Intellectual Property

First published Tue Mar 8, 2011; substantive revision Thu Aug 18, 2022

Intellectual property is generally characterized as non-physical property that is the product of original thought. Typically, rights do not surround the abstract non-physical entity; rather, intellectual property rights surround the control of physical manifestations or expressions of ideas. Intellectual property law protects a content-creator’s interest in their ideas by assigning and enforcing legal rights to produce and control physical instantiations of those ideas.

Legal protections for intellectual property have a rich history that stretches back to ancient Greece and before. As different legal systems matured in protecting intellectual works, there was a refinement of what was being protected within different areas. Over the same period several strands of moral justification for intellectual property were offered: namely, personality-based, utilitarian, and Lockean. Finally, there have been numerous critics of intellectual property and systems of intellectual property protection. This essay will discuss all of these topics, focusing on Anglo-American and European legal and moral conceptions of intellectual property.

1. History of Intellectual Property

One of the first known references to intellectual property protection dates from 500 B.C.E., when chefs in the Greek colony of Sybaris were granted year-long monopolies for creating particular culinary delights. There are at least three other notable references to intellectual property in ancient times—these cases are cited in Bruce Bugbee’s formidable work The Genesis of American Patent and Copyright Law (Bugbee 1967). In the first case, Vitruvius (257–180 B.C.E.) is said to have revealed intellectual property theft during a literary contest in Alexandria. While serving as judge in the contest, Vitruvius exposed the false poets who were then tried, convicted, and disgraced for stealing the words and phrases of others.

The second and third cases also come from Roman times (first century C.E.). Although there is no known Roman law protecting intellectual property, Roman jurists did discuss the different ownership interests associated with an intellectual work and how the work was codified—e.g., the ownership of a painting and the ownership of a table upon which the painting appears. There is also reference to literary piracy by the Roman epigrammatist Martial. In this case, Fidentinus is caught reciting the works of Martial without citing the source.

These examples are generally thought to be atypical; as far as we know, there were no institutions or conventions of intellectual property protection in Ancient Greece or Rome. From Roman times to the birth of the Florentine Republic, however, there were many franchises, privileges, and royal favors granted surrounding the rights to intellectual works. Bugbee distinguishes between franchises or royal favors and systems of intellectual property in the following way: franchises and royal favors restrict access to intellectual works already in the public domain, thus these decrees take something from the people. An inventor, on the other hand, deprives the public of nothing that existed prior to the act of invention (Bugbee 1967). One of the first statutes that protected authors’ rights was issued by the Republic of Florence on June 19, 1421, to Filippo Brunelleschi, a famous architect. This statute not only recognized the rights of authors and inventors to the products of their intellectual efforts; it built in an incentive mechanism that became a prominent feature of Anglo-American intellectual property protection. For several reasons, including Guild influence, the Florentine patent statute of 1421 issued only the single patent to Brunelleschi. The basis of the first lasting patent institution of intellectual property protection is found in a 1474 statute of the Venetian Republic. This statute appeared 150 years before England’s Statute of Monopolies; moreover, the system was sophisticated. The rights of inventors were recognized, an incentive mechanism was included, compensation for infringement was established, and a term limit on inventors’ rights was imposed.

American institutions of intellectual property protection are based on the English system that began with the Statute of Monopolies (1624) and the Statute of Anne (1710). The Statute of Monopolies granted fourteen-year monopolies to authors and inventors and ended the practice of granting rights to “non-original/new” ideas or works already in the public domain. In contrast to patent institutions in Europe, literary works remained largely unprotected until the arrival of Johannes Gutenberg’s printing press in the fifteenth century. Even then there were few true copyrights granted—most were grants, privileges, and monopolies.

The Statute of Anne (1710) is considered by scholars to be the first statute of modern copyright. The statute begins:

“Whereas printers, booksellers, and other persons have lately frequently taken the liberty of printing, reprinting, and publishing books without the consent of the authors and proprietors … to their very great detriment, and too often to the ruin of them and their families: for preventing therefore such practices for the future, and for the encouragement of learned men to compose and write use books, be it enacted …” (Great Britain, Statute of Anne, 1710)

The law gave protection to the author by granting fourteen-year copyrights, with a fourteen-year renewal possible if the author was still alive.

In the landmark English case Miller v. Taylor (1769), the inherent rights of authors to control what they produce, independent of statute or law, was affirmed. While this case was later overruled in Donaldson v. Becket (1774), the practice of recognizing the rights of authors had begun. Over the following decades other European countries, including Belgium, Holland, Italy, and Switzerland, followed the example set by England (Bugbee 1967). Various international treaties like the Berne Convention treaty and the Trade-Related Aspects of Intellectual Property (TRIPS 1994) agreement have expanded the geographic scope of intellectual property protection to include most of the globe.

2. The Domain of Intellectual Property

At the most practical level, the subject matter of intellectual property is largely codified in Anglo-American copyright, patent, and trade secret law, as well as in the moral rights granted to authors and inventors within the continental European doctrine. Although these systems of property encompass much of what is thought to count as intellectual property, they do not map out the entire landscape. Even so, Anglo-American systems of copyright, patent, trade secret, and trademark, along with certain continental doctrines, provide a rich starting point for understanding intellectual property (Moore 1998a). We will take them up in turn.

2.1 Copyright

The domain of copyright protection is original works of authorship fixed in any tangible medium of expression (17 U.S.C. §102 (1988)). Works that may be copyrighted include literary, musical, artistic, photographic, architectural, and cinematographic works; maps; and computer software. First, for something to be protected, it must be fixed in a permanent or tangible medium of expression. For example, an expression could be chiseled into stone, printed in a book, or saved on a hard drive. Second, the work must be “original”—the work must be the author’s own production; it cannot be the result of copying (Bleistein v. Donaldson Lithographing Co., 188 U.S. 239 (1903)). Third, copyright does not extend to short phrases, titles, or names as these to do not contain the minimum amount of authorship required by copyright. A fourth requirement that limits the domain of what can be copyrighted is that the expression must be “non-utilitarian” or “non-functional” in nature. Utilitarian products, or products that are useful for work, fall, if they fall anywhere, within the domain of patents. Finally, rights only extend over the actual concrete expression and the derivatives of the expression—not to the abstract ideas themselves. For example, Einstein’s Theory of Relativity, as expressed in various articles and publications, is not protected under copyright law. Someone else may read these publications and express the theory in her own words and even receive a copyright for her particular expression. Some may find this troubling, but such rights are outside the domain of copyright law. The individual who copies abstract theories or ideas and expresses them in her own words may be guilty of plagiarism, but she cannot be held liable for copyright infringement.

There are five exclusive rights that copyright owners enjoy, and three major restrictions on the bundle. The five rights are: the right to reproduce the work, the right to adapt it or derive other works from it, the right to distribute copies of the work, the right to display the work publicly, and the right to perform it publicly. Under U.S. copyright law, each of these rights may be individually parsed out and sold separately by the copyright owner. All five rights lapse after the lifetime of the author plus 70 years—or in the case of works for hire, the term is set at 95 years from publication or 120 years from creation, whichever comes first. Aside from limited duration (17 U.S.C. §302), the rules of fair use (17 U.S.C. §107) and first sale (17 U.S.C. §109(a)) also restrict the rights of copyright owners. Although the notion of “fair use” is notoriously hard to spell out, it is a generally recognized principle of Anglo-American copyright law that allows anyone to make limited use of another’s copyrighted work for such purposes as criticism, comment, news reporting, teaching, scholarship, and research. For example, fair use would cover a student using short quotes of copyrighted material for academic purposes. The “first sale” rule prevents a copyright holder who has sold copies of a protected work from later interfering with the subsequent sale of those copies. For example, a copyright holder could not place, as a condition of sale, that the work in question never be given to a library or thrift shop. In short, the owners of copies can do what they like with their property, short of violating the copyrights mentioned above.

Additionally, copyright does not preclude independent creation (unlike patents). For example, if Smith creates a short poem and Jones independently creates the exact same poem. Both could obtain copyrights to their original expressions.

2.2 The Creative Commons, Copyleft, and Licensing

As a modern workaround for the first sale rule, many online content providers, rather than selling a copy of a work, simply offer licensing agreements (through click-wrap, shrink-wrap, etc.) that allow only specific uses of protected content. These approaches to protecting intellectual works are relatively new and seemingly build upon the copyright systems already in place. For example, by using licensing agreements to guarantee different levels of downstream access, the Creative Commons and Copyleft models seek to expand the commons of thought and expression (Stallman 1997; Lessig 2004). An owner may allow others to build upon a protected work provided that the “new” work is similarly accessible or usable. Note that the moral bindingness of these contracts/agreements presuppose prior entitlements (hinting at the moral justifications offered below). For example, if neither party to a Copyleft license owns or has legitimate title to the intellectual work in question, then the resulting agreement/license will not be binding. Thus, Creative Commons and Copyleft models are actually built upon ownership or entitlement claims to intellectual works.

2.3 Patents

The domain or subject matter of patent law is the invention and discovery of new and useful processes, machines, articles of manufacture, or compositions of matter. There are three types of patents recognized by US patent law: utility patents, design patents, and plant patents. Utility patents protect any new, useful, and nonobvious process, machine, article of manufacture, or composition of matter, as well as any new and useful improvement thereof. Design patents protect any new, original, and ornamental design for an article of manufacture. Finally, the subject matter of a plant patent is any new variety of plant that is asexually propagated (e.g. rose bushes grown by cutting pieces of the stem). Patent protection is the strongest form of intellectual property protection, in that a twenty-year exclusive monopoly is granted to the owner over any expression or implementation of the protected work (35 U.S.C. §101 (1988) and 35 U.S.C. §154(a)(2)).

As with copyright, there are restrictions on the domain of patent protection. The U.S. Patent Act requires usefulness, novelty, and non-obviousness of the subject matter. The usefulness requirement is typically deemed satisfied if the invention can accomplish at least one of its intended purposes. Needless to say, given the expense of obtaining a patent, most machines, articles of manufacture, and processes are useful in this minimal sense.

A more robust requirement on the subject matter of a patent is that the invention defined in the claim for patent protection must be new or novel. There are several categories or events, all defined by statute, that can anticipate and invalidate a claim of a patent (35 U.S.C. §101 (1988)). In general, the novelty requirement invalidates patent claims if the invention was publicly known before the patent applicant invented it. For example, someone could not obtain a patent on the production of stained glass by mixing potash and sand, heating the mixture to 3000 Fahrenheit, and then adding different metallic oxide powders to produce different colors, even if the inventor in this case independently came up with this process.

In addition to utility and novelty, the third restriction on patentability is non-obviousness. United States patent law requires that the invention not be obvious to one ordinarily skilled in the relevant art at the time the invention was made. A hypothetical individual is constructed and the question is asked, “Would this invention be obvious to an expert in the relevant field?” If it would be obvious to this imaginary individual then the patent claim fails the test (35 U.S.C. §103).

In return for public disclosure and the ensuing dissemination of information, the patent holder is granted the right to make, use, sell, and authorize others to sell the patented item (35 U.S.C. §154 (1984 and Supp. 1989)). The bundle of rights conferred by a patent excludes others from making, using, or selling the invention regardless of independent creation. Like copyright, patent rights lapse after a given period of time—20 years for utility and plant patents, 14 for design patents. But unlike copyright protection, during their period of applicability these rights preclude others who independently invent the same process or machine from being able to patent or market their invention.

2.4 Trade Secret

The subject matter of trade secret law is almost unlimited in terms of the content or subject matter that may be protected and typically relies on private measures, rather than state action, to preserve exclusivity. “A trade secret is any information that can be used in the operation of a business or other enterprise and that is sufficiently valuable and secret to afford an actual or potential economic advantage over others” (U.S. Legal Code, The Restatement (Third) of Unfair Competition, 1995, §39). The secret may be a formula for a chemical compound; a process of manufacturing, treating, or preserving materials; a pattern for a machine or other device; or a list of customers. Trade secrets are not registered with a government agency.

The two major restrictions on the domain of trade secrets are the requirements of secrecy and competitive advantage. An intellectual work is not a secret if it is generally known within the industry, published in trade journals, reference books, etc., or readily copyable from products on the market.

Although trade secret rights have no built-in expiration, they are extremely limited in one important respect. Owners of trade secrets have exclusive rights to make use of the secret only as long as the secret is maintained. If the secret is made public by the owner, then trade secret protection lapses and anyone can make use of it. Moreover, owners’ rights do not exclude independent invention or discovery. Within the secrecy requirement, owners of trade secrets enjoy management rights and are protected from misappropriation. This latter protection is probably the most important right granted, given the proliferation of industrial espionage and employee theft of intellectual works. If a trade secret is misappropriated and made public, courts may impose injunctive relief and damages. For example, if someone misappropriates a trade secret and publishes it on a website, courts may require deletion and payment of fines.

2.5 Trademark

The domain or subject matter of trademark is, generally speaking, the good will or good name of a company. A trademark is any word, name, symbol, or device, or any combination thereof, adopted by a manufacturer or merchant to identify her goods and distinguish them from goods produced by others (15 U.S.C. §1127 (1988)). Some marks identify services rather than products.

A major restriction on what can count as a trademark is whether or not the symbol is used in everyday language. In this respect, owners of trademarks do not want their symbols to become too widely used because once this occurs, the trademark lapses. An example of this restriction eliminating a word from trademark protection is “aspirin”—as the word became a part of the common culture, rights to exclusively use the trademark lapsed.

Ownership of a trademark confers upon the property holder the right to use a particular mark or symbol and the right to exclude others from using the same (or similar) mark or symbol. The duration of these rights is limited only in cases where the mark or symbol ceases to represent a company or interest, or becomes entrenched as part of the common language or culture.

2.6 Protecting Mere Ideas

Outside of the regimes of copyright, patent, trade secret, and trademark, there is a substantial set of case law that allows individuals to protect mere ideas as personal property. This system of property is typically called the “law of ideas” (Nimmer 1954, Epstein 1992). A highly publicized case in this area is Buchwald v. Paramount Pictures (13 U.S.P.Q. 2d 1497 (Cal. Super. Ct. 1990)), concerning the Eddie Murphy movie Coming to America. Buchwald approached Paramount Pictures with a movie idea and it was agreed that if a movie was made following Buchwald’s premise he would receive compensation. Buchwald did not fix his idea, for example by writing it down, and thus copyright infringement did not apply. After several years of false starts and negotiations Paramount notified Buchwald that the movie based on his idea was not going to be produced. Shortly after this notification, Coming to America was released and credit was given to Eddie Murphy. Even though the movie supposedly lost money, Buchwald sued and received compensation.

The law of ideas is typically applied in cases where individuals produce ideas and submit them to corporations expecting to be compensated. In certain cases, when these ideas are used by the corporation (or anyone) without authorization, compensation may be required. Before concluding that an author has property rights to her idea(s), courts require the idea(s) to be novel or original (Murray v. National Broadcasting, 844 U.S. F2d 988 (Second Cir. 1988)) and concrete (Hamilton Nat’l Bank v. Belt (D.C. Cir. 1953)). Compensation is offered only in cases of misappropriation (Sellers v. American Broadcasting Co. (11th Cir. 1982)).

2.7 Droits Morals: Continental Systems of Intellectual Property

Article 6bis of the Berne Convention articulates the notion of “moral rights” that are included in continental European intellectual property law. The doctrine protects the personal rights of creators, as distinguished from their economic rights, and is generally known in France as “droits morals” or “moral rights.” These moral rights consist of the right to create and to publish a work in any form desired, the creator’s right to claim the authorship of his work, the right to prevent any deformation, mutilation or other modification thereof, the right to withdraw and destroy the work, the prohibition against excessive criticism, and the prohibition against all other injuries to the creator’s personality (Roeder 1940).

3. Justifications and Critiques

Arguments for intellectual property rights have generally taken one of three forms (Hughes 1988; Moore 2008). Personality theorists maintain that intellectual property is an extension of individual personality. Utilitarians ground intellectual property rights in social progress and incentives to innovate. Lockeans argue that rights are justified in relation to labor and merit. To this we add a recent fourth strand of justification (Moore 2018). This more recent justification analyzes content creation and access as a form of the prisoner’s dilemma. On grounds of prudence and self-interest, we each have reason to adopt and promote institutions that protect intellectual works. While each of these strands of justification has its weaknesses, there are also strengths unique to each.

3.1 Personality-Based Justifications of Intellectual Property

Rather than focusing on incentives and consequences or labor and merit (see utilitarian and Lockean arguments below), the personality theorist argues that intellectual property is an extension of individual personality. Personality theorists such as Hegel maintain that individuals have moral claims to their own talents, feelings, character traits, and experiences. We are self-owners in this sense. Control over physical and intellectual objects is essential for self-actualization—by expanding our selves outward beyond our own minds and mixing these selves with tangible and intangible items, we both define ourselves and obtain control over our goals and projects. For Hegel, the external actualization of the human will requires property (Hegel 1821). Property rights are important in two ways according to this view. First, by controlling and manipulating objects, both tangible and intangible, our will takes form in the world and we obtain a measure of freedom. Individuals may use their physical and intellectual property rights, for example, to shield their private lives from public scrutiny and to facilitate life-long project pursuit. Second, in some cases our personality becomes fused with an object—thus moral claims to control feelings, character traits, and experiences may be expanded to intangible works (Humboldt 1792; Kohler 1969).

The right of divulgation, when and if an intellectual work is placed before the public, is grounded in justified possession or prior entitlements over the work in question and the wrongness of compelling speech. A central wrong-making feature of violating the rights of attribution and integrity is that, in the typical case, a kind of misrepresentation or fraud occurs. For example, when Smith changes a painting by Jones without notice, there is a misrepresentation being offered. As with attribution and integrity, the right of withdraw could be protected by contracts that determine the downstream uses of intellectual works.

3.1.1 Problems for Personality-Based Justifications of Intellectual Property

There are at least four problems with this view (Hughes 1988; Palmer 2005; Schroeder 2006). First, it is not clear that we own our feelings, character traits, and experiences. While it is true that we have possession of these things or that they are a part of each of us, an argument is needed to establish the relevant moral claims.

Second, even if it could be established that individuals own or have moral claims to their personality, it does not automatically follow that such claims are expanded when personalities become infused in tangible or intangible works. Rather than establishing property claims to such works, perhaps we should view this as an abandonment of personality—similar to the sloughing off of hair and skin cells. Moreover, misrepresenting an intellectual work (assuming there are no moral rights to these expressions) might change the perception of an author’s personality, but it would not in fact change their personality.

Third, assuming that moral claims to personality could be expanded to tangible or intangible items, we would still need an argument justifying property rights. Personality-based moral claims may warrant nothing more than use rights or prohibitions against alteration. Finally, there are many intellectual innovations in which there is no evidence of a creator’s personality—a list of customers or a new safety-pin design, for instance (Hughes 1988). Given these challenges, personality-based theories may not provide a strong moral foundation for legal systems of intellectual property.

3.1.2 The Personality Theorist’s Rejoinder

Even if we acknowledge the force of these objections, there does seem to be something intuitively appealing about personality-based theories of intellectual property rights. Suppose, for example, that Mr. Friday buys a painting at a garage sale—a long-lost Crusoe original. Friday takes the painting home and alters the painting with a marker, drawing horns and mustaches on the figures in the painting. The additions are so clever and fit so nicely into the painting that Friday hangs it in a window on a busy street. There are at least two ethical worries to consider in this case. First, the alterations by Friday may cause unjustified economic damage to Crusoe. Second, and independent of the economic considerations, Friday’s actions may damage Crusoe’s reputation. The integrity of the painting has been violated without the consent of the author, perhaps causing long-term damage to his reputation and community standing. If these claims are sensible, then it appears that we are acknowledging personality-based moral “strings” attaching to certain intellectual works. By producing intellectual works, authors and inventors put themselves on display, so-to-speak, and incur certain risks. Intellectual property rights afford authors and inventors a measure of control over this risk. To put the point a different way, it is the moral claims that attach to personality, reputation, and the physical embodiments of these individual goods that justify legal rules covering damage to reputation and certain sorts of economic losses.

There is also the issue of compelled speech. Friday, in this example, is misrepresenting Crusoe and compelling him to discuss the changes, integrity, and original intent of the intellectual work. Instances of plagiarism and forgery are also example of misrepresentation and fraud.

Moreover, personality-based theories of intellectual property often appeal to other moral considerations. Hegel’s personality-based justification of intellectual property rights included an incentive-based component as well—he asserts that protecting the sciences promotes them, benefiting society (Hegel 1821). Perhaps the best way to protect these intuitively attractive personality-based claims to intangible works is to adopt a more comprehensive system designed to promote progress and social utility.

3.2 The Utilitarian Incentives-Based Argument for Intellectual Property

In terms of “justification,” modern Anglo-American systems of intellectual property are typically modeled as incentive-based and utilitarian (Oppenheim 1951; Machlup 1962; Boonin 1989; Hettinger 1989; Mackaay 1990; Coskery 1993; Palmer 1997; Moore 2001, Lemley 2015). On this view, a necessary condition for promoting the creation of valuable intellectual works is granting limited rights of ownership to authors and inventors. Absent certain guarantees, authors and inventors might not engage in producing intellectual property. Although success is not ensured by granting these rights, failure is inevitable if those who incur no investment costs can seize and reproduce the intellectual effort of others. Adopting systems of protection like copyright, patent, and trade secret yields an optimal amount of intellectual works being produced, and a corresponding optimal amount of social utility. Coupled with the theoretical claim that society ought to maximize social utility, we arrive at a simple yet powerful argument for the protection of intellectual property rights.

It is crucial to note that the issue of whether intellectual property protection does, or does not, sufficiently promote human happiness or well-being is an empirical question. Whether or not, for example, intellectual property protection provides an incentive that elicits some optimal output of content creation can be settled only by looking to the empirical evidence. Likewise, whether or not intellectual property protection has the effect of hindering innovation and inhibiting the production of novel valuable content can be settled only by empirical analysis. The difficulties involved in obtaining such evidence suggest that the empirical question will remain debated for some time. Complicating the task is the fact that the efficacy or lack thereof of intellectual protection in promoting well-being seems to vary from one industry to the next (Lemley 2015).

On the positive side there are numerous authors who claim that the empirical evidence is now squarely in favor of intellectual property protection. The tragedy of a ‘no-protection rule’ is secrecy, restricted markets, and lost opportunities (Miners & Staff 1990; Mossoff 2015; O’Connor 2016). William Fisher notes:

Potential innovators will know that, once they reveal their breakthroughs to the world, other people will be able to take advantage of them for free. Consequently, the innovators will be unable to recoup the costs of their innovations (the costs of the education they underwent to prepare them to make the innovations, the outlay for research and development, their opportunity costs, etc.). Aware of this risk, potential innovators will devote their energies to other, more lucrative activities, and society at large will suffer. (Fisher 2001)

Robert J. Barro and Xavier Sala-I-Martin note that over the long run the world’s growth rate is largely:

driven by discoveries in the technologically leading economies. Followers converge at least part way toward the leaders because copying is cheaper than innovation over some range. As the pool of uncopied ideas diminishes, the cost of imitation tends to increase…the consequence from the absence of intellectual property rights across economies…[is] the leading places tend to have insufficient incentive to invent, and the follower places tend to have excessive incentive to copy. (Barro & Sala-I-Martin 1997)

Professor Petra Moser makes the following observation:

In countries without patent laws, inventors depend entirely on secrecy, lead-time, and other alternatives to patents in protecting their intellectual property. As a result, investments in research and development may be most attractive in industries in which secrecy can effectively guarantee exclusive rights long enough to allow inventors to recoup their investments. (Moser 2013)

While much of the economic literature in this area focuses on patents, similar points can be made with respect to copyright. With the ease of copying and distribution afforded by modern digital networks, content creators would seem to be at a serious disadvantage compared to copiers. Without copyright there would be nothing to stop copiers from simply copying movies, books, articles, and music and selling, trading, or allowing others to make free copies. Michael Smith and Rahul Telang, argue that piracy harms both producers and consumers by undermining the income streams of producers, resulting in less content being created (Smith & Telang 2016). Sean O’Connor notes, “it should be clear that no one would invest without some appropriation mechanism that would provide them with a favorable return on their investment through the monetization of the commercialized goods or services. If they cannot see a way to get such a return, they will not make the investment” (O’Connor 2015).

3.2.2 Problems for the Utilitarian Incentives-Based Argument

On the negative side there are many who argue that “the jury is out” or that systems of IP protection actually hinder innovative activity (Machlup 1958; Schiff 1971; Palmer 1990; Boldrin & Levine 2007). On patent protection, Fritz Machlup (1958) wrote “No economist, on the basis of present knowledge, could possibly state with certainty that the patent system, as it now operates, confers a net benefit or a net loss upon society” (Machlup 1958). Nevertheless, Machlup went on to argue that such considerations do not yield the conclusion that we should abolish patent protection. Professors Michele Boldrin and David Levine argue that a ‘first mover advantage,’ coupled with secrecy and add-on services, is sufficient as an incentive for creation and discovery (Boldrin & Levine 2007). Tom Palmer made a similar point seventeen years earlier, arguing that intellectual works should be protected via technological fences and contracts, along with bundling in other products and services (Palmer 1990).

Given that the utilitarian argument rests on providing incentives, what is needed to critique it are cases that illustrate better ways, or equally good ways, of stimulating production without granting private property rights to authors and inventors. It would be better to establish equally powerful incentives for the production of intellectual property that did not also require initial restricted use guaranteed by rights (Polanyi 1943; Machlup 1962; Hettinger 1989; Waldron 1993; Moore 2003; Wright 1998).

One alternative to granting intellectual property rights to inventors as incentive is government support of intellectual labor (Hettinger 1989; Calandrillo 1998). This could take the form of government-funded research projects, with the results immediately becoming public property. The question becomes: can government support of intellectual labor provide enough incentive to authors and inventors so that an equal or greater amount of intellectual products are created compared to what is produced by conferring limited property rights? Better results may also be had if fewer intellectual works of higher quality were distributed to more people.

Unlike a government-supported system of intellectual property rights, reward models may be able to avoid the problems of allowing monopoly control and restricting access, and at the same time provide incentives to innovate (Shavell and Van Ypersele 2001). In this model, innovators would still burn the midnight oil chasing that pot of gold, and governments would not have to decide which projects to fund or determine the amount of the rewards before the works’ “social value” was known. Funds necessary to pay the rewards could be drawn from taxes or collecting percentages of the profits of these innovations. Reward models may also avoid the disadvantages of monopoly pricing, and obstructions to further adaptation and innovation.

Trade secret protection appears to be the most troubling from a utilitarian incentives-based perspective (Hettinger 1989). Given that no disclosure is necessary for trade secret protection, promoting trade secrets through incentives yields no reciprocal long-term social benefit. Trade secret protection allows authors and inventors the right to slow the dissemination of protected information indefinitely—a trade secret necessarily requires secrecy.

3.2.3 The Utilitarian Rejoinder

The utilitarian who defends the incentives argument may well agree with many of these criticisms and still maintain that intellectual property rights, in some form, are justified—the current system of protection is better than government support of intellectual property creation, reward models, or nothing at all. Additionally, most of the worries surrounding the incentive-based approach appear to focus on problems of implementation. We could tinker with our system of intellectual property, cutting back on some legal protections and strengthening others (Coskery 1993; Moore 2008). Perhaps we could include more personality-based restrictions on what can be done with an intangible work after the first sale, limit the term of copyrights, patents, and trade secrets to something more reasonable, and find ways to embrace technologies that promote access while protecting incentives to innovate. The utilitarian might also remind us of the costs of changing our system of intellectual property. The ‘jury may be out’ so-to-speak regarding the economic advantages of legal protections for intellectual works, but the social and economic costs of radically changing these institutions at this point would be overly burdensome.

3.3 Lockean Justifications of Intellectual Property

A different strategy for justifying intellectual property rights begins with the claim that individuals are entitled to control the fruits of their labor (Locke 1690; Hettinger 1989; Becker 1993; Gordon 1993; Moore 1998b; Hughes 1988; Palmer 2005; Himma 2005a, 2006, 2008, 2013; Merges 2011). In general, the intuition is that the person who clears unowned land, cultivates crops, builds a house, or creates a new invention obtains property rights by engaging in these activities. Laboring, producing, thinking, and persevering are voluntary, and individuals who engage in these activities are entitled to what they produce. Subject to certain restrictions, rights are generated when individuals mix their labor with an unowned object. Restrictions or limits on acquisition include a labor requirement, a non-waste requirement, and the “enough and as good” proviso (Locke 1690). Labor, for Locke, is best understood as metaphor for productive activities needed to sustain and promote human flourishing (Mossoff 2012). The non-waste requirement invalidates a property claim if the appropriator takes more than she can consume or use without spoilage. Unlike the labor metaphor, spoilage for Locke means rotting or the destruction of an existing good useful for sustaining human life. Finally, the “enough and as good” proviso is best illustrated by an example Locke gives. When someone takes a drink of water from a river it is as if he takes nothing at all. His fellows are, all things considered, unaffected by this acquisition.

Consider a more formal version of Locke’s famous argument. Individuals own their own bodies and labor—i.e., they are self-owners. When an individual labors on an unowned object, her labor becomes infused in the object and for the most part, the labor and the object cannot be separated. It follows that once a person’s labor is joined with an unowned object, assuming that individuals exclusively own their body and labor, rights to control are generated. The idea is that there is an expansion of rights: we each own our labor and when that labor is mixed with objects in the commons, our rights are expanded to include these goods.

In terms of intellectual property, the act of creation or discovery typically takes time, effort, and skill. Intellectual works don’t spoil like apples, so there are no “non-waste” concerns. Moreover, the creation or discovery seemingly leaves “enough and as good.” Creating a poem, for example, and holding it as a secret does not preclude others from creating their own poems.

3.3.1 Objections to Locke

Locke’s argument is not without difficulties. Jeremy Waldron (1983) argued that the idea of mixing one’s labor is incoherent—actions cannot be mixed with objects. P. J. Proudhon (1840) argued that if labor was important, the second labor on an object should ground a property right in an object as reliably as the first labor. Nozick (1974) asked why labor mixing generated property rights rather than a loss of labor. Waldron (1983) and Perry (1978) have argued that mixing one’s labor with an unowned object should yield more limited rights than rights of full ownership. Finally, if the skills, tools, and inventions used in laboring are social products, then perhaps individual claims to title have been undermined (Grant 1987; Hettinger 1989).

3.3.2 The Lockean Rejoinder

Among defenders of Lockean-based arguments for private property, these challenges have not gone unnoticed (Spooner 1855; Schmidtz 1990; Mack 1990; Simmons 1992; Child 1990; Moore 2001; Mossoff 2012; Claeys 2017). Rather than rehearsing the points and counterpoints, consider a modified version of the Lockean argument—one that does not so easily fall prey to the objections mentioned above.

After weeks of effort and numerous failures, suppose Ginger comes up with an excellent new recipe for spicy noodles—a recipe that she keeps in her mind and does not write down. Would anyone argue that Ginger does not have at least some minimal moral claim to control the recipe? Suppose that Fred samples some of Ginger’s noodles and desires to purchase the recipe. Is there anything morally suspicious with an agreement between them that grants Fred a limited right to use Ginger’s recipe provided that Fred does not disclose the process? Alas, Fred didn’t have to agree to the terms and, no matter how tasty the noodles, he could eat something else or create his own recipe. Arguably, part of the moral weightiness of the agreement between Ginger and Fred relies on the fact that Ginger holds legitimate title to the recipe. A slightly different way to put this Lockean argument for intellectual property rights is:

Step One: The Generation of Prima Facie Claims to Control – Suppose Ginger creates a new intellectual work – creation, effort, etc., yield her prima facie claims to control (similar to student desert for a grade).

Step Two: Locke’s Proviso – If the acquisition of an intellectual object makes no one (else) worse off in terms of their level of well-being compared to how they were immediately before the acquisition, then the taking is permitted.

Step Three: From Prima Facie Claims to Property Rights – When are prima facie claims to control an intellectual work undefeated? Answer: when the proviso is satisfied. Alas, no one else has been worsened – who could complain?

Conclusion: So long as no harm is done – the proviso is satisfied – the prima facie claims that labor and effort may generate turn into property claims (Moore 2012).

In small communities it may even be possible to contract with all of one’s fellows securing all or some of the bundle of full ownership. In this sort of example, every single member of the community would be directly part of the agreement. Ginger says to her peers, “if you want access to my recipe, then you will have to agree to my right to enjoy income” and they reply “but such rights can’t be indefinite … we as a community won’t be on the hook for defending this agreement indefinitely.” In the ensuing give-and-take an agreement is hammered out. It is important to note that the moral bindingness of such an agreement is crucially dependent on the initial set of entitlement claims generated by labor, desert, and non-worsening. If Ginger, in this case, was not the author of the recipe — suppose she took it from someone else — it is not at all clear that the resulting contract would be morally or legally binding.

Moving from small communities to larger ones a more general form of agreement between authors, inventors, and society can be considered. If intellectual works are to be held as anything other than trade secrets, walled off with narrow contracts like non-disclosure agreements or non-competition arrangements, there must be a way of securing access. Society may purchase access by offering limited rights to authors and inventors. Moreover, if some society does not offer this sort of protection, then innovators would likely employ their talents in other areas or simply move to a society where such agreements are recognized.

3.4 Intellectual Property and the Prisoner’s Dilemma

A major concern and limitation on the traditional justifications for intellectual property already discussed is that many scholars reject the starting assumptions needed to generate the desired moral claims. For example, non-utilitarians will dismiss the theoretical foundations of utilitarianism. Non-Lockeans will reject Locke’s commitment to self-ownership, natural rights, and individual flourishing. Building off of the positive economic analysis mentioned in the utilitarian justification for IP discussed above, Moore (2018) offers a different sort of argument based on individual prudence and self interest. Note that this argument, while concerned with consequences, is not focused on maximizing human well-being or flourishing.

Consider the following case. Imagine that we have two intellectual property creators, Beren and Lúthien, and two possible outcomes for each. In a single-play prisoner’s dilemma game, each player can copy an intellectual creation of the other, or not. Assume as well that the intellectual works created by Beren and Lúthien are valuable, interesting, or desired. The best case for either player is one where their own intellectual creation is not copied and yet they get to copy the work of the other player. This is ‘best’ for the player who copies and ‘worst’ for the player who doesn’t because, (1) the player who copies gets to enjoy or consume more content compared to the other player, (2) the player who copies still has the option or possibility of obtaining benefit by selling, trading, or bartering with the other player, while the non-copier does not enjoy these possibilities — this provides a way to recoup research and development costs, and (3) via selling, trading, or bartering the copier may obtain a positional advantage and more capital for future exchanges compared to the non-copier. Simply put, the copier obtains more content and retains more opportunities to sell, barter, or exchange compared to the non-copier. If Beren and Lúthien both refrain from copying each other, then each will avoid the worst outcome in terms of recouping investment costs and being at a positional disadvantage. Both will also retain the option of buying or bartering for the non-copied content the other enjoys. This payoff is ‘okay,’ better than ‘worst’ but not as good as ‘best.’ If both Beren and Lúthien copy each other, then both will get extra content to enjoy and will not be put at a positional disadvantage, but each will be denied the possibility of recouping research and development costs. The other player will not buy or barter for content he already possesses. These payoffs mirror a prisoner’s dilemma game (Axelrod 198, 1984, Skyrms 1990, Binmore 2015, Holt, Johnson and Schmidtz 2015).

In modeling content creation, access, and copying as an iterated prisoner’s dilemma between numerous individuals, the problem becomes even more salient. It will be individually rational to copy the intellectual efforts and creations of others. This will suppress innovation and lead to a sub-optimal result. Based solely on rational self-interest and prudence, Moore argues we should adopt institutions that promote innovation and allow inventors the capacity to recoup research and development costs. If copying becomes too widespread or if enforcement mechanisms fail, then we will likely spiral toward the collectively sub-optimal result of suppressing innovation. We see similar results of an intellectual property prisoner’s dilemma played out between nations. Through the use of sanctions against copying the intellectual efforts of others, we give ourselves compelling reasons to pursue a collectively superior outcome.

4. General Critiques of Intellectual Property

Putting aside the strands of argument that seek to justify moral claims to intangible works and the rather focused problems with these views, there are several general critiques of the rights to control intellectual property to consider.

4.1 Information is Not Property

Critics argue that information is not the kind of thing that can be owned or possessed and is not something that can be property, as that notion is typically defined. Information objects, such as numbers and propositions are abstract objects, which cannot causally interact with material objects, and hence cannot be owned or possessed. The idea, for example, that one could, in the relevant sense, possess and hence own the novel expressed by the book A Tale of Two Cities makes as little sense as the idea that one could possess and hence own the entity denoted by the symbol “2.” Whatever concepts might properly be applied to abstract objects, on this view, the concept of property, according to these theorists, does not. As a conceptual matter, the term “intellectual property,” at best, applies to nothing and, at worst, is incoherent.

This analysis is vulnerable to at least two objections. First, it is not clear that ownership, as a conceptual matter, requires physical possession. One can argue that the essence of ownership consists in a power — the power to exclude others from certain behaviors involving the relevant entity — and not in physical control or possession of the entity. Second, the claim that information objects cannot be property does not imply that it is illegitimate to grant to authors or content-creators a legal right to exclude others from appropriating those objects without their consent. That some entity E is not “property” implies only that it should not be legally protected qua property; it does not imply that E should not be protected in very similar ways. It might be that such legal rights should be called something other than “intellectual property rights,” but these rights could be called something else, such as, for example, “intellectual content rights.”

4.2 Information is Non-Rivalrous

Many have argued that the non-rivalrous nature of intellectual works grounds a prima facie case against rights to restrict access. Since intellectual works are not typically consumed by their use and can be used by many individuals concurrently (making a copy does not deprive anyone of their possessions), we have a strong case against moral and legal intellectual property rights (Kuflik 1989; Hettinger 1989; Barlow 1997). One reason for the widespread pirating of intellectual works is that many people think restricting access to these works is unjustified. Consider a more formal version of this argument:

If a tangible or intangible work can be used and consumed by many individuals concurrently (is non-rivalrous), then maximal access and use should be permitted.
Intellectual works falling under the domains of copyright, patent, and trade secret protection are non-rivalrous.
It follows that there is an immediate prima facie case against intellectual property rights, or for allowing maximal access to intellectual works.

The weak point in this argument is the first premise (Moore 2012; Himma, 2005b). Consider sensitive personal information. Moore argues that it false to claim that just because this information can be used and consumed by many individuals concurrently, a prima facie moral claim to maximal access is established. This argument applies as well to snuff films, obscene pornography, information related to national security, personal financial information, and private thoughts; each are non-rivalrous, but this fact does not by itself generate prima facie moral claims for maximal access and use. Moreover, it is not clear that unauthorized copying does no harm to the owner even in cases where the copier would not have purchased a copy legitimately (and thus is not denying the owner economic compensation they would otherwise receive). Unauthorized copying creates un-consented to risks that owners must shoulder.

Himma points out that, by itself, the claim that consumption of information is non-rivalrous does not imply that we have a right of any kind to those objects. While this certainly provides a reason against thinking protection of intellectual property is morally justified, it does not tell us anything about whether we have a right of some sort because it does not contain any information about morally relevant properties of human beings—and the justification of general rights-claims necessarily rests on attributions of value that implicitly respond to interests of beings with the appropriate level of moral standing—in our case, our status as persons (Himma 2005b).

4.3 Information Wants to be Free

Barlow (1997) argues that information is entitled to moral consideration in virtue of being alive. On his view, information is a form of life with a claim to be free that is grounded in interests and “wants” of its own. As he puts the point, information objects “are life forms in every respect but a basis in the carbon atom. They self-reproduce, they interact with their surroundings and adapt to them, they mutate, they persist.” Further, these living information objects have some sort of interest in being made available to everyone free of charge.

Barlow’s argument can be challenged on a couple of grounds. First, Himma (2005b) argues that it is simply implausible to think of abstract objects as having wants — or even interests. The concept of desire is such that only conscious beings are capable of having desires; although a conscious being can have subconscious desires, non-sentient entitles are no more accurately characterized as having desires than as having hopes. Second, even if information objects had wants or interests, Barlow gives no reason for thinking that they have a desire to, or interest in being made freely available to all. Certainly, the claim that being made freely available to all somehow benefits information objects needs an argument if for no other reason than that it is counterintuitive.

4.4 The Free Speech Argument against Intellectual Property

According to some, promoting intellectual property rights is inconsistent with our commitment to freedom of thought and speech (Nimmer 1970; Hettinger 1989; Waldron 1993). Closely associated with this argument is the position that individuals have a right to knowledge and intellectual property institutions interfere with this basic right. Hettinger argues that intellectual property “restricts methods of acquiring ideas (as do trade secrets), it restricts the use of ideas (as do patents), and it restricts the expression of ideas (as do copyrights)—restrictions undesirable for a number of reasons” (Hettinger 1989). Hettinger singles out trade secrets as the most troublesome because, unlike patents and copyrights, they do not require disclosure.

Three sorts of replies have been offered to this kind of worry (Himma 2006; Moore 2012). While we focus on the free speech argument against intellectual property, right to know arguments fall prey to similar objections. The first objection notes that it is the incentives found in providing limited protection that fosters the creation and dissemination of information—a system of intellectual property protection may cause restricted access in the short run, but overall, the commons of thought and expression is enhanced. Simply put, in the long run we get more to talk about, consume, and enjoy because of the incentives afforded by copyrights and patents.

Second, it is not at all clear that free speech is so presumptively weighty that it nearly always trumps other values. Shouting at someone over a bullhorn all day is not something we would countenance as protected free speech. Hate speech, obscene expressions, sexual harassment, and broadcasting private medical information about others are each examples of speech that we are willing to limit for various reasons—perhaps intellectual property rights can be viewed in this light.

Finally, consider the contentious, yet established, idea/expression rule of copyright. Copyright only applies to fixed expressions, not to the ideas that may make up a fixed expression. For example, someone may read Darwin’s original writings on evolution, express these ideas in her own words, and obtain a copyright in the new expression. This individual may be guilty of plagiarism, but so long as her expressions are not copied from Darwin’s original or substantially similar to the original, she can obtain a copyright. Copyrights and patents require disclosure and thus the ideas that make up these intellectual works may be discussed and analyzed.

4.4 The Social Nature of Information Argument

According to this view, information is a social product and enforcing access restrictions unduly benefits authors and inventors. Individuals are raised in societies that endow them with knowledge which these individuals then use to create intellectual works of all kinds. On this view the building blocks of intellectual works—knowledge—is a social product. Individuals should not have exclusive and perpetual ownership of the works that they create because these works are built upon the shared knowledge of society. Allowing rights to intellectual works would be similar to granting ownership to the individual who placed the last brick in a public works dam. The dam is a social product, built up by the efforts of hundreds, and knowledge, upon which all intellectual works are built, is built up in a similar fashion (Proudhon 1840; Grant 1987; Shapiro 1991; Simmons 1992, Boyle 1997).

Beyond challenging whether the notion of “society” employed in this view is clear enough to carry the weight that the argument demands, critics have questioned the view that societies can be owed something or that they can own or deserve something (Spooner 1855; Nozick 1974; Moore 2012). Lysander Spooner writes:

What rights society has, in ideas, which they did not produce, and have never purchased, it would probably be very difficult to define; and equally difficult to explain how society became possessed of those rights. It certainly requires something more than assertion, to prove that by simply coming to a knowledge of certain ideas—the products of individual labor—society acquires any valid title to them, or, consequently, any rights in them” (Spooner 1855).

The problem of how individuals acquire property rights (personality, utilitarian, Lockean, etc.) now applies to how societies obtain these rights.

Moore charges that defenders of the social nature argument against intellectual property fail to see that it may prove too much.

But like the defender of the first cause argument for the existence of God who rides the principle of sufficient causation to a certain point and then conveniently abandons it (every event or object needs a sufficient cause and nothing is self-caused except God) the proponent of the “shared culture” view is guilty of a similar trick. “Shared culture” or the social nature of intellectual property view is sufficient for undermining intellectual property rights or robust control of intellectual works, but conveniently not strong enough to undermine student desert for a grade, criminal punishment, or other sorts of moral evaluation (Moore 2012).

Finally, even if a defender of this view can justify societal ownership of general pools of knowledge and information, it could be argued that we have already paid for the use of this collective wisdom when we pay for education and the like.

4.6 The Cost of Publishing Digital Information

Coy (2007) argues is that, in a competitive market, the cost of information should properly reflect the cost of making it available to users. On this line of analysis, while the cost of making publishing information in traditional material media like books might be sufficiently high to justify charging users a price for it, the cost (per user) of making information available on digital media approaches zero as the number of users grow larger. For example, there might be some fixed cost involved in making information available on a website, but no additional cost is required beyond that to make that content available to any number of users; the more users appropriating the information, the lower the cost of making it available to any particular user. Thus, the argument concludes, it would be unfair to charge users a fee for appropriating any piece of (digital) information; information should be free (or nearly free) so as to reflect its dissemination costs.

There are two problems with this argument. First, if one accepts the legitimacy of free enterprise, as appears to be presupposed by the above argument, then what is a fair price will be determined by the voluntary interactions of buyers and sellers in a competitive market: the fair price is that which is set by the contractual transactions of free, prudentially-rational buyers and sellers. If buyers in a competitive market are willing to pay a price for digital information that is significantly higher than the seller’s marginal cost, then that price can be presumed fair. Second, the argument overlooks the fact that the fixed costs associated with producing and distributing intellectual content can be quite high. For example, the Disney Company spent more than $100 million in making the film West Side Story in 2021. If one assumes that a fair price is such as to allow the producer to recover the fixed development costs associated with producing and distributing intellectual content, this would entail that it is fair for content producers to charge a price that is sufficiently above the marginal costs to allow them to recover these fixed costs.

4.7 The Liberty Objection to Intellectual Property

When an individual owns a physical item her rights exclude others from interfering with her control of it. But intellectual property rights sweep across the entire domain of human action, restricting individual liberty even in the privacy of one’s own home. “How can the artist, copyright or patent holder determine what I can do with my stuff?” Many have attacked the notion of intellectual property on the grounds that it violates individual liberty rights (Palmer 1990). Tom Palmer argues,

Liberty and intellectual property seem to be at odds, for while property in tangible objects limits actions only with respect to particular goods, property in ideal objects restricts an entire range of actions unlimited by place or time, involving legitimately owned property (VCRs, tape recorders, typewriters, the human voice, and more) by all but those privileged to receive monopoly grants from the state (Palmer 1990).

There are at least two replies to this sort of worry. First, the problem may be addressed by adopting specific legal rules. For example, current Anglo-American institutions of intellectual property have built in provisions that limit the rights of authors and inventors. These limitations, for example “fair use” (17 U.S.C. §107) and “first sale” (17 U.S.C. §109(a)) allow individuals to use a patented or copyrighted work for personal use, non-profit, or educational purposes. Under current law it is permissible to make back-up copies of computer games or to copy a chapter of a book from the library. Perhaps these kinds of limitations could be built into the bargain between society and those who create intellectual works.

A second reply is that rights of all sorts restrict what individuals can do with their bodies and property. Restricting individual liberty is no more a feature of intellectual property than of other sorts of rights. Physical property rights to a car, for example, prohibit all of humanity from swinging a bat and damaging the car in question. Even in the privacy of your own home it is not legally permissible to punch someone in the face, destroy a visitor’s personal property, or engage in risky activities that threaten one’s neighbors.


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