Freedom of Speech

First published Fri Jan 19, 2024

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Jeffrey W. Howard replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Human beings have significant interests in communicating what they think to others, and in listening to what others have to say. These interests make it difficult to justify coercive restrictions on people’s communications, plausibly grounding a moral right to speak (and listen) to others that is properly protected by law. That there ought to be such legal protections for speech is uncontroversial among political and legal philosophers. But disagreement arises when we turn to the details. What are the interests or values that justify this presumption against restricting speech? And what, if anything, counts as an adequate justification for overcoming the presumption? This entry is chiefly concerned with exploring the philosophical literature on these questions.

The entry begins by distinguishing different ideas to which the term “freedom of speech” can refer. It then reviews the variety of concerns taken to justify freedom of speech. Next, the entry considers the proper limits of freedom of speech, cataloging different views on when and why restrictions on communication can be morally justified, and what considerations are relevant when evaluating restrictions. Finally, it considers the role of speech intermediaries in a philosophical analysis of freedom of speech, with special attention to internet platforms.

1. What is Freedom of Speech?

In the philosophical literature, the terms “freedom of speech”, “free speech”, “freedom of expression”, and “freedom of communication” are mostly used equivalently. This entry will follow that convention, notwithstanding the fact that these formulations evoke subtly different phenomena. For example, it is widely understood that artistic expressions, such as dancing and painting, fall within the ambit of this freedom, even though they don’t straightforwardly seem to qualify as speech, which intuitively connotes some kind of linguistic utterance (see Tushnet, Chen, & Blocher 2017 for discussion). Still, they plainly qualify as communicative activity, conveying some kind of message, however vague or open to interpretation it may be.

Yet the extension of “free speech” is not fruitfully specified through conceptual analysis alone. The quest to distinguish speech from conduct, for the purpose of excluding the latter from protection, is notoriously thorny (Fish 1994: 106), despite some notable attempts (such as Greenawalt 1989: 58ff). As John Hart Ely writes concerning Vietnam War protesters who incinerated their draft cards, such activity is “100% action and 100% expression” (1975: 1495). It is only once we understand why we should care about free speech in the first place—the values it instantiates or serves—that we can evaluate whether a law banning the burning of draft cards (or whatever else) violates free speech. It is the task of a normative conception of free speech to offer an account of the values at stake, which in turn can illuminate the kinds of activities wherein those values are realized, and the kinds of restrictions that manifest hostility to those values. For example, if free speech is justified by the value of respecting citizens’ prerogative to hear many points of view and to make up their own minds, then banning the burning of draft cards to limit the views to which citizens will be exposed is manifestly incompatible with that purpose. If, in contrast, such activity is banned as part of a generally applied ordinance restricting fires in public, it would likely raise no free-speech concerns. (For a recent analysis of this issue, see Kramer 2021: 25ff).

Accordingly, the next section discusses different conceptions of free speech that arise in the philosophical literature, each oriented to some underlying moral or political value. Before turning to the discussion of those conceptions, some further preliminary distinctions will be useful.

First, we can distinguish between the morality of free speech and the law of free speech. In political philosophy, one standard approach is to theorize free speech as a requirement of morality, tracing the implications of such a theory for law and policy. Note that while this is the order of justification, it need not be the order of investigation; it is perfectly sensible to begin by studying an existing legal protection for speech (such as the First Amendment in the U.S.) and then asking what could justify such a protection (or something like it).

But of course morality and law can diverge. The most obvious way they can diverge is when the law is unjust. Existing legal protections for speech, embodied in the positive law of particular jurisdictions, may be misguided in various ways. In other words, a justified legal right to free speech, and the actual legal right to free speech in the positive law of a particular jurisdiction, can come apart. In some cases, positive legal rights might protect too little speech. For example, some jurisdictions’ speech laws make exceptions for blasphemy, such that criminalizing blasphemy does not breach the legal right to free speech within that legal system. But clearly one could argue that a justified legal right to free speech would not include any such exception. In other cases, positive legal rights might perhaps protect too much speech. Consider the fact that, as a matter of U.S. constitutional precedent, the First Amendment broadly protects speech that expresses or incites racial or religious hatred. Plainly we could agree that this is so as a matter of positive law while disagreeing about whether it ought to be so. (This is most straightforwardly true if we are legal positivists. These distinctions are muddied by moralistic theories of constitutional interpretation, which enjoin us to interpret positive legal rights in a constitutional text partly through the prism of our favorite normative political theory; see Dworkin 1996.)

Second, we can distinguish rights-based theories of free speech from non-rights-based theories. For many liberals, the legal right to free speech is justified by appealing to an underlying moral right to free speech, understood as a natural right held by all persons. (Some use the term human right equivalently—e.g., Alexander 2005—though the appropriate usage of that term is contested.) The operative notion of a moral right here is that of a claim-right (to invoke the influential analysis of Hohfeld 1917); it thereby correlates to moral duties held by others (paradigmatically, the state) to respect or protect the right. Such a right is natural in that it exerts normative force independently of whether anyone thinks it does, and regardless of whether it is codified into the law. A tyrannical state that imprisons dissidents acts unjustly, violating moral rights, even if there is no legal right to freedom of expression in its legal system.

For others, the underlying moral justification for free speech law need not come in the form of a natural moral right. For example, consequentialists might favor a legal right to free speech (on, e.g., welfare-maximizing grounds) without thinking that it tracks any underlying natural right. Or consider democratic theorists who have defended legal protections for free speech as central to democracy. Such theorists may think there is an underlying natural moral right to free speech, but they need not (especially if they hold an instrumental justification for democracy). Or consider deontologists who have argued that free speech functions as a kind of side-constraint on legitimate state action, requiring that the state always justify its decisions in a manner that respects citizens’ autonomy (Scanlon 1972). This theory does not cast free speech as a right, but rather as a principle that forbids the creation of laws that restrict speech on certain grounds. In the Hohfeldian analysis (Hohfeld 1917), such a principle may be understood as an immunity rather than a claim-right (Scanlon 2013: 402). Finally, some “minimalists” (to use a designation in Cohen 1993) favor legal protection for speech principally in response to government malice, corruption, and incompetence (see Schauer 1982; Epstein 1992; Leiter 2016). Such theorists need not recognize any fundamental moral right, either.

Third, among those who do ground free speech in a natural moral right, there is scope for disagreement about how tightly the law should mirror that right (as with any right; see Buchanan 2013). It is an open question what the precise legal codification of the moral right to free speech should involve. A justified legal right to freedom of speech may not mirror the precise contours of the natural moral right to freedom of speech. A raft of instrumental concerns enters the downstream analysis of what any justified legal right should look like; hence a defensible legal right to free speech may protect more speech (or indeed less speech) than the underlying moral right that justifies it. For example, even if the moral right to free speech does not protect so-called hate speech, such speech may still merit legal protection in the final analysis (say, because it would be too risky to entrust states with the power to limit those communications).

2. Justifying Free Speech

I will now examine several of the morally significant considerations taken to justify freedom of expression. Note that while many theorists have built whole conceptions of free speech out of a single interest or value alone, pluralism in this domain remains an option. It may well be that a plurality of interests serves to justify freedom of expression, properly understood (see, influentially, Emerson 1970 and Cohen 1993).

2.1 Listener theories

Suppose a state bans certain books on the grounds that it does not want us to hear the messages or arguments contained within them. Such censorship seems to involve some kind of insult or disrespect to citizens—treating us like children instead of adults who have a right to make up our own minds. This insight is fundamental in the free speech tradition. On this view, the state wrongs citizens by arrogating to itself the authority to decide what messages they ought to hear. That is so even if the state thinks that the speech will cause harm. As one author puts it,

the government may not suppress speech on the ground that the speech is likely to persuade people to do something that the government considers harmful. (Strauss 1991: 335)

Why are restrictions on persuasive speech objectionable? For some scholars, the relevant wrong here is a form of disrespect for citizens’ basic capacities (Dworkin 1996: 200; Nagel 2002: 44). For others, the wrong here inheres in a violation of the kind of relationship the state should have with its people: namely, that it should always act from a view of them as autonomous, and so entitled to make up their own minds (Scanlon 1972). It would simply be incompatible with a view of ourselves as autonomous—as authors of our own lives and choices—to grant the state the authority to pre-screen which opinions, arguments, and perspectives we should be allowed to think through, allowing us access only to those of which it approves.

This position is especially well-suited to justify some central doctrines of First Amendment jurisprudence. First, it justifies the claim that freedom of expression especially implicates the purposes with which the state acts. There are all sorts of legitimate reasons why the state might restrict speech (so-called “time, place, and manner” restrictions)—for example, noise curfews in residential neighborhoods, which do not raise serious free speech concerns. Yet when the state restricts speech with the purpose of manipulating the communicative environment and controlling the views to which citizens are exposed, free speech is directly affronted (Rubenfeld 2001; Alexander 2005; Kramer 2021). To be sure, purposes are not all that matter for free speech theory. For example, the chilling effects of otherwise justified speech regulations (discussed below) are seldom intended. But they undoubtedly matter.

Second, this view justifies the related doctrines of content neutrality and viewpoint neutrality (see G. Stone 1983 and 1987). Content neutrality is violated when the state bans discussion of certain topics (“no discussion of abortion”), whereas viewpoint neutrality is violated when the state bans advocacy of certain views (“no pro-choice views may be expressed”). Both affront free speech, though viewpoint-discrimination is especially egregious and so even harder to justify. While listener autonomy theories are not the only theories that can ground these commitments, they are in a strong position to account for their plausibility. Note that while these doctrines are central to the American approach to free speech, they are less central to other states’ jurisprudence (see A. Stone 2017).

Third, this approach helps us see that free speech is potentially implicated whenever the state seeks to control our thoughts and the processes through which we form beliefs. Consider an attempt to ban Marx’s Capital. As Marx is deceased, he is probably not wronged through such censorship. But even if one held idiosyncratic views about posthumous rights, such that Marx were wronged, it would be curious to think this was the central objection to such censorship. Those with the gravest complaint would be the living adults who have the prerogative to read the book and make up their own minds about it. Indeed free speech may even be implicated if the state banned watching sunsets or playing video games on the grounds that is disapproved of the thoughts to which such experiences might give rise (Alexander 2005: 8–9; Kramer 2021: 22).

These arguments emphasize the noninstrumental imperative of respecting listener autonomy. But there is an instrumental version of the view. Our autonomy interests are not merely respected by free speech; they are promoted by an environment in which we learn what others have to say. Our interests in access to information is served by exposure to a wide range of viewpoints about both empirical and normative issues (Cohen 1993: 229), which help us reflect on what goals to choose and how best to pursue them. These informational interests are monumental. As Raz suggests, if we had to choose whether to express our own views on some question, or listen to the rest of humanity’s views on that question, we would choose the latter; it is our interest as listeners in the public good of a vibrant public discourse that, he thinks, centrally justifies free speech (1991).

Such an interest in acquiring justified beliefs, or in accessing truth, can be defended as part of a fully consequentialist political philosophy. J.S. Mill famously defends free speech instrumentally, appealing to its epistemic benefits in On Liberty. Mill believes that, given our fallibility, we should routinely keep an open mind as to whether a seemingly false view may actually be true, or at least contain some valuable grain of truth. And even where a proposition is manifestly false, there is value in allowing its expression so that we can better apprehend why we take it to be false (1859: chapter 2), enabled through discursive conflict (cf. Simpson 2021). Mill’s argument focuses especially on the benefits to audiences:

It is is not on the impassioned partisan, it is on the calmer and more disinterested bystander, that this collision of opinions works its salutary effect. (1859: chapter 2, p. 94)

These views are sometimes associated with the idea of a “marketplace of ideas”, whereby the open clash of views inevitably leads to the correct ones winning out in debate. Few in the contemporary literature holds such a strong teleological thesis about the consequences of unrestricted debate (e.g., see Brietzke 1997; cf. Volokh 2011). Much evidence from behavioral economics and social psychology, as well as insights about epistemic injustice from feminist epistemology, strongly suggest that human beings’ rational powers are seriously limited. Smug confidence in the marketplace of ideas belies this. Yet it is doubtful that Mill held such a strong teleological thesis (Gordon 1997). Mill’s point was not that unrestricted discussion necessarily leads people to acquire the truth. Rather, it is simply the best mechanism available for ascertaining the truth, relative to alternatives in which some arbiter declares what he sees as true and suppresses what he sees as false (see also Leiter 2016).

Note that Mill’s views on free speech in chapter 2 in On Liberty are not simply the application of the general liberty principle defended in chapter 1 of that work; his view is not that speech is anodyne and therefore seldom runs afoul of the harm principle. The reason a separate argument is necessary in chapter 2 is precisely that he is carving out a partial qualification of the harm principle for speech (on this issue see Jacobson 2000, Schauer 2011b, and Turner 2014). On Mill’s view, plenty of harmful speech should still be allowed. Imminently dangerous speech, where there is no time for discussion before harm eventuates, may be restricted; but where there is time for discussion, it must be allowed. Hence Mill’s famous example that vociferous criticism of corn dealers as

starvers of the poor…ought to be unmolested when simply circulated through the press, but may justly incur punishment when delivered orally to an excited mob assembled before the house of a corn dealer. (1859: chapter 3, p. 100)

The point is not that such speech is harmless; it’s that the instrumental benefits of permitting its expressions—and exposing its falsehood through public argument—justify the (remaining) costs.

2.2 Speaker theories

Many authors have unsurprisingly argued that free speech is justified by our interests as speakers. This family of arguments emphasizes the role of speech in the development and exercise of our personal autonomy—our capacity to be the reflective authors of our own lives (Baker 1989; Redish 1982; Rawls 2005). Here an emphasis on freedom of expression is apt; we have an “expressive interest” (Cohen 1993: 224) in declaring our views—about the good life, about justice, about our identity, and about other aspects of the truth as we see it.

Our interests in self-expression may not always depend on the availability of a willing audience; we may have interests simply in shouting from the rooftops to declare who we are and what we believe, regardless of who else hears us. Hence communications to oneself—for example, in a diary or journal—are plausibly protected from interference (Redish 1992: 30–1; Shiffrin 2014: 83, 93; Kramer 2021: 23).

Yet we also have distinctive interests in sharing what we think with others. Part of how we develop our conceptions of the good life, forming judgments about how to live, is precisely through talking through the matter with others. This “deliberative interest” in directly served through opportunities to tell others what we think, so that we can learn from their feedback (Cohen 1993). Such encounters also offer opportunities to persuade others to adopt our views, and indeed to learn through such discussions who else already shares our views (Raz 1991).

Speech also seems like a central way in which we develop our capacities. This, too, is central to J.S. Mill’s defense of free speech, enabling people to explore different perspectives and points of view (1859). Hence it seems that when children engage in speech, to figure out what they think and to use their imagination to try out different ways of being in the world, they are directly engaging this interest. That explains the intuition that children, and not just adults, merit at least some protection under a principle of freedom of speech.

Note that while it is common to refer to speaker autonomy, we could simply refer to speakers’ capacities. Some political liberals hold that an emphasis on autonomy is objectionably Kantian or otherwise perfectionist, valorizing autonomy as a comprehensive moral ideal in a manner that is inappropriate for a liberal state (Cohen 1993: 229; Quong 2011). For such theorists, an undue emphasis on autonomy is incompatible with ideals of liberal neutrality toward different comprehensive conceptions of the good life (though cf. Shiffrin 2014: 81).

If free speech is justified by the importance of our interests in expressing ourselves, this justifies negative duties to refrain from interfering with speakers without adequate justification. Just as with listener theories, a strong presumption against content-based restrictions, and especially against viewpoint discrimination, is a clear requirement of the view. For the state to restrict citizens’ speech on the grounds that it disfavors what they have to say would affront the equal freedom of citizens. Imagine the state were to disallow the expression of Muslim or Jewish views, but allow the expression of Christian views. This would plainly transgress the right to freedom of expression, by valuing certain speakers’ interests in expressing themselves over others.

2.3 Democracy theories

Many arguments for the right to free speech center on its special significance for democracy (Cohen 1993; Heinze 2016: Heyman 2009; Sunstein 1993; Weinstein 2011; Post 1991, 2009, 2011). It is possible to defend free speech on the noninstrumental ground that it is necessary to respect agents as democratic citizens. To restrict citizens’ speech is to disrespect their status as free and equal moral agents, who have a moral right to debate and decide the law for themselves (Rawls 2005).

Alternatively (or additionally), one can defend free speech on the instrumental ground that free speech promotes democracy, or whatever values democracy is meant to serve. So, for example, suppose the purpose of democracy is the republican one of establishing a state of non-domination between relationally egalitarian citizens; free speech can be defended as promoting that relation (Whitten 2022; Bonotti & Seglow 2022). Or suppose that democracy is valuable because of its role in promoting just outcomes (Arneson 2009) or tending to track those outcomes in a manner than is publicly justifiable (Estlund 2008) or is otherwise epistemically valuable (Landemore 2013).

Perhaps free speech doesn’t merely respect or promote democracy; another framing is that it is constitutive of it (Meiklejohn 1948, 1960; Heinze 2016). As Rawls says: “to restrict or suppress free political speech…always implies at least a partial suspension of democracy” (2005: 254). On this view, to be committed to democracy just is, in part, to be committed to free speech. Deliberative democrats famously contend that voting merely punctuates a larger process defined by a commitment to open deliberation among free and equal citizens (Gutmann & Thompson 2008). Such an unrestricted discussion is marked not by considerations of instrumental rationality and market forces, but rather, as Habermas puts it, “the unforced force of the better argument” (1992 [1996: 37]). One crucial way in which free speech might be constitutive of democracy is if it serves as a legitimation condition. On this view, without a process of open public discourse, the outcomes of the democratic decision-making process lack legitimacy (Dworkin 2009, Brettschneider 2012: 75–78, Cohen 1997, and Heinze 2016).

Those who justify free speech on democratic grounds may view this as a special application of a more general insight. For example, Scanlon’s listener theory (discussed above) contends that the state must always respect its citizens as capable of making up their own minds (1972)—a position with clear democratic implications. Likewise, Baker is adamant that both free speech and democracy are justified by the same underlying value of autonomy (2009). And while Rawls sees the democratic role of free speech as worthy of emphasis, he is clear that free speech is one of several basic liberties that enable the development and exercise of our moral powers: our capacities for a sense of justice and for the rational pursuit a lifeplan (2005). In this way, many theorists see the continuity between free speech and our broader interests as moral agents as a virtue, not a drawback (e.g., Kendrick 2017).

Even so, some democracy theorists hold that democracy has a special role in a theory of free speech, such that political speech in particular merits special protection (for an overview, see Barendt 2005: 154ff). One consequence of such views is that contributions to public discourse on political questions merit greater protection under the law (Sunstein 1993; cf. Cohen 1993: 227; Alexander 2005: 137–8). For some scholars, this may reflect instrumental anxieties about the special danger that the state will restrict the political speech of opponents and dissenters. But for others, an emphasis on political speech seems to reflect a normative claim that such speech is genuinely of greater significance, meriting greater protection, than other kinds of speech.

2.4 Thinker theories

While conventional in the free speech literature, it is artificial to separate out our interests as speakers, listeners, and democratic citizens. Communication, and the thinking that feeds into it and that it enables, invariably engages our interests and activities across all these capacities. This insight is central to Seana Shiffrin’s groundbreaking thinker-based theory of freedom of speech, which seeks to unify the range of considerations that have informed the traditional theories (2014). Like other theories (e.g., Scanlon 1978, Cohen 1993), Shiffrin’s theory is pluralist in the range of interests it appeals to. But it offers a unifying framework that explains why this range of interests merits protection together.

On Shiffrin’s view, freedom of speech is best understood as encompassing both freedom of communication and freedom of thought, which while logically distinct are mutually reinforcing and interdependent (Shiffrin 2014: 79). Shiffrin’s account involves several profound claims about the relation between communication and thought. A central contention is that “free speech is essential to the development, functioning, and operation of thinkers” (2014: 91). This is, in part, because we must often externalize our ideas to articulate them precisely and hold them at a distance where we can evaluate them (p. 89). It is also because we work out what we think largely by talking it through with others. Such communicative processes may be monological, but they are typically dialogical; speaker and listener interests are thereby mutually engaged in an ongoing manner that cannot be neatly disentangled, as ideas are ping-ponged back and forth. Moreover, such discussions may concern democratic politics—engaging our interests as democratic citizens—but of course they need not. Aesthetics, music, local sports, the existence of God—these all are encompassed (2014: 92–93). Pace prevailing democratic theories,

One’s thoughts about political affairs are intrinsically and ex ante no more and no less central to the human self than thoughts about one’s mortality or one’s friends. (Shiffrin 2014: 93)

The other central aspect of Shiffrin’s view appeals to the necessity of communication for successfully exercising our moral agency. Sincere communication enables us

to share needs, emotions, intentions, convictions, ambitions, desires, fantasies, disappointments, and judgments. Thereby, we are enabled to form and execute complex cooperative plans, to understand one another, to appreciate and negotiate around our differences. (2014: 1)

Without clear and precise communication of the sort that only speech can provide, we cannot cooperate to discharge our collective obligations. Nor can we exercise our normative powers (such as consenting, waiving, or promising). Our moral agency thus depends upon protected channels through which we can relay our sincere thoughts to one another. The central role of free speech is to protect those channels, by ensuring agents are free to share what they are thinking without fear of sanction.

The thinker-based view has wide-ranging normative implications. For example, by emphasizing the continuity of speech and thought (a connection also noted in Macklem 2006 and Gilmore 2011), Shiffrin’s view powerfully explains the First Amendment doctrine that compelled speech also constitutes a violation of freedom of expression. Traditional listener- and speaker-focused theories seemingly cannot explain what is fundamentally objectionable with forcing someone to declare a commitment to something, as with children compelled to pledge allegiance to the American flag (West Virginia State Board of Education v. Barnette 1943). “What seems most troubling about the compelled pledge”, Shiffrin writes,

is that the motive behind the regulation, and its possible effect, is to interfere with the autonomous thought processes of the compelled speaker. (2014: 94)

Further, Shiffrin’s view explains why a concern for free speech does not merely correlate to negative duties not to interfere with expression; it also supports positive responsibilities on the part of the state to educate citizens, encouraging and supporting their development and exercise as thinking beings (2014: 107).

2.5 Toleration theories

Consider briefly one final family of free speech theories, which appeal to the role of toleration or self-restraint. On one argument, freedom of speech is important because it develops our character as liberal citizens, helping us tame our illiberal impulses. The underlying idea of Lee Bollinger’s view is that liberalism is difficult; we recurrently face temptation to punish those who hold contrary views. Freedom of speech helps us to practice the general ethos of toleration in a manner than fortifies our liberal convictions (1986). Deeply offensive speech, like pro-Nazi speech, is protected precisely because toleration in these enormously difficult cases promotes “a general social ethic” of toleration more generally (1986: 248), thereby restraining unjust exercises of state power overall. This consequentialist argument treats the protection of offensive speech not as a tricky borderline case, but as “integral to the central functions of the principle of free speech” (1986: 133). It is precisely because tolerating evil speech involves “extraordinary self-restraint” (1986: 10) that it works its salutary effects on society generally.

The idea of self-restraint arises, too, in Matthew Kramer’s recent defense of free speech. Like listener theories, Kramer’s strongly deontological theory condemns censorship aimed at protecting audiences from exposure to misguided views. At the core of his theory is the thesis that the state’s paramount moral responsibility is to furnish the social conditions that serve the development and maintenance of citizens’ self-respect and respect for others. The achievement of such an ethically resilient citizenry, on Kramer’s view, has the effect of neutering the harmfulness of countless harmful communications. “Securely in a position of ethical strength”, the state “can treat the wares of pornographers and the maunderings of bigots as execrable chirps that are to be endured with contempt” (Kramer 2021: 147). In contrast, in a society where the state has failed to do its duty of inculcating a robust liberal-egalitarian ethos, the communication of illiberal creeds may well pose a substantial threat. Yet for the state then to react by banning such speech is

overweening because with them the system’s officials take control of communications that should have been defused (through the system’s fulfillment of its moral obligations) without prohibitory or preventative impositions. (2021: 147)

(One might agree with Kramer that this is so, but diverge by arguing that the state—having failed in its initial duty—ought to take measures to prevent the harms that flow from that failure.)

These theories are striking in that they assume that a chief task of free speech theory is to explain why harmful speech ought to be protected. This is in contrast to those who think that the chief task of free speech theory is to explain our interests in communicating with others, treating the further issue of whether (wrongfully) harmful communications should be protected as an open question, with different reasonable answers available (Kendrick 2017). In this way, toleration theories—alongside a lot of philosophical work on free speech—seem designed to vindicate the demanding American legal position on free speech, one unshared by virtually all other liberal democracies.

2.6 Instrumental theories: political abuse and slippery slopes

One final family of arguments for free speech appeals to the danger of granting the state powers it may abuse. On this view, we protect free speech chiefly because if we didn’t, it would be far easier for the state to silence its political opponents and enact unjust policies. On this view, a state with censorial powers is likely to abuse them. As Richard Epstein notes, focusing on the American case,

the entire structure of federalism, divided government, and the system of checks and balances at the federal level shows that the theme of distrust has worked itself into the warp and woof of our constitutional structure.

“The protection of speech”, he writes, “…should be read in light of these political concerns” (Epstein 1992: 49).

This view is not merely a restatement of the democracy theory; it does not affirm free speech as an element of valuable self-governance. Nor does it reduce to the uncontroversial thought that citizens need freedom of speech to check the behavior of fallible government agents (Blasi 1977). One need not imagine human beings to be particularly sinister to insist (as democracy theorists do) that the decisions of those entrusted with great power be subject to public discussion and scrutiny. The argument under consideration here is more pessimistic about human nature. It is an argument about the slippery slope that we create even when enacting (otherwise justified) speech restrictions; we set an unacceptable precedent for future conduct by the state (see Schauer 1985). While this argument is theoretical, there is clearly historical evidence for it, as in the manifold cases in which bans on dangerous sedition were used to suppress legitimate war protest. (For a sweeping canonical study of the uses and abuses of speech regulations during wartime, with a focus on U.S. history, see G. Stone 2004.)

These instrumental concerns could potentially justify the legal protection for free speech. But they do not to attempt to justify why we should care about free speech as a positive moral ideal (Shiffrin 2014: 83n); they are, in Cohen’s helpful terminology, “minimalist” rather than “maximalist” (Cohen 1993: 210). Accordingly, they cannot explain why free speech is something that even the most trustworthy, morally competent administrations, with little risk of corruption or degeneration, ought to respect. Of course, minimalists will deny that accounting for speech’s positive value is a requirement of a theory of free speech, and that critiquing them for this omission begs the question.

Pluralists may see instrumental concerns as valuably supplementing or qualifying noninstrumental views. For example, instrumental concerns may play a role in justifying deviations between the moral right to free communication, on the one hand, and a properly specified legal right to free communication, on the other. Suppose that there is no moral right to engage in certain forms of harmful expression (such as hate speech), and that there is in fact a moral duty to refrain from such expression. Even so, it does not follow automatically that such a right ought to be legally enforced. Concerns about the dangers of granting the state such power plausibly militate against the enforcement of at least some of our communicative duties—at least in those jurisdictions that lack robust and competently administered liberal-democratic safeguards.

2.7 Free speech skepticism

This entry has canvassed a range of views about what justifies freedom of expression, with particular attention to theories that conceive free speech as a natural moral right. Clearly, the proponents of such views believe that they succeed in this justificatory effort. But others dissent, doubting that the case for a bona fide moral right to free speech comes through. Let us briefly note the nature of this challenge from free speech skeptics, exploring a prominent line of reply.

The challenge from skeptics is generally understood as that of showing that free speech is a special right. As Leslie Kendrick notes,

the term “special right” generally requires that a special right be entirely distinct from other rights and activities and that it receive a very high degree of protection. (2017: 90)

(Note that this usage is not to be confused from the alternative usage of “special right”, referring to conditional rights arising out of particular relationships; see Hart 1955.)

Take each aspect in turn. First, to vindicate free speech as a special right, it must serve some distinctive value or interest (Schauer 2015). Suppose free speech were just an implication of a general principle not to interfere in people’s liberty without justification. As Joel Feinberg puts it, “Liberty should be the norm; coercion always needs some special justification” (1984: 9). In such a case, then while there still might be contingent, historical reasons to single speech out in law as worthy of protection (Alexander 2005: 186), such reasons would not track anything especially distinctive about speech as an underlying moral matter. Second, to count as a special right, free speech must be robust in what it protects, such that only a compelling justification can override it (Dworkin 2013: 131). This captures the conviction, prominent among American constitutional theorists, that “any robust free speech principle must protect at least some harmful speech despite the harm it may cause” (Schauer 2011b: 81; see also Schauer 1982).

If the task of justifying a moral right to free speech requires surmounting both hurdles, it is a tall order. Skeptics about a special right to free speech doubt that the order can be met, and so deny that a natural moral right to freedom of expression can be justified (Schauer 2015; Alexander & Horton 1983; Alexander 2005; Husak 1985). But these theorists may be demanding too much (Kendrick 2017). Start with the claim that free speech must be distinctive. We can accept that free speech be more than simply one implication of a general presumption of liberty. But need it be wholly distinctive? Consider the thesis that free speech is justified by our autonomy interests—interests that justify other rights such as freedom of religion and association. Is it a problem if free speech is justified by interests that are continuous with, or overlap with, interests that justify other rights? Pace the free speech skeptics, maybe not. So long as such claims deserve special recognition, and are worth distinguishing by name, this may be enough (Kendrick 2017: 101). Many of the views canvassed above share normative bases with other important rights. For example, Rawls is clear that he thinks all the basic liberties constitute

essential social conditions for the adequate development and full exercise of the two powers of moral personality over a complete life. (Rawls 2005: 293)

The debate, then, is whether such a shared basis is a theoretical virtue (or at least theoretically unproblematic) or whether it is a theoretical vice, as the skeptics avow.

As for the claim that free speech must be robust, protecting harmful speech, “it is not necessary for a free speech right to protect harmful speech in order for it to be called a free speech right” (Kendrick 2017: 102). We do not tend to think that religious liberty must protect harmful religious activities for it to count as a special right. So it would be strange to insist that the right to free speech must meet this burden to count as a special right. Most of the theorists mentioned above take themselves to be offering views that protect quite a lot of harmful speech. Yet we can question whether this feature is a necessary component of their views, or whether we could imagine variations without this result.

3. Justifying Speech Restrictions

3.1 Absoluteness, coverage, and protection

When, and why, can restrictions on speech be justified? It is common in public debate on free speech to hear the provocative claim that free speech is absolute. But the plausibility of such a claim depends on what is exactly meant by it. If understood to mean that no communications between humans can ever be restricted, such a view is held by no one in the philosophical debate. When I threaten to kill you unless you hand me your money; when I offer to bribe the security guard to let me access the bank vault; when I disclose insider information that the company in which you’re heavily invested is about to go bust; when I defame you by falsely posting online that you’re a child abuser; when I endanger you by labeling a drug as safe despite its potentially fatal side-effects; when I reveal your whereabouts to assist a murderer intent on killing you—across all these cases, communications may be uncontroversially restricted. But there are different views as to why.

To help organize such views, consider a set of distinctions influentially defended by Schauer (from 1982 onward). The first category involves uncovered speech: speech that does not even presumptively fall within the scope of a principle of free expression. Many of the speech-acts just canvassed, such as the speech involved in making a threat or insider training, plausibly count as uncovered speech. As the U.S. Supreme Court has said of fighting words (e.g., insults calculated to provoke a street fight),

such utterances are no essential part of any exposition of ideas, and are of such slight social value as a step to truth that any benefit that may be derived from them is clearly outweighed by the social interest in order and morality. (Chaplinsky v. New Hampshire 1942)

The general idea here is that some speech simply has negligible—and often no—value as free speech, in light of its utter disconnection from the values that justify free speech in the first place. (For discussion of so-called “low-value speech” in the U.S. context, see Sunstein 1989 and Lakier 2015.) Accordingly, when such low-value speech is harmful, it is particularly easy to justify its curtailment. Hence the Court’s view that “the prevention and punishment of [this speech] have never been thought to raise any Constitutional problem”. For legislation restricting such speech, the U.S. Supreme Court applies a “rational basis” test, which is very easy to meet, as it simply asks whether the law is rationally related to a legitimate state interest. (Note that it is widely held that it would still be impermissible to selectively ban low-value speech on a viewpoint-discriminatory basis—e.g., if a state only banned fighting words from left-wing activists while allowing them from right-wing activists.)

Schauer’s next category concerns speech that is covered but unprotected. This is speech that engages the values that underpin free speech; yet the countervailing harm of the speech justifies its restriction. In such cases, while there is real value in such expression as free speech, that value is outweighed by competing normative concerns (or even, as we will see below, on behalf of the very values that underpin free speech). In U.S. constitutional jurisprudence, this category encompasses those extremely rare cases in which restrictions on political speech pass the “strict scrutiny” test, whereby narrow restrictions on high-value speech can be justified due to the compelling state interests thereby served. Consider Holder v. Humanitarian Law Project 2010, in which the Court held that an NGO’s legal advice to a terrorist organization on how to pursue peaceful legal channels were legitimately criminalized under a counter-terrorism statute. While such speech had value as free speech (at least on one interpretation of this contested ruling), the imperative of counter-terrorism justified its restriction. (Arguably, commercial speech, while sometimes called low-value speech by scholars, falls into the covered but unprotected category. Under U.S. law, legislation restricting it receives “intermediate scrutiny” by courts—requiring restrictions to be narrowly drawn to advance a substantial government interest. Such a test suggests that commercial speech has bona fide free-speech value, making it harder to justify regulations on it than regulations on genuinely low-value speech like fighting words. It simply doesn’t have as much free-speech value as categories like political speech, religious speech, or press speech, all of which trigger the strict scrutiny test when restricted.)

As a philosophical matter, we can reasonably disagree about what speech qualifies as covered but unprotected (and need not treat the verdicts of the U.S. Supreme Court as philosophically decisive). For example, consider politically-inflected hate speech, which advances repugnant ideas about the inferior status of certain groups. One could concur that there is substantial free-speech value in such expression, just because it involves the sincere expression of views about central questions of politics and justice (however misguided the views doubtlessly are). Yet one could nevertheless hold that such speech should not be protected in virtue of the substantial harms to which it can lead. In such cases, the free-speech value is outweighed. Many scholars who defend the permissibility of legal restrictions on hate speech hold such a view (e.g., Parekh 2012; Waldron 2012). (More radically, one could hold that such speech’s value is corrupted by its evil, such that it qualifies as genuinely low-value; Howard 2019a.)

The final category of speech encompasses expression that is covered and protected. To declare that speech is protected just is to conclude that it is immune from restriction. A preponderance of human communications fall into this category. This does not mean that such speech can never be regulated; content-neutral time, place, and manner regulations (e.g., prohibiting loud nighttime protests) can certainly be justified (G. Stone 1987). But such regulations must not be viewpoint discriminatory; they must apply even-handedly across all forms of protected speech.

Schauer’s taxonomy offers a useful organizing framework for how we should think about different forms of speech. Where does it leave the claim that free speech is absolute? The possibility of speech that is covered but unprotected suggests that free speech should sometimes be restricted on account of rival normative concerns. Of course, one could contend that such a category, while logically possible, is substantively an empty set; such a position would involve some kind of absoluteness about free speech (holding that where free-speech values are engaged by expression, no countervailing values can ever be weighty enough to override them). Such a position would be absolutist in a certain sense while granting the permissibility of restrictions on speech that do not engage the free-speech values. (For a recent critique of Schauer’s framework, arguing that governmental designation of some speech as low-value is incompatible with the very ideal of free speech, see Kramer 2021: 31.)

In what follows, this entry will focus on Schauer’s second category: speech that is covered by a free speech principle, but is nevertheless unprotected because of the harms it causes. How do we determine what speech falls into this category? How, in other words, do we determine the limits of free speech? Unsurprisingly, this is where most of the controversy lies.

3.2 The limits of free speech: external constraints

Most legal systems that protect free speech recognize that the right has limits. Consider, for example, international human rights law, which emphatically protects the freedom of speech as a fundamental human right while also affirming specific restrictions on certain seriously harmful speech. Article 19 of the International Covenant of Civil and Political Rights declares that “[e]veryone shall have the right to freedom of expression; this right shall include freedom to seek, receive and impart information and ideas of all kinds”—but then immediately notes that this right “carries with it special duties and responsibilities”. The subsequent ICCPR article proceeds to endorse legal restrictions on “advocacy of national, racial or religious hatred that constitutes incitement to discrimination, hostility or violence”, as well as speech constituting “propaganda for war” (ICCPR). While such restrictions would plainly be struck down as unconstitutional affronts to free speech in the U.S., this more restrictive approach prevails in most liberal democracies’ treatment of harmful speech.

Set aside the legal issue for now. How should we think about how to determine the limits of the moral right free speech? Those seeking to justify limits on speech tend to appeal to one of two strategies (Howard and Simpson forthcoming). The first strategy appeals to the importance of balancing free speech against other moral values when they come into conflict. This strategy involves external limits on free speech. (The next strategy, discussed below, invokes free speech itself, or the values that justify it, as limit-setting rationales; it thus involves internal limits on free speech.)

A balancing approach recognizes a moral conflict between unfettered communication and external values. Consider again the case of hate speech, understood as expression that attacks members of socially vulnerable groups as inferior or dangerous. On all of the theories canvassed above, there are grounds for thinking that restrictions on hate speech are prima facie in violation of the moral right to free speech. Banning hate speech to prevent people from hearing ideas that might incline them to bigotry plainly seems to disrespect listener autonomy. Further, even when speakers are expressing prejudiced views, they are still engaging their autonomous faculties. Certainly, they are expressing views on questions of public political concern, even false ones. And as thinkers they are engaged in the communication of sincere testimony to others. On many of the leading theories, the values underpinning free speech seem to be militate against bans on hate speech.

Even so, other values matter. Consider, for example, the value of upholding the equal dignity of all citizens. A central insight of critical race theory is that public expressions of white supremacy, for example, attack and undermine that equal dignity (Matsuda, Lawrence, Delgado, & Crenshaw 1993). On Jeremy Waldron’s view (2012), hate speech is best understood as a form of group defamation, launching spurious attacks on others’ reputations and thereby undermining their standing as respected equals in their own community (relatedly, see Beauharnais v. Illinois 1952).

Countries that ban hate speech, accordingly, are plausibly understood not as opposed to free speech, but as recognizing the importance that it be balanced when conflicting with other values. Such balancing can be understood in different ways. In European human rights law, for example, the relevant idea is that the right to free speech is balanced against other rights; the relevant task, accordingly, is to specify what counts as a proportionate balance between these rights (see Alexy 2003; J. Greene 2021).

For others, the very idea of balancing rights undermines their deontic character. This alternative framing holds that the balancing occurs before we specify what rights are; on this view, we balance interests against each other, and only once we’ve undertaken that balancing do we proceed to define what our rights protect. As Scanlon puts it,

The only balancing is balancing of interests. Rights are not balanced, but are defined, or redefined, in the light of the balance of interests and of empirical facts about how these interests can best be protected. (2008: 78)

This balancing need not come in the form of some crude consequentialism; otherwise it would be acceptable to limit the rights of the few to secure trivial benefits for the many. On a contractualist moral theory such as Scanlon’s, the test is to assess the strength of any given individual’s reason to engage in (or access) the speech, against the strength of any given individual’s reason to oppose it.

Note that those who engage in balancing need not give up on the idea of viewpoint neutrality; they can accept that, as a general principle, the state should not restrict speech on the grounds that it disapproves of its message and dislikes that others will hear it. The point, instead, is that this commitment is defeasible; it is possible to be overridden.

One final comment is apt. Those who are keen to balance free speech against other values tend to be motivated by the concern that speech can cause harm, either directly or indirectly (on this distinction, see Schauer 1993). But to justify restrictions on speech, it is not sufficient (and perhaps not even necessary) to show that such speech imposes or risks imposing harm. The crucial point is that the speech is wrongful (or, perhaps, wrongfully harmful or risky), breaching a moral duty that speakers owe to others. Yet very few in the free speech literature think that the mere offensiveness of speech is sufficient to justify restrictions on it. Even Joel Feinberg, who thinks offensiveness can sometimes be grounds for restricting conduct, makes a sweeping exception for

[e]xpressions of opinion, especially about matters of public policy, but also about matters of empirical fact, and about historical, scientific, theological, philosophical, political, and moral questions. (1985: 44)

And in many cases, offensive speech may be actively salutary, as when racists are offended by defenses of racial equality (Waldron 1987). Accordingly, despite how large it looms in public debate, discussion of offensive speech will not play a major role in the discussion here.

3.3 The limits of free speech: internal constraints

We saw that one way to justify limits on free speech is to balance it against other values. On that approach, free speech is externally constrained. A second approach, in contrast, is internally constrained. On this approach, the very values that justify free speech themselves determine its own limits. This is a revisionist approach to free speech since, unlike orthodox thinking, it contends that a commitment to free speech values can counterintuitively support the restriction of speech—a surprising inversion of traditional thinking on the topic (see Howard and Simpson forthcoming). This move—justifying restrictions on speech by appealing to the values that underpin free speech—is now prevalent in the philosophical literature (for an overview, see Barendt 2005: 1ff).

Consider, for example, the claim that free speech is justified by concerns of listener autonomy. On such a view, as we saw above, autonomous citizens have interests in exposure to a wide range of viewpoints, so that they can decide for themselves what to believe. But many have pointed out that this is not autonomous citizens’ only interest; they also have interests in not getting murdered by those incited by incendiary speakers (Amdur 1980). Likewise, insofar as being targeted by hate speech undermines the exercise of one’s autonomous capacities, appeal to the underlying value of autonomy could well support restrictions on such speech (Brison 1998; see also Brink 2001). What’s more, if our interests as listeners in acquiring accurate information is undermined by fraudulent information, then restrictions on such information could well be compatible with our status as autonomous; this was one of the insights that led Scanlon to complicate his theory of free speech (1978).

Or consider the theory that free speech is justified because of its role in enabling autonomous speakers to express themselves. But as Japa Pallikkathayil has argued, some speech can intimidate its audiences into staying silent (as with some hate speech), out of fear for what will happen if they speak up (Pallikkathayil 2020). In principle, then, restrictions on hate speech may serve to support the value of speaker expression, rather than undermine it (see also Langton 2018; Maitra 2009; Maitra & McGowan 2007; and Matsuda 1989: 2337). Indeed, among the most prominent claims in feminist critiques of pornography is precisely that it silences women—not merely through its (perlocutionary) effects in inspiring rape, but more insidiously through its (illocutionary) effects in altering the force of the word “no” (see MacKinnon 1984; Langton 1993; and West 204 [2022]; McGowan 2003 and 2019; cf. Kramer 2021, pp. 160ff).

Now consider democracy theories. On the one hand, democracy theorists are adamant that citizens should be free to discuss any proposals, even the destruction of democracy itself (e.g., Meiklejohn 1948: 65–66). On the other hand, it isn’t obvious why citizens’ duties as democratic citizens could not set a limit to their democratic speech rights (Howard 2019a). The Nazi propagandist Goebbels is said to have remarked:

This will always remain one of the best jokes of democracy, that it gave its deadly enemies the means by which it was destroyed. (as quoted in Fox & Nolte 1995: 1)

But it is not clear why this is necessarily so. Why should we insist on a conception of democracy that contains a self-destruct mechanism? Merely stipulating that democracy requires this is not enough (see A. Greene and Simpson 2017).

Finally, consider Shiffrin’s thinker-based theory. Shiffrin’s view is especially well-placed to explain why varieties of harmful communications are protected speech; what the theory values is the sincere transmission of veridical testimony, whereby speakers disclose what they genuinely believe to others, even if what they believe is wrongheaded and dangerous. Yet because the sincere testimony of thinkers is what qualifies some communication for protection, Shiffrin is adamant that lying falls outside the protective ambit of freedom of expression (2014) This, then, sets an internal limit on her own theory (even if she herself disfavors all lies’ outright prohibition for reasons of tolerance). The claim that lying falls outside the protective ambit of free speech is itself a recurrent suggestion in the literature (Strauss 1991: 355; Brown 2023). In an era of rampant disinformation, this internal limit is of substantial practical significance.

3.4 Proportionality: chilling effects and political abuse

Suppose the moral right (or principle) of free speech is limited, as most think, such that not all communications fall within its protective ambit (either for external reasons, internal reasons, or both). Even so, it does not follow that laws banning such unprotected speech can be justified all-things-considered. Further moral tests must be passed before any particular policy restricting speech can be justified. This sub-section focuses on the requirement that speech restrictions be proportionate.

The idea that laws implicating fundamental rights must be proportionate is central in many jurisdictions’ constitutional law, as well as in the international law of human rights. As a representative example, consider the specification of proportionality offered by the Supreme Court of Canada:

First, the measures adopted must be carefully designed to achieve the objective in question. They must not be arbitrary, unfair, or based on irrational considerations. In short, they must be rationally connected to the objective. Second, the means, even if rationally connected to the objective in this first sense, should impair “as little as possible” the right or freedom in question[…] Third, there must be a proportionality between the effects of the measures which are responsible for limiting the Charter right or freedom, and the objective which has been identified as of “sufficient importance” (R v. Oakes 1986).

It is this third element (often called “proportionality stricto sensu”) on which we will concentrate here; this is the focused sense of proportionality that roughly tracks how the term is used in the philosophical literatures on defensive harm and war, as well as (with some relevant differences) criminal punishment. (The strict scrutiny and intermediate scrutiny tests of U.S. constitutional law are arguably variations of the proportionality test; but set aside this complication for now as it distracts from the core philosophical issues. For relevant legal discussion, see Tsesis 2020.)

Proportionality, in the strict sense, concerns the relation between the costs or harms imposed by some measure and the benefits that the measure is designed to secure. The organizing distinction in recent philosophical literature (albeit largely missing in the literature on free speech) is one between narrow proportionality and wide proportionality. While there are different ways to cut up the terrain between these terms, let us stipulatively define them as follows. An interference is narrowly proportionate just in case the intended target of the interference is liable to bear the costs of that interference. An interference is widely proportionate just in case the collateral costs that the interference unintentionally imposes on others can be justified. (This distinction largely follows the literature in just war theory and the ethics of defensive force; see McMahan 2009.) While the distinction is historically absent from free speech theory, it has powerful payoffs in helping to structure this chaotic debate (as argued in Howard 2019a).

So start with the idea that restrictions on communication must be narrowly proportionate. For a restriction to be narrowly proportionate, those whose communications are restricted must be liable to bear their costs, such that they are not wronged by their imposition. One standard way to be liable to bear certain costs is to have a moral duty to bear them (Tadros 2012). So, for example, if speakers have a moral duty to refrain from libel, hate speech, or some other form of harmful speech, they are liable to bear at least some costs involved in the enforcement of that duty. Those costs cannot be unlimited; a policy of executing hate speakers could not plausibly be justified. Typically, in both defensive and punitive contexts, wrongdoers’ liability is determined by their culpability, the severity of their wrong, or some combination of the two. While it is difficult to say in the abstract what the precise maximal cost ceiling is for any given restriction, as it depends hugely on the details, the point is simply that there is some ceiling above which a speech restriction (like any restriction) imposes unacceptably high costs, even on wrongdoers.

Second, for a speech restriction to be justified, we must also show that it would be widely proportionate. Suppose a speaker is liable to bear the costs of some policy restricting her communication, such that she is not wronged by its imposition. It may be that the collateral costs of such a policy would render it unacceptable. One set of costs is chilling effects, the “overdeterrence of benign conduct that occurs incidentally to a law’s legitimate purpose or scope” (Kendrick 2013: 1649). The core idea is that laws targeting unprotected, legitimately proscribed expression may nevertheless end up having a deleterious impact on protected expression. This is because laws are often vague, overbroad, and in any case are likely to be misapplied by fallible officials (Schauer 1978: 699).

Note that if a speech restriction produces chilling effects, it does not follow that the restriction should not exist at all. Rather, concern about chilling effects instead suggests that speech restrictions should be under-inclusive—restricting less speech than is actually harmful—in order to create “breathing space”, or “a buffer zone of strategic protection” (Schauer 1978: 710) for legitimate expression and so reduce unwanted self-censorship. For example, some have argued that even though speech can cause harm recklessly or negligently, we should insist on specific intent as the mens rea of speech crimes in order to reduce any chilling effects that could follow (Alexander 1995: 21–128; Schauer 1978: 707; cf. Kendrick 2013).

But chilling effects are not the only sort of collateral effects to which speech restrictions could lead. Earlier we noted the risk that states might abuse their censorial powers. This, too, could militate in favor of underinclusive speech restrictions. Or the implication could be more radical. Consider the problem that it is difficult to author restrictions on hate speech in a tightly specified way; the language involved is open-ended in a manner that enables states to exercise considerable judgment in deciding what speech-acts, in fact, count as violations (see Strossen 2018). Given the danger that the state will misuse or abuse these laws to punish legitimate speech, some might think this renders their enactment widely disproportionate. Indeed, even if the law were well-crafted and would be judiciously applied by current officials, the point is that those in the future may not be so trustworthy.

Those inclined to accept such a position might simply draw the conclusion that legislatures ought to refrain from enacting laws against hate speech. A more radical conclusion is that the legal right to free speech ought to be specified so that hate speech is constitutionally protected. In other words, we ought to give speakers a legal right to violate their moral duties, since enforcing those moral duties through law is simply too risky. By appealing to this logic, it is conceivable that the First Amendment position on hate speech could be justified all-things-considered—not because the underlying moral right to free speech protects hate speech, but because hate speech must be protected for instrumental reasons of preventing future abuses of power (Howard 2019a).

3.5 Necessity: the counter-speech alternative

Suppose certain restrictions on harmful speech can be justified as proportionate, in both the narrow and wide senses. This is still not sufficient to justify them all-things-considered. Additionally, they must be justified as necessary. (Note that some conceptions of proportionality in human rights law encompass the necessity requirement, but this entry follows the prevailing philosophical convention by treating them as distinct.)

Why might restrictions on harmful speech be unnecessary? One of the standard claims in the free speech literature is that we should respond to harmful speech not by banning it, but by arguing back against it. Counter-speech—not censorship—is the appropriate solution. This line of reasoning is old. As John Milton put it in 1644: “Let [Truth] and Falsehood grapple; who ever knew Truth put to the worse in a free and open encounter?” The insistence on counter-speech as the remedy for harmful speech is similarly found, as noted above, throughout chapter 2 of Mill’s On Liberty.

For many scholars, this line of reply is justified by the fact that they think the harmful speech in question is protected by the moral right to free speech. For such scholars, counter-speech is the right response because censorship is morally off the table. For other scholars, the recourse to counter-speech has a plausible distinct rationale (although it is seldom articulated): its possibility renders legal restrictions unnecessary. And because it is objectionable to use gratuitous coercion, legal restrictions are therefore impermissible (Howard 2019a). Such a view could plausibly justify Mill’s aforementioned analysis in the corn dealer example, whereby censorship is permissible but only when there’s no time for counter-speech—a view that is also endorsed by the U.S. Supreme Court in Brandenburg v. Ohio 395 U.S. 444 (1969).

Whether this argument succeeds depends upon a wide range of further assumptions—about the comparable effectiveness of counter-speech relative to law; about the burdens that counter-speech imposes on prospective counter-speakers. Supposing that the argument succeeds, it invites a range of further normative questions about the ethics of counter-speech. For example, it is important who has the duty to engage in counter-speech, who its intended audience is, and what specific forms the counter-speech ought to take—especially in order to maximize its persuasive effectiveness (Brettschneider 2012; Cepollaro, Lepoutre, & Simpson 2023; Howard 2021b; Lepoutre 2021; Badano & Nuti 2017). It is also important to ask questions about the moral limits of counter-speech. For example, insofar as publicly shaming wrongful speakers has become a prominent form of counter-speech, it is crucial to interrogate its permissibility (e.g., Billingham and Parr 2020).

4. The Future of Free Speech Theory: Platform Ethics

This final section canvasses the young philosophical debate concerning freedom of speech on the internet. With some important exceptions (e.g., Barendt 2005: 451ff), this issue has only recently accelerated (for an excellent edited collection, see Brison & Gelber 2019). There are many normative questions to be asked about the moral rights and obligations of internet platforms. Here are three. First, do internet platforms have moral duties to respect the free speech of their users? Second, do internet platforms have moral duties to restrict (or at least refrain from amplifying) harmful speech posted by their users? And finally, if platforms do indeed have moral duties to restrict harmful speech, should those duties be legally enforced?

The reference to internet platforms, is a deliberate focus on large-scale social media platforms, through which people can discover and publicly share user-generated content. We set aside other entities such as search engines (Whitney & Simpson 2019), important though they are. That is simply because the central political controversies, on which philosophical input is most urgent, concern the large social-media platforms.

Consider the question of whether internet platforms have moral duties to respect the free speech of their users. One dominant view in the public discourse holds that the answer is no. On this view, platforms are private entities, and as such enjoy the prerogative to host whatever speech they like. This would arguably be a function of them having free speech rights themselves. Just as the free speech rights of the New York Times give it the authority to publish whatever op-eds it sees fit, the free speech rights of platforms give them the authority to exercise editorial or curatorial judgment about what speech to allow. On this view, if Facebook were to decide to become a Buddhist forum, amplifying the speech of Buddhist users and promoting Buddhist perspectives and ideas, and banning speech promoting other religions, it would be entirely within its moral (and thus proper legal) rights to do so. So, too, if it were to decide to become an atheist forum.

A radical alternative view holds that internet platforms constitute a public forum, a term of art from U.S. free speech jurisprudence used to designate spaces “designed for and dedicated to expressive activities” (Southeastern Promotions Ltd., v. Conrad 1975). As Kramer has argued:

social-media platforms such as Facebook and Twitter and YouTube have become public fora. Although the companies that create and run those platforms are not morally obligated to sustain them in existence at all, the role of controlling a public forum morally obligates each such company to comply with the principle of freedom of expression while performing that role. No constraints that deviate from the kinds of neutrality required under that principle are morally legitimate. (Kramer 2021: 58–59)

On this demanding view, platforms’ duties to respect speech are (roughly) identical to the duties of states. Accordingly, if efforts by the state to restrict hate speech, pornography, and public health misinformation (for example) are objectionable affronts to free speech, so too are platforms’ content moderation rules for such content. A more moderate view does not hold that platforms are public forums as such, but holds that government channels or pages qualify as public forums (the claim at issue in Knight First Amendment Institute v. Trump (2019).)

Even if we deny that platforms constitute public forums, it is plausible that they engage in a governance function of some kind (Klonick 2018). As Jack Balkin has argued, the traditional model of free speech, which sees it as a relation between speakers and the state, is today plausibly supplanted by a triadic model, involving a more complex relation between speakers, governments, and intermediaries (2004, 2009, 2018, 2021). If platforms do indeed have some kind of governance function, it may well trigger responsibilities for transparency and accountability (as with new legislation such as the EU’s Digital Services Act and the UK’s Online Safety Act).

Second, consider the question of whether platforms have a duty to remove harmful content posted by users. Even those who regard them as public forums could agree that platforms may have a moral responsibility to remove illegal unprotected speech. Yet a dominant view in the public debate has historically defended platforms’ place as mere conduits for others’ speech. This is the current position under U.S. law (as with 47 U.S. Code §230), which broadly exempts platforms from liability for much illegal speech, such as defamation. On this view, we should view platforms as akin to bulletin boards: blame whoever posts wrongful content, but don’t hold the owner of the board responsible.

This view is under strain. Even under current U.S. law, platforms are liable for removing some content, such as child sexual abuse material and copyright infringements, suggesting that it is appropriate to demand some accountability for the wrongful content posted by others. An increasing body of philosophical work explores the idea that platforms are indeed morally responsible for removing extreme content. For example, some have argued that platforms have a special responsibility to prevent the radicalization that occurs on their networks, given the ways in which extreme content is amplified to susceptible users (Barnes 2022). Without engaging in moderation (i.e., removal) of harmful content, platforms are plausibly complicit with the wrongful harms perpetrated by users (Howard forthcoming).

Yet it remains an open question what a responsible content moderation policy ought to involve. Many are tempted by a juridical model, whereby platforms remove speech in accordance with clearly announced rules, with user appeals mechanisms in place for individual speech decisions to ensure they are correctly made (critiqued in Douek 2022b). Yet platforms have billions of users and remove millions of pieces of content per week. Accordingly, perfection is not possible. Moving quickly to remove harmful content during a crisis—e.g., Covid misinformation—will inevitably increase the number of false positives (i.e., legitimate speech taken down as collateral damage). It is plausible that the individualistic model of speech decisions adopted by courts is decidedly implausible to help us govern online content moderation; as noted in Douek 2021 and 2022a, what is needed is analysis of how the overall system should operate at scale, with a focus on achieving proportionality between benefits and costs. Alternatively, one might double down and insist that the juridical model is appropriate, given the normative significance of speech. And if it is infeasible for social-media companies to meet its demands given their size, then all the worse for social-media companies. On this view, it is they who must bend to meet the moral demands of free speech theory, not the other way around.

Substantial philosophical work needs to be done to deliver on this goal. The work is complicated by the fact that artificial intelligence (AI) is central to the processes of content moderation; human moderators, themselves subjected to terrible working conditions at long hours, work in conjunction with machine learning tools to identify and remove content that platforms have restricted. Yet AI systems notoriously are as biased as their training data. Further, their “black box” decisions are cryptic and cannot be easily understood. Given that countless speech decisions will necessarily be made without human involvement, it is right to ask whether it is reasonable to expect users to accept the deliverances of machines (e.g., see Vredenburgh 2022; Lazar forthcoming a). Note that machine intelligence is used not merely for content moderation, narrowly understood as the enforcement of rules about what speech is allowed. It is also deployed for the broader practice of content curation, determining what speech gets amplified — raising the question of what normative principles should govern such amplification; see Lazar forthcoming b).

Finally, there is the question of legal enforcement. Showing that platforms have the moral responsibility to engage in content moderation is necessary to justifying its codification into a legal responsibility. Yet it is not sufficient; one could accept that platforms have moral duties to moderate (some) harmful speech while also denying that those moral duties ought to be legally enforced. A strong, noninstrumental version of such a view would hold that while speakers have moral duties to refrain from wrongful speech, and platforms have duties not to platform or amplify it, the coercive enforcement of such duties would violate the moral right to freedom of expression. A more contingent, instrumental version of the view would hold that legal enforcement is not in principle impermissible; but in practice, it is simply too risky to grant the state the authority to enforce platforms’ and speakers’ moral duties, given the potential for abuse and overreach.

Liberals who champion the orthodox interpretation of the First Amendment, yet insist on robust content moderation, likely hold one or both of these views. Yet globally such views seem to be in the minority. Serious legislation is imminent that will subject social-media companies to burdensome regulation, in the form of such laws as the Digital Services Act in the European Union and the Online Safety Bill in the UK. Normatively evaluating such legislation is a pressing task. So, too, is the task of designing normative theories to guide the design of content moderation systems, and the wider governance of the digital public sphere. On both fronts, political philosophers should get back to work.


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I am grateful to the editors and anonymous referees of this Encyclopedia for helpful feedback. I am greatly indebted to Robert Mark Simpson for many incisive suggestions, which substantially improved the entry. This entry was written while on a fellowship funded by UK Research & Innovation (grant reference MR/V025600/1); I am thankful to UKRI for the support.

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