Notes to Insolubles

1. Singular insolubile, with the stress on the antepenultimate syllable.

2. “Eubulides the Milesian belongs to Euclides’s school. He raised many arguments in dialectic: the Liar, the Unnoticed, Electra, the [Man] in a Veil, the Heap, the Horns, the Bald Head.”

3. This delightful although rather free translation comes from Stock 1908, p. 36. It is quoted in Mates 1961, p. 42.

4. Gellius’s wording makes it likely that he intended a situation more like the one Aristotle discusses in Sophistical Refutations 25 (where someone first tells a lie, but then takes it back by revealing that his first statement was a lie) than a real Liar-type paradox. (For the difference, see Spade 1973 and section 1.3 below.) Still, Gellius’s words might have been enough to suggest the Liar paradox to a medieval logician, if only they had been read.

5. For a partial list of such discussions, see Spade 1973, p. 296 n. 24. It is sometimes observed that Epimenides’s statement is not really a paradox of the Liar type at all. If he did say “The Cretans [i.e., all Cretans] are always liars, evil beasts, slow bellies”, then his statement is true only if it is false, since he himself is a Cretan and so always lying. Thus it cannot be true. But if it is false, all that follows is that some Cretans are not always liars and evil beasts and slow bellies. It does not follow that Epimenides’s own remark is not a lie, and so it does not follow that it is not false. Hence there is no real paradox at all; Epimenides’s statement is just false. This much is correct about what Epimenides said. But St. Paul (or whoever wrote the epistle) goes on to say in the very next verse (Titus 1:13) “This witness is true”. Hence there was ample opportunity for a reader of this text to be introduced to the Liar Paradox, even if he did not already know about it.

6. For details of the points made in this paragraph, see Spade 1973 and Dutilh Novaes and Read 2008 §2.

7. Particularly the second proposition, with the important words ‘nothing but’. These words indicate a proposition that cannot be cast in the mold of Aristotle’s oath-breaker.

8. It is worth noting that Neckham had studied at the Petit Pont, at the logical school founded by Adam of Balsham.

9. De Rijk 1962–67, II.2, p. 594:30–31. The Munich Logic’s “treatise on insolubles” is now lost. This occurrence of the word ‘insolubles’ is the first known use of the term in its technical sense.

10. Among the unidentified views, the third in Bradwardine’s survey tries to fit the paradox into the Aristotelian fallacy of “false cause”. The seventh view, possibly that of Richard Kilvington, interestingly enough from a present-day perspective, denies bivalence for insolubles; they are neither true nor false. Certain authors after Bradwardine likewise refer to the latter view, although no text has been found, from before or after Bradwardine, that actually maintains it as a general claim about insolubles. (But see n. 12 below. In the first half of the 1330s, Roger Swyneshed did allow failure of bivalence in certain special cases of insolubles. See Spade 1983, and section 3.2 below.)

11. See section 3.1 below.

12. It is possible that these are the authors Bradwardine refers to as denying bivalence (see note 10 above). But this is uncertain.

13. For details of claims in this paragraph, see Spade 1987, pp. 32–33.

14. Medieval logicians typically held that affirmative propositions with non-denoting subject terms are false, not meaningless or without truth value, as is sometimes held nowadays.

15. For more on this theory, and for some very tentative speculations on its motivation, see Spade 1987, pp. 33–36.

16. Not surprisingly, given that the discussion occurs in a set of questions on the Sophistical Refutations, Scotus applies this distinction within the context of the Aristotelian fallacy secundum quid et simpliciter. Bradwardine interprets the theory in a way that commits it to transcasus as well, although Scotus’s own text does not seem committed to that. It may be that Bradwardine is not thinking of Scotus in particular when he mentions this theory, and in any event Scotus himself makes it plain that the theory is not original with him. For more on the theory, see Spade 1987, pp. 36–38.

17. This objection does not seem to have been raised in the Middle Ages, even by authors like Bradwardine who opposed all forms of restriction (see Spade 1975, p. 106). This is probably to be explained by the fact that medieval authors on the whole do not seem especially concerned with a theoretical understanding of the paradoxes; they are much more concerned with knowing what to do with them when they arise in argumentation. See Section 5 below. On the theory of restriction, see Spade 1987, pp. 38–42.

18. Burley, in Roure 1970, p. 250. Later authors express this objection more clearly, if no more successfully. Bradwardine, for example, remarks that Socrates says letters (i.e., phonemes), syllables, words and a sentence, and so does not say “nothing”. The objection, therefore, confuses “saying” with “uttering” (see Spade 1975, item LXIV, p. 107). On the theory of cassation, see Spade 1987, pp. 43–45 and Goldstein 2008.

19. This claim, which Spade (1981, p. 120) called the “Converse Bradwardine Principle” is far from innocuous. If Spade is right in attributing it to Bradwardine, it commits him to holding that all propositions, not just insolubles, signify that they are true, in addition to whatever else they may signify. (For the proof, see Spade’s online document: A Proof Concerning Bradwardine’s Theory.) And this in turn commits him to accepting ‘semantic ascent’, with serious and puzzling consequences for his theory of contradiction and his propositional logic. In particular, if Spade is right, it requires Bradwardine to reject reductio as an object-linguistically valid inference form. (For a discussion of these matters, see Spade 1981, especially pp. 125–34.)

All of this was challenged in Read (2002, pp. 211–12), who maintains that Bradwardine did not hold the so called “Converse Bradwardine Principle”, did not hold that all propositions signify that they are true (although he held that insolubles do), was not committed to ‘semantic ascent’ in general, and did not therefore have to abandon reductio in the object-language. (See the further discussion in the section The “Converse Bradwardine Principle” in Spade’s online document.)

20. Variants of Bradwardine’s theory, sometimes combined with elements from other views, were held by several anonymous authors (see Spade 1975, items IV, VIII and XII), as well as by William Heytesbury (see Section 3.3), John Buridan (see Section 3.5), Albert of Saxony (see Section 3.6), John of Holland, Henry Hopton, John Hunter (or Huntman, Venator), Paul of Pergula, Ralph Strode, Richard Lavenham, and Robert Fland (or rather, Eland—see Read and Thakkar 2016). See Spade 1975, and Spade 1981, p. 123 n. 32, and Pironet 2008.

21. In fact, the notion of “relevant” clearly relates to the theory of Obligationes (q.v.). Much of Bradwardine’s, Swyneshed’s and Heytesbury’s treatises uses the terminology of Obligationes-treatises. For a discussion of these notions and some of the complications with them, see Spade 1983. See also note 28 below.

22. Bradwardine would have agreed with this conclusion as stated. However, on his “multiple-meanings” account of signification it is anodyne, for some of what a false proposition signifies may obtain, other things not — that’s why it’s false. But whereas for Bradwardine insolubles also signify otherwise than is the case, Swyneshed does not seem to have a notion of any additional signification of a proposition. Thus, his first conclusion amounts to saying that some false propositions signify only as is the case. Bradwardine certainly would not have agreed with that.

23. Note that Swyneshed is here taking the notion of “contradictories” as a syntactical notion, so that it in effect means “a proposition and its negation”. Other authors had an Aristotelian, semantic notion of contradictories, according to which contradictories are propositions that cannot be either true together or false together but must have opposite truth values. But Swyneshed’s third conclusion is striking, whether put in terms of “contradictories” or in terms of a proposition and its negation. See further Read (2008b pp. 215 ff.) and Dutilh Novaes (2008a §§3.4 and 3.7).

24. For some of the parties in the controversy, see in Spade 1975: the anonymous item III, as well as the entries there for Anthony de Monte, John of Wesel, Paul of Pergula, the Logica magna attributed to Paul of Venice, Robert Eland (or Fland—see note 20), Roger Roseth, and William Heytesbury.

25. If we push the point, and ask not whether a in this situation is true or false, but whether it signifies as is the case or does not, Swyneshed explicitly says it does not. Nevertheless, it is not clear what prevents our paradoxically inferring from this that, yes, a does signify as is the case after all. In other words, what is to prevent our reconstructing, in terms of the notion of “signifying as is the case” alone, the paradoxes that arise about truth when truth is identified with signifying as is the case? Swyneshed does discuss the issue, but his reasoning is obscure. (See Spade 1983, pp. 107–08 and Read 2016.)

26. ‘Sophisms’ here does not mean “sophistry” in the modern, pejorative sense, but rather puzzle-propositions the study of which illustrates various logical points. Good modern examples might be Frege’s “The morning star is the evening star”, or “The concept horse is not a horse”, or Russell’s “The present king of France is bald”.

27. Heytesbury may win the competition. See the anonymous items V, VII, VIII, XII, XIII, XXIII in Spade 1975, and the entries there for Angelo of Fossombrone, Gaetano di Thiene, John of Constance, John Dumbleton, John of Holland, John Hunter (Huntman, Venator), John of Wesel, John Wyclif, Paul of Pergula, the Logica magna attributed to Paul of Venice, Ralph Strode, and Robert Eland (or Fland—see note 20).

28. For a discussion of some of the possibilities, see Spade 1982b, Dutilh Novaes 2008b, the article on Obligationes in this Encyclopedia and Dutilh Novaes and Uckelman 2016.

29. See the anonymous items VII and XII in Spade 1975, the entries there for John of Holland and John Hunter (Huntman, Venator), and Pironet 2008.

30. On the notion of “mental language”, see Spade 1996 (in Other Internet Resources), Panaccio 2004, and Section 3.3 of the article on William of Ockham in this Encyclopedia.

31. There is some dispute over the authenticity of this work. Still, the theory is genuinely Wyclif’s, even if this text is not. See the discussion in Wyclif [W-SI], xxiii–xxviii.

32. For example, Buridan, Sophismata VIII.13, concerns the ingenious proposition ‘Socrates knows the proposition written on the wall to be doubtful to him’, where it is supposed that this proposition is the only proposition written on the wall, that Socrates sees it and is in a state of doubt about its truth, and that furthermore Socrates knows he is in that state of doubt. Is the proposition true or not? Since it is stipulated that Socrates does know that he doubts the proposition, it would seem to be true. But how can Socrates simultaneously know and doubt the same proposition? Again (VIII.18), Socrates wants to eat if and only if Plato wants to eat, since Socrates likes company at meals. But Plato is angry at Socrates and, out of perverse spite, wants to eat if and only if Socrates does not want to eat. Does Socrates want to eat or not? The literature abounds in such delightful examples.

Copyright © 2017 by
Paul Vincent Spade
Stephen Read <>

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