocolate. What counts is that the idea produced be experiential in the right sense. For Hume we will never be able to tinker away to produce an abstract idea of causal power, because there is no such idea – all ideas are experiential or constructs of such. (These points, I think, can explain why Hume is so cavalier about the famous missing shade of blue that seems to not be copied from experience – i.e., because it is still an experiential idea.)[8]

6. The Kantian Turn

Kant is usually given short shrift in discussions of the history of the Nativism-Empiricism controversy. He is certainly not an Empiricist; he sees his philosophy as a response to the challenge of Humean Empiricism. Nevertheless, he is critical of Rationalist versions of the Innateness doctrine at every turn. In my view, Kant is a Nativist.[9] The reason for the anomalies is that he is much more than a Nativist, and assigns a very different role to what is innate in us than the role assigned by his Rationalist predecessors.

The ‘more’ here is Kant’s distinctive approach to metaphysics and epistemology; his Transcendental Idealism. Hume had argued that since knowledge is based on experience, our knowledge of the world could not go beyond registering and mining regularities in that experience. The prospect of what Kant called synthetic a priori knowledge – of an understanding of the necessary structuring principles of reality – was beyond us. Kant takes it as a given that we have such knowledge and sets out to construct a system that explains how such knowledge is possible. His response to Hume’s challenge is to argue that the distinctive structure of experience is a function of our nature. We impose regularities. If these regularities are recognized as our contribution, and we understand the structuring principles that are at work, we can make sense of the actuality of synthetic apriori knowledge. But the price we pay is that this is knowledge of the world of appearances, not about things as they are in themselves.

Kant divides these ordering principles into the Forms of Sensible Intuition and the Categories. Space and Time are pre-experiential ordering principles that give us sense experience of a spatial and temporal world. The Categories play a parallel role for the understanding. Through the category of Causality, for example, we impose causal structure on the events that we perceive. This imposed structure allows us to move from the subjectivity of successive sensations to experience of an objective world. Consider an analogy: the pixel structure of every picture that a digital camera takes is the result of an ordering principle imposed on every photograph by the nature of the camera. The pixel structure of the representations does not capture a feature of the camera-independent reality. Similarly, the spatiotemporality and categorical structure of our experience is not a feature of a mind-independent reality.

Kant’s main complaint against Rationalist Nativism was that it accepted that the innate had to correspond to an independent reality, but it could not explain how we could establish such a correspondence or use it to account for the full range of our knowledge. In this, it failed to meet Hume’s challenge.[10] Kant finds the position guilty of a number of related fatal errors.

  1. Warrant. How can we establish that innate principles are true of the world? In the Prolegomena he criticizes the Innateness doctrine of his contemporary Crusius because even if a benevolent non-deceiving God was the source of the innate principles, we have no way to reliably determine which candidate principles are innate and which may pass as such (for some).[11]
  2. Psychologism. At times Kant seems to suggest that the psychologism of Rationalist Nativism is itself a problem and makes it impossible to explain how we can get knowledge of objective necessary connections (as opposed to subjective necessities).[12]
  3. Modal concepts. Callanan 2013 reads Kant as offering a Hume-style argument that Rationalist Nativism cannot explain how we could come to have a concept of objective necessity, if all we had were innate psychological principles.

The root problem of Rationalist Nativism, as seen through the lens of Kant’s Transcendental Idealism, is that it needs to say more than that something – a framework of concepts, ideas, principles, etc. – is innate in us. It needs to say that it is only in us. It must acknowledge that we create the structure that we find in our experience. The problems of Rationalist Nativism all arise from trying to get from the mind’s structuring to the world’s inherent structure. Once we drop the idea that we are aiming for the world’s inherent, mind-independent structure, the problems (should) dissolve.

From Plato until Kant, Nativism was supposed to serve Realism. Whatever the vision of reality was – Forms for Plato, matter and mind for Descartes, etc. – our grasp of that reality was possible because we were provided with a map to that reality before we set out. Kant rejects the Realist aspirations of this tradition. For him, we can never understand the ultimate nature of things as they are in themselves. Our theoretical knowledge can only go as deep as the structure we impose. The only necessity we can grasp is the one we have spontaneously made.

We’ve discussed Kant’s main complaint about the Nativist tradition, at least as a reply to the Empiricist challenge. But he also argues that we have no innate representations of Space, of Time, of Causality, or of any of the ordering principles we impose apriori (Zoeller 1989). To return to our earlier analogy: the initial state of the camera includes no pictures/representations of the innate abstract pixel structure that the camera imposes. But unlike the camera, we can acquire representations of these ordering constraints – these Kant terms ‘pure apriori ideas’ of Space, of Time, of Causality, of Substance, and so on. These pure apriori ideas play a crucial role in our understanding of how knowledge of mathematics and metaphysics and natural science is possible. In this respect Kant agrees with Locke that there are no innate principles or ideas to be ‘found’ in us. Both hold that all our ideas have their origin in experience. But Locke thinks that we build these ideas by abstracting from experience and recombining abstracted elements. Kant holds that such representations or ideas cannot be abstracted from experience; they must be the product of careful reflection on the nature of experience.[13]

The camera analogy can help highlight an important shift. Imagine that our camera is damaged and its resolution in part of the screen is diminished. This newly acquired constraint will be reflected in every subsequent photo, and this low-resolution element would be an ‘apriori’ feature of each photo: it would be a contribution of the representational structure of the camera, not of the scene. The point is that the key feature of Kant’s framework elements is the role they play in structuring experience, not whether they are present as part of the initial condition. In principle, acquired changes could play this role.[14] In this respect, Kant shifted the epistemological focus away from genetic questions of origins to questions about sources of warrant. It could be argued that this shift moved innateness to the periphery of philosophical concern until its 20th century revival.

7. The (Temporary) Triumph of Anti-Nativism

In terms of the historical contest, Empiricism emerged triumphant, and as inevitably happens in such victories, anti-Nativism triumphed over Nativism. The doctrine of innate ideas came to be seen as backward and unscientific, as inextricably tied to discredited metaphysical and theological doctrines, and as therefore incompatible with a naturalistic approach to human nature. Empiricism developed very much along Humean lines (and with Anaxagoras’ anti-speculative hard-headedness). The 20th century Logical Positivists and Logical Empiricists agreed with Hume that we have no a priori knowledge about the intelligible structure of the world.[15] A priori knowledge is only possible in the formal sciences, and this is so only because such knowledge is ultimately about the structure of our concepts and/or our language. Others, following Quine, have gone a step further and followed John Stuart Mill’s lead in rejecting all claims to knowledge of apriori necessary truths. For Quine, only our sensory evidence ultimately warrants the claim that 2+2=4.[16] On both views, once we get straight about the true nature and extent of our knowledge, Nativism turns out to be an unnecessary extravagance.

Even without its 17th century metaphysical and theological ‘baggage’, the Nativist view, and the entire controversy surrounding it, came to be seen as born in conceptual confusion about the proper task of a theory of knowledge. Real philosophical questions are about the nature of our ideas and about the structure and justification of our knowledge. Nativism deflects attention from these issues, and distracts us with empirical claims about the genesis of ideas and beliefs. Kantianism, the main 19th century alternative to the Empiricist project, presses many of these ideas. The modern scientific temperament was influenced by both these approaches, and eventually to be identified with Empiricism. We learn about the world only from our perceptual encounter with it; nothing is revealed to us beforehand. So innateness was triply condemned: it was born of superstitious religious thinking, it is empirically false, and it is philosophically beside the point.

8. Conclusion: Choosing Sides

Although the battleground for the historical controversy over innateness was epistemology, if we take one step back we see the Rationalist defense of the doctrine as part of a broader set of metaphysical, theological, and ethical commitments. Different Nativists would highlight different elements, but the underlying picture of human nature that emerges from the Nativist side of the historical debate is something like this. We human beings, distinct from all other created things, are not fully of this material world. We are guided in our thought and action by a special gift from our creator, who has seen fit to implant in our souls the deeper truth of the nature of the world, and special guidance about how we are to act in it. We must discover this inner truth, and adhere to it in the face of the often-distracting course of our experience.

Looking at Locke as the voice for the other side of the controversy, we find a very different set of motivations. Nativism makes understanding seem too much like inherited wealth. It suggests that without our innate legacy we would not have the resources to understand the world we live in. To this extent, Nativism stands against the ethos of individual initiative. It can also be too easily abused as a tool of intellectual authoritarianism, because those who are not up to the task of uncovering these rarified innate truths must take their lead from those who are. For the Empiricist this is an invitation to superstition, obscurity, and abuse. The Empiricist does not see our understanding as in any way given to us as a gift. It is the product of our individual labor. God has given all of us the general ability to reason, and this includes the ability to acquire knowledge from experience; it is our job to exercise that ability. We fully own our knowledge: we collect the raw materials and add our mental labor to create it. Locke is more drawn to the dignity of the worker than to the status of the aristocrat who has received a special inherited honor.

The factors that drove Locke’s rejection of Nativism ultimately led, in no small part through Hume’s philosophy, to the now-dominant naturalistic picture of human beings. On this picture we humans are material beings continuous with the rest of the natural world, we have no divine element in our nature and no divine guidance to help us along, and no recourse but to build our understanding of our world on our experience. But I close with two points about these developments. The first has to do with Locke, our arch anti-Nativist, and it is that he would have been horrified at what his Empiricism has wrought. The underlying Rationalist picture I sketched two paragraphs back is a picture that Locke would, with some small reservations, have accepted. He was a dualist and a theist, he believed in an afterlife, and he saw our god-given faculty of Reason as capable of discovering the most important truths about our world and our lives – i.e., the existence of God and the nature of our moral duties. The second point is that even though our contemporary naturalism was inspired by anti-Nativist Empiricism, it has seen a revival of Nativist thinking. The turning point in this revival, Chomsky’s work in linguistics, is an area set apart from the concerns that energized the historical controversy over innateness.[17] But contemporary research in cognitive development, genetics, evolutionary psychology, and other fields has extended Chomsky’s Nativist thinking to the very concepts and principles that were at the heart of the historical debate (god, morality, personhood/mind, causality, mathematics, basic ontology, etc.).


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