Intentionality in Ancient Philosophy

First published Mon Sep 22, 2003; substantive revision Fri Oct 18, 2019

In recent decades, philosophers frequently refer to ‘intentionality’, roughly, that feature of beliefs, desires, and other mental states in virtue of which they are of or about something or more generally, possess content; contrary to what ordinary usage of ‘intentional’ might suggest, it is not limited to practical states such as intending to do something or acting intentionally. The currency of the technical term is due in large part to Edmund Husserl, who took it from his own teacher, Franz Brentano. In 1874, Brentano had proposed this feature as a criterion of the mental that could be used to demarcate psychology from the physical sciences, and he explicitly invoked medieval scholastic terminology (intentio, esse intentionale) as a way of reintroducing the notion. Brentano’s thesis about the criterion of the mental has had a checkered fate in philosophy. But interest in intentionality in its own right has continued unabated.

This interest has naturally led to questions about the history of the notion. Earlier accounts, following Brentano, looked to late medieval discussions in Latin and then to their roots in earlier Arabic philosophy. But at that point, it was claimed, the trail peters out – nothing in Greek or Roman philosophy, allegedly, corresponds. This narrative, as one might suspect, rests on questionable assumptions. Once the investigation is properly framed, it is clear that philosophical interest in intentionality can be traced all the way back to the origins of Western philosophy. Intentionality is recognized as raising serious puzzles already in the early- to mid-fifth century bce, arguably first by Parmenides, but then indisputably by sophists responding to him, including Gorgias and Protagoras. The first extensive discussions are in Plato, who explicitly thematizes the difficulties in several dialogues and considers various solutions. Later philosophers develop other solutions, which include appeals to internal representations (Aristotle), or to nonexistent objects of thought (the first Stoics, Zeno and Cleanthes), and propositions and other semantic entities (other Stoics, beginning with Chrysippus). Even the terminology of intentionality can be traced back, through Augustine, to Greek origins, namely in the Stoic theory of vision.

1. The history of the term

The received view, which takes the notion to originate in Arabic philosophy, traces back to an article by the phenomenologist Herbert Spiegelberg, originally published in 1933 (for a translation of a revised version, see Spiegelberg 1976). It turns entirely on philosophical terminology: it only considers texts that use cognates of ‘intention’ in a specific technical sense, that of a mental act’s being directed at or referring to something, in contrast with a usage that applies exclusively to practical contexts, where an agent intends to do something. Spiegelberg claims that before the high scholastic period, uses of the Latin intentio were exclusively practical and so have no bearing on the problem of the intentionality of mental states more generally. The closest antecedents, he claims, are the Arabic ma’na and ma’qul, which were translated into Latin in the high scholastic period by intentio.

Even when considered simply as a history of the terminology, this account is seriously mistaken. Late scholastic discussions often cite Augustine, in particular Book XI of his On the Trinity, in which intentio plays a central role. And while Augustine does identify intentio there with will (uoluntas) and even love (amor), he does not have practical concerns exclusively or even primarily in mind. On the contrary, his focus is on cognition, starting with vision and continuing on with memory, thought, and self-knowledge. It is just that he thinks that in order to account for the directedness of these states, their analysis must ultimately include a certain practical element, rather than the other way around, where all practical attitudes must be explained in terms of cognition. Augustine argues that vision and perception generally cannot be analyzed simply into subject and object (as on Aristotle’s account). That would leave out something essential, which is needed to direct the sense to the perceptible object and keep it fixed on it. Augustine identifies this third element as the perceiver’s intentio, which he characterizes as a kind of striving or will. It is precisely because a trio of factors are required, in fact, that he believes psychology can be useful to Trinitarian theology. Since humans are made in God’s image, each human (or more precisely, each “inner man”) must also replicate God’s triune structure. The role intentio plays in cognition is parallel to that of the Holy Spirit, mediating between the Father and the Son: it mediates between the object and the cognitive faculty. Later scholastics were thus right to cite Augustine’s use of intentio in discussions of cognition, establishing a direct link to late antiquity, independent of the contributions of Arabic philosophy, in the history of what Spiegelberg called “extra-practical” intentionality.

Augustine, moreover, is adapting and developing earlier Greek views. In Book XII of his Literal Commentary on Genesis, he offers an extensive analysis of vision that relies heavily on Stoic theory. In both theories, vision depends on the active role of the perceiver’s pneuma (Greek) or spiritus (Latin), “breath” in its original meaning and for the Stoics a kind of hot gaseous body, but for Augustine something immaterial. (The same words, not insignificantly, are used in the Christian scriptures for the Holy Spirit). Vision occurs when the pneuma extends through the optic nerve and the eye to the object, either by reaching out through the pupil to make contact with the object directly (as on Augustine’s theory) or by pricking and tensing the intervening air beginning at the pupil into a cone with its base at the object (as on the Stoic theory). The words that the Stoic Chrysippus uses for the extension of the visual cone to the object are the Greek verb enteinein and noun entasis (Diogenes Laertius VII 157), which are cognate with the Latin intendere and intentio. So if our goal was to find not just a continuous transmission of technical terminology for intentionality, but cognates of intentio, we could trace it back at least to Greek theories of vision in the third century bce, if not still earlier extromission theories of vision. (For further discussion of Augustine’s theory, as well as the history of the terminology, see Caston 2001.)

Other expressions and figures of speech familiar to us from modern discussions of intentionality can be found in ancient philosophy, even though we cannot trace a continuous connection from them to our own usage. Throughout antiquity, for example, we find the antithesis of ‘presence in absence’ (parōn apōn) to describe the way a mental state can make something “present” to the subject that is nevertheless absent from the current surroundings and perhaps even from reality altogether. Aristotle mentions such presence in absence explicitly as an aporia or difficulty that must be resolved (On Memory and Recollection 1, 450a25 ff.). Certain Stoics speak of immanent objects of thought, items that are literally present “in thought” (ennoēmata). Later thinkers use the phrase ‘existing in mere thoughts alone’ (en psilais epinoiais monais) to characterize merely intentional objects, which do not exist in reality. Even the metaphor of directedness – of aiming the mind at something (intendere animum in), like an arrow – can be found in ancient texts. In Plato’s Cratylus (420bc), Socrates suggests that the word for belief, doxa, derives etymologically from the word for bow, toxon: it “goes toward” each thing and how it is in reality. Socrates then extends this analysis to the vocabulary for deliberative states: the word for plan, boulē, for example, derives from the word for shot, bolē. The metaphor is repeated again in the Theaetetus (194a): someone who believes falsely is “like a bad archer who, in shooting, goes wide of the mark and errs”.

2. The history of the problem

A history of terminology, though, even when done correctly, tracks the wrong items. The same technical terms are often used to express very different concepts: just consider the philosophical usage of terms like ‘substance’, ‘matter’, or even ‘concept’ itself. Conversely, the same concept is often expressed by different terms, some of which may not be technical at all, a situation that is especially likely at the beginning of inquiry into a subject. So if terminology is to be used as evidence, much more must be brought into consideration – simple word searches will not do.

The terminology, moreover, holds little interest in its own right. In order for a history to be philosophically illuminating, it should focus on the concept of intentionality itself or, better still, the divergent conceptions of intentionality that philosophers have had and their resulting disagreements. These differences afford us the greatest perspective on our own presuppositions and preoccupations, as well as revealing paths and solutions we might not otherwise have considered. There is thus no need to settle on a single conception as the concept of intentionality at the outset, which would in any case only produce a Whiggish history, of development towards and deviations from some favored, but undoubtedly idiosyncratic view. On the contrary, we should take the opposite approach: substantive disagreements between philosophers are potentially the most instructive philosophically.

A philosophical history would therefore do better to focus on the history of the problem of intentionality: the difficulty, that is, of providing a philosophically adequate account of the nature of intentionality in light of its various peculiarities, whatever terms may have been used to express it. Such an approach not only allows room for different theories of intentionality, but also divergent conceptions, as well as attempts to dissolve the problem, either by dismissing the phenomenon entirely or by denying that there is any genuine difficulty involved. A history of intentionality that did not include a Parmenides or a Quine would not be very informative, especially if we are trying to understand the difficulty and what is at stake.

The problem of intentionality is the problem of explaining what it is in general for mental states to have content, as well as the particular conditions responsible for specific variations in content. The difficulty of providing such an account lies in explaining why mental states often seem to violate familiar entailment patterns (whether or not we take such violations to be criterial of intentionality). To begin with, the content of many mental states does not correspond with what is in the world: what we imagine may not exist, our beliefs may be false, our desires may go unfulfilled. To put it more paradoxically, a mental state may be about something, even if there isn’t any such thing in the world. This is one of a number of peculiarities that prove difficult to account for, and which are sometimes thought to pose a particular stumbling block for naturalistic approaches to the mind. As Wittgenstein once quipped, you can’t hang a man unless he is there, but you can look for him even if he’s not, or even if he does not exist at all (Philosophical Investigations 1.133, §462). There are other peculiarities as well, concerning our ability to focus selectively on certain aspects of objects, without having others in mind. For example, while I cannot greet a person without greeting a person of some particular height, I can think of a person without thinking of a person of any particular height. I can also entertain different attitudes to the same object at the same time, depending on the aspect under which I consider it. So I might believe that the Morning Star is a star but that Venus is not one, despite the fact that Venus is the Morning Star; yet for just the same reason, we cannot land a space probe on the one without thereby landing it on the other. These and other difficulties form a loose family of phenomena that give rise to the problem of intentionality. Different philosophers may regard these phenomena differently, perhaps focusing on some but not others, or even excluding some as not belonging together with the rest. A philosophical history should be generous about such differences: what is important philosophically is that a philosopher recognizes that some of them pose a difficulty, at least prima facie, in accounting for mental states. (For further discussion of the methodology, see Caston 2001)

3. Before Plato

Parmenides of Elea (early 5th century bce) is arguably the first Greek philosopher to have focused on the problematic nature of intentionality. His poem (transmitted under the title On Nature) offers a startling revelation of the allegedly true nature of reality and appearance, in which the narrator is instructed by a goddess that “you cannot grasp or express what is not – it cannot be accomplished” (B2), for “thinking cannot be found apart from what is, upon which its expression depends” (B8.35–36) and “what can be said and thought must be what is” (B6). The Greek for the phrases ‘what is’ and ‘what is not’ are notoriously ambiguous. But if, as many interpreters maintain (see Owen 1960; Furth 1968), it should be construed here either in terms of (a) what does or does not exist, or (b) what is or is not the case, or perhaps (c) some fusion of the two, then the goddess is denying the possibility of thinking or speaking either about nonexistent objects, or about nonfactual states-of-affairs, or both, on the basis of the following intuitions. If one is to think or express anything at all, there must be something that one is thinking or expressing (thus quantifying in). But what is not, by hypothesis, is not there to be thought of (cf. B3), since either it does not exist or is not in fact the case; and if there isn’t anything there to be thought of, then we must not be thinking of anything either. Parallel problems are supposed to arise in the case of speech, for statements concerning a nonexistent or for false statements.

Concerns about non-existent objects or non-factual states of affairs are not explicit in Parmenides’ poem, though – unsurprisingly, the goddess does not give examples of what she is proscribing. This leaves room for other construals of ‘what is not’, such as the view that it always requires completion or specification as ‘what is not F’ for some value of F, so that ‘what is not’ raises concerns about negative predication instead, especially in explanatory and cosmological contexts. But of course the precise nature of the difficulty here is not spelled out either, so speculative reconstruction is required. In any case, the goddess herself seems to use negation and the phrase ‘what is not’ quite freely, though perhaps this is just symptomatic of her liminal position at the borders of Night and Day (B1).

Whatever Parmenides intended, it is clear that the subsequent reception of his poem is concerned precisely with the problem sketched above about what does not exist and what is not the case. Numerous proscriptions similar to the goddess’s are reported in the remainder of the 5th century, though offered by philosophers with quite different motivations and agendas, including Protagoras, Gorgias, the author of pseudo-Hippocratic treatise On the Art, Anaxagoras, Metrodorus of Chios, Euthydemus, Cratylus, and Antisthenes. In many of these cases, the denial is explicitly formulated as a rejection of the possibility of falsehood, of thinking or speaking of what is not the case.

The sophists Protagoras and Gorgias are of particular interest. According to Plato, Protagoras held that one cannot believe what is not and that whatever one experiences is true (Theaetetus 167a). This fits snugly with Protagoras’ widely attested doctrine that each human being is “the measure of all things,” which, on any interpretation, excludes the possibility of error. But Protagoras’ endorsement reveals an interesting subtlety in the Parmenidean thesis that what is not cannot be thought about – or more positively, the thesis that if something is had in mind, it must be. The goddess in Parmenides’ poem uses this thesis in a negative fashion, moving from the assumption that certain things ‘are not’ to the paradoxical conclusion that we cannot actually think about them either. But one might equally use it in a positive fashion, as Protagoras seems to have done, to move from the assumption that we can in fact think of such things to the conclusion that they must in fact ‘be’, i.e. exist or obtain, after all. In itself, the Parmenidean thesis only makes a conditional claim, and prima facie it seems open to employ either modus tollens or modus ponens. Depending on whether one retains commonplace assumptions about what we can think or about what there is in the world, the Parmenidean thesis can lead to either a bloated ontology or a very restricted psychology.

Gorgias challenges this thesis in his treatise On Not Being (preserved in two slightly different versions in the pseudo-Aristotelian On Melissus, Xenophanes, and Gorgias and in Sextus Empiricus’ Adversus Mathematicos VII 65 ff.). It takes direct aim at Eleatic assumptions, and especially those of Parmenides, by arguing that (i) there isn’t anything; (ii) even if there is something, it cannot be known; and finally, (iii) even if something can be known, one could not inform anyone of this. The second part is of particular interest, since Gorgias offers a reductio ad absurdum of the Parmenidean thesis, especially when deployed in the positive way we have just seen in Protagoras. Given that we obviously can have in mind, for example, a chariot-team racing on the sea – in fact, just by reading this, you have put it in mind – it should follow from the Parmenidean thesis that there is a chariot-team racing on the sea; but (pace Protagoras) plainly there is not. If both these intuitions are maintained, the only option left is to reject the Parmenidean thesis itself: it is not the case that one can only think or speak of what is – thought is not so tightly bound to reality. Gorgias immediately goes on to argue for a sceptical conclusion, on the grounds that we have no basis for telling which mental states correspond to reality and which do not, and so cannot know anything at all. But this further argument rests on having shown that our ordinary intuitions about what we can think and what exists or obtains together undermine the Parmenidean thesis. (For further discussion, see Caston 2002a)

Why should anyone be tempted by the Parmenidean thesis in the first place? A simple intuition may lie behind it, namely, that thought consists in a direct relation to what is thought about (and mutatis mutandis for other mental states and what they are about). For given that a relation cannot obtain unless all its relata exist or obtain, it will follow that we cannot ever think of what does not exist or obtain (“what is not”). To the extent that this direct relational model has a grip on us, we will be forced to either Parmenidean or Protagorean conclusions. In fact, we can reformulate these assumptions together as an inconsistent triad (using ‘thought’ schematically for mental states more generally, and allowing for the ambiguity between ‘exists’ and ‘obtains’):

  1. Thought consists in a direct relation to what is thought about.
  2. No relation can obtain unless all its relata exist/obtain.
  3. Sometimes we can think about what does not exist/obtain.

Each of these theses possesses a certain intuitive appeal. But taken together, they are inconsistent, and so at least one has to be given up. This does not entirely force our hand, however, since any two of the three are mutually consistent. So there is still room for disagreement among the disputants. As we have seen, some 5th century thinkers, including Parmenides himself (on some interpretations) chose to maintain (A) and (B), and reject (C). But if this seems too costly, as it does to most people, one would need to reject one of the other two theses instead. An obvious candidate for rejection is (A), that thought consists in a direct relation to what is thought about. But there are different ways of going about it. Someone could simply (i) reject a relational analysis altogether. But one could also reject (A) while continuing to accept a relational analysis, so long as (ii) it involves a relation to something else other than what is thought about. Much of the subsequent discussion in ancient philosophy can be seen as an attempt to pursue the latter strategy, (ii), by finding a suitable intermediary: for example, certain Platonists appeal to Forms; Aristotle appeals to changes within our body that serve as internal representations; the Stoics from Chrysippus onwards appeal to abstract semantic objects like propositions; and Epicurus appeals to parts of the surfaces of bodies. A third main option, though, would be to retain the direct relational model in (A) unchanged, while also preserving the phenomenological intuition in (C), and instead abandon the metaphysical assumption in (B), as the earliest Stoics did. Whenever one thinks, these Stoics insist, there is something that one is thinking about; but it needn’t be anything that exists or obtains. On this Stoic view, there are things that do not exist or obtain, which can serve as intentional objects of thought and other mental states.

4. Plato

Throughout his dialogues, Plato emphasizes the relational character of various mental states: sight, hearing, touch and perception generally, memory, belief, knowledge, concepts, speech, love (Tht. 152c, 160ab, 163e, 188d–189b; Rep. V, 476e, 478b; Parm. 132bc; Soph. 262e, 263c; Symp. 199d). In each case, Socrates (or the other main speaker) asks whether the mental state in question is “of something or of nothing”, and the interlocutors agree that it is always of something – it is impossible for such a state not to be of anything at all. In the Charmides, Socrates gets Critias to agree to something stronger, namely, that many of these states – seeing, hearing, and other forms of perception, desire, intention, love, fear, and belief – must have an object other than themselves; and he suggests that it would be odd if knowledge were not like this as well (167c–168a). But in this regard, mental states do not differ from other relatives, as he himself emphasizes: Socrates sometimes adds nonintentional cases, such as siblings, parents and children, and doubles and halves, in order to illustrate his point. In some of the passages above, Socrates follows up this question with a further one, which has bearing only for the mental states, namely, whether they are always of something “that is” rather than something “that is not”. Although the speakers readily agree that these states must always be of something that is, the problem of intentionality already looms, merely by his raising the possibility that on occasion some states might be of what is not, either of what is not the case or of what does not exist. In the Philebus, this alternative is explicitly taken up: just as one can believe something without that belief being of anything that ever was, is, or will be, so one can feel pleasure about something, or fear, anger, and so on, even if it is not about anything that ever was, is, or will be. In all such cases, the beliefs, pleasures, fears, and so on are said to be “false” (pseudē, Phlb.40ce).

More importantly, there are several passages where Socrates discusses falsehood in belief and speech at length, as a familiar and important problem in need of resolution. In the Cratylus, Socrates says that a great many people, both in the past and in the present, have held that it is impossible to speak falsely, on the grounds that it is impossible to say something without saying something that is; Cratylus concludes that in such cases, instead of speaking falsely and saying something that is not, the speaker would simply be making noise, no more meaningful than banging a pot (429d–430a). A similar puzzle about false speech is posed in the Euthydemus, initially by the brothers Euthydemus and Dionysodorus, a visiting tag team of Sophists who are displaying their eristic prowess (283e–284e). It is later reprised by Socrates, who attributes it explicitly to “Protagoras’ followers” and still earlier thinkers, and it is explicitly extended to false belief as well (286cd). These versions of the puzzle frame it in terms of whether one can speak (or think) of “what is not”: one cannot speak without there being something that one is saying (or thinking); yet it is impossible for there to be such a thing and for it not to be. But that is what speaking falsely would amount to, since on this view speaking falsely just is to say something that is not. Plato never explicitly questions the relational character of speaking and believing or rejects the requirement that the relata must exist or obtain. In the inconsistent triad we considered above, it is the third proposition, “Sometimes we can think about what does not exist/obtain,” which is consistently under pressure in these contexts. At the same time, Socrates objects that such a position would be self-undermining (Euthyd. 287e–288a), though he does not offer a further diagnosis here.

The puzzle about false belief recurs in the Theaetetus at a crucial juncture in the dialogue’s main argument. Socrates and Theaetetus have rejected the proposal that knowledge is perception and with it the underlying Protagorean view that whatever appears to be the case is the case. Theaetetus’ new proposal, that knowledge is true belief, offers no advance, though, unless they can show that false belief is possible, against sophistic puzzles like we have just seen from the Euthydemus; and while Socrates says he has “often” worried about this, he claims that he is unable to say what false belief is and how it comes about (187be). He then develops the worry in much more elaborate ways than before. There is a fuller version of the puzzle than we have seen so far, which explicitly equates believing something “that is not” with not believing anything at all (188d–189b). But Socrates also introduces a distinct, new psychological worry into consideration. If one assumes that false belief by its very nature has a certain structure, namely, of mistaking one thing for another, we must then ask what our cognitive access is to each: do we know each of these, or only one, or neither? (188ac) Socrates makes this underlying structure explicit when he goes on to analyze false belief as a kind of “other-believing” (allodoxia), where we say in thought that something is one thing instead of another (189c–190e). This analysis avoids the earlier difficulty, since both items can be things that are, and it locates error in our having latched on to the wrong one. From a third-person point of view, this is illuminating, since it exposes precisely why the belief is mistaken. But for just the same reason the description is unacceptable from a first-person point of view for the subject who is taken in: no one, Socrates insists, would ever say to themselves that Socrates is Theaetetus or that one thing is something distinct from it (190ac). And in fact Plato repeatedly characterizes thinking as saying something to oneself, both in this dialogue (189e–190a) and later in the Sophist (263e–264a); an analogous view also seems to be implicit in the image from Philebus 38e–39a of an internal scribe writing out our beliefs in our soul. This treatment of other-believing in the Theaetetus thus seems to presuppose that both terms must be somehow present to thought in order for the substitution to occur (190d). The possibility that one might have only one of them in the mind, through perception or in some other way, and somehow apply it to the wrong thing in the world is not considered (even though it is something that Plato allows in the case of incorrect names at Cratylus 430a–431b, where he speaks of pointing or otherwise exhibiting the thing while applying a name to it).

At this point in the Theaetetus, Socrates proposes a model for how false belief can occur, based on an analogy with how signet rings can be impressed into a wax block to produce a sealing: in a similar way, our thoughts and perceptions make an impression on our memory, leaving behind traces which are signs or representations of the original objects thought about or perceived (191cd; 194cd). These traces can then be deployed in combination with fresh perceptions of objects, with which they may or may not accord, to produce beliefs. When one of these traces does not “fit” an incoming perception, like a shoe put on the wrong foot, the combination is incorrect and the resulting belief false (193c–194b). The model satisfies both constraints introduced by the earlier puzzles: it provides cases of falsehood where we are related exclusively to things that are, and where both items are in some way present to thought. But as Socrates develops the suggestion, it is made to rely crucially on our having different kinds of cognitive access to the two items combined in the belief (memory traces, on the one hand, and perceptions, on the other: 195cd). As such, it does not serve to explain cases where just thoughts are involved, as when someone incorrectly believes that the sum of 5 and 7 is 11 (195e–196a). This is enough to vitiate the account Socrates and Theaetetus have given of false belief. But there should no longer be an issue about whether false beliefs are possible, the challenge posed by the original puzzles, only about whether we have been given a fully comprehensive account. Socrates tries to salvage the theory by proposing another model, where having different thoughts is compared to grabbing at birds in an aviary (197c–200d). Here again the constraints introduced by the earlier puzzles are met, but the account does not seem any more promising, if taken as a general theory of false belief. It is soon given up after being subjected to a number of objections, and Socrates returns to the dialogue’s main concern with knowledge.

The Theaetetus does not have much to say about intentionality more broadly, in particular about the intentionality of the perceptions and thoughts that are combined in belief – the dialogue’s attention to these issues is limited, understandably, by the exigencies of the main argument. Perception had earlier been dismissed as not being in a position even to attain truth (186e), much less being capable of falsehood; but little is said about how perceptual content should be understood. The final section of the dialogue briefly raises an important problem about the intentionality of thought, however, which is entirely distinct from the problems involving falsehood or nonexistence. If one has a true belief about something, but not knowledge, and in particular does not grasp how that thing differs from all other things, Socrates worries, then how does the belief manage to be about the very thing it is in fact about? How can thoughts of general characteristics, that are shared equally by other things, “make me think of Theaetetus rather than of Theodorus, or of the most distant Mysian, as the saying goes?” (209b) This is an especially clear statement (in all likelihood the first) of what Chisholm would later call “the problem of objective reference.” And his reading of the Theaetetus may well be what lies behind Wittgenstein’s own statement of the puzzle: “What makes my representation of him a representation of him? Not the similarity of the image.” (Phil. Invest., II.177, §iii)

Plato offers a solution to the puzzles about falsehood in the Sophist. It goes unchallenged in the text and may well have been regarded by him as definitive. (It need not be a recent discovery on Plato’s part, as is often assumed; he needn’t have been stumped by these puzzles himself when he composed the earlier passages: see Burnyeat 2002.) In this dialogue, when the Eleatic visitor introduces the puzzles about false belief and speaking falsely, he points out the danger of contradicting oneself, invoking Parmenides’ proscriptions against speaking of what is not (236e–237c). But he also insists that we must find a way of reconstruing such claims, if we are to show that falsehood is possible (240d–241b) without committing patricide against “Father Parmenides” (241d). The subsequent solution turns on recognizing a complexity in the structure of statements, between the subject, which is named in the statement, and what is said about it, as expressed by the predicate (261d–262d). Statements are no longer thought of on the model of names, which are true if they name something “that is.” Instead, for a statement to be meaningful, one part of it must successfully name something and the other say something about it, which may be either true or false of this. Something analogous will hold for belief, the visitor says, as belief is taken to be a kind of internal assertion made by the soul (263d–264b). As we have seen, several features of this solution are already prefigured in the Theaetetus: both the requirement that thought and speech be related only to what is, and the insight that the complexity of statements and beliefs allows for error to occur in a mismatch of the parts or a misapplication of one to the other. But it is only in the Sophist that this mismatch is explicitly characterized in terms of the difference between things that are, rather than simply being about “what is not.” A false statement asserts what is not the case regarding the subject, by stating that the subject is other than it in fact is (263ad). The analysis in the Sophist appears incomplete as it stands, though, since it only applies to subject-predicate sentences, where the subject succeeds in referring to something (262e, 263c): it is unclear how the visitor would handle other types of statements, much less negative existentials (such as ‘there are no witches’). It also gives no account of naming or nonpropositional attitudes. But, again, if we consider only the original challenge posed by Parmenides and the Sophists, namely, to show that falsehood is possible, then Plato has clearly succeeded in providing an answer.

5. Aristotle

Medieval theories of intentionality – not to mention more recent philosophers influenced by these theories, such as Brentano (1874 [1995]) – draw their inspiration from Aristotle’s theory of perception and thought, in particular his doctrine that in cognition the form of the sensible or intelligible object is “received without the matter” (On the Soul II 12, 424a17–24; III 2, 425b23–24; III 4, 429a15–19; and III 8, 431b26–29) and the doctrine that the object, or more precisely its activity as an object of cognition, is “one and the same” as the activity of cognition and is present in the cognizing subject (III 2, 425b25–426a27). Both perception and thought are intentional states, and Aristotle’s analyses of them are central to his psychological theory as a whole. But none of these passages gives clear evidence of Aristotle’s awareness of the problem of intentionality, much less provides a definition of intentionality or any of its essential features. To begin with, each doctrine applies to more than just intentional states. The impression of signet ring in sealing wax is offered not merely as an analogy, but as a genuine example of a form’s being received without the matter, a point accepted even by commentators such as John Philoponus and Thomas Aquinas; Philoponus also mentions images in mirrors as another example (Philoponus, On Aristotle’s On the Soul, 444.17–26, 437.19–25; Thomas Aquinas On Aristotle’s On the Soul 2.24, 56–59 = §554). This doctrine cannot therefore provide a sufficient condition for intentionality, still less for cognition or awareness. Similarly, Aristotle defends his claim that the object’s activity is one and the same as the activity of cognition and present in the cognizing subject as simply an instance of a much wider causal generalization: in every causal interaction, including inanimate and noncognitive ones, the activity of the agent is one and the same as the activity of the patient and occurs in the patient (On the Soul III 2, 426a2–11). Further, neither of these doctrines holds for all intentional states: each fails to apply to paradigmatic cases of intentionality, like dreams or future hopes, where the problem of intentionality is most palpable. So neither doctrine provides a necessary condition for intentionality either. They are rather general causal doctrines that apply to a special class of intentional states, like perception and thought, where the intentional state is about what brings it about – that is, it is about its own cause – something that is not true of intentional states in general. Even if they prove to be central to his theory of intentionality, they do not directly address the problem as such.

Aristotle is, however, keenly aware of the special character of intentional states. In fact, he excoriates his predecessors for failing to account for intentional states whose objects are not the causes that bring them about. In the second chapter of his essay On Memory and Recollection, he rejects the idea that thought extends, like a ray, to its object, because we “think in the same way even when they do not exist”: in such cases a ray will not work, since there won’t be anything for it to extend to (452b9–11). He goes further in his polemic On Ideas (81.25–82.1), when he rejects Platonic theories that take our thoughts to be of Platonic forms. Because such objects supposedly always exist, whether or not the individuals that fall under them do, this sort of theory evades the previous criticism: given such intermediaries, there is something thought can reach. But, Aristotle objects, they cannot account for the full range of thoughts we actually have, since we can think of particular individuals who no longer exist, like Socrates, and mythical creatures that “do not exist in any way at all,” like the hippocentaur. In such cases, there is no Platonic form that can serve as the object of thought: by the Platonists’ own lights, there is no form of Socrates or of Hippocentaur. So simply positing a special object of the same type as a Form won’t suffice.

Aristotle seems confident that his own theory has the resources to deal with both sets of counterexamples. He believes there are changes in our bodies that represent or model the objects in question (without being instances of the exact same type), and by undergoing these changes we are able to have thoughts with the relevant contents, whether or not the corresponding objects exist in the world at large. He describes such changes as phantasmata, a term often translated as ‘images.’ But while such representations are underlie imagistic experiences, such as visualization and dreams, they also bear content in the absence of such experience. Aristotle deploys phantasmata throughout his psychology, both in cognitive states, like thought and memory, and in desires, passions, and action. The underlying capacity, which he calls phantasia, is formally introduced in On the Soul III 3 in response once again to the problem of intentionality. According to Aristotle, his predecessors are unable to explain how error could ever take place. On their view, all cognition is about what brings it about, such that “like is known by like,” and this, he believes, precludes the possibility of error (427a9–b6). But to the extent Aristotle himself explains perception and thought along similar lines, he will be vulnerable to the same criticism; and consistent with this, he actually regards both states (at least in their most basic forms, which we might call ’sensation’ and ’understanding’) as incapable of falsehood. But unlike his predecessors, Aristotle does not think that all mental states are to be explained on this simple model. As he immediately goes on to argue, phantasia is a distinct kind of mental state that cannot be reduced to sensation, understanding, belief, or even a combination of belief and perception (428a24–b9). It consists in perceptual traces, which are capable of affecting the central organ in the same way that perceptual stimulations do and so capable of producing similar experiences even in the absence of the corresponding external objects. It is this, he claims, that makes falsehood possible and so explains the actions and reactions of animals (428b10–429a8).

Thought, Aristotle insists, always requires a phantasma (On the Soul III 7, 431a16–17, b2; III 8, 432a8–10; On Memory 1, 449b31). But the content of even the simplest concept goes beyond that contained in any such quasi-perceptual representations (On the Soul III 8, 432a12–14). At a minimum, in thought we are able to focus selectively on certain features, by ignoring many of the other features in such representations, just as we can use a diagram of a triangle for mathematical purposes without being concerned with its particular dimensions, and so effectively abstract them (On Memory 1, 449b31–450a17). But we are also capable of using one concept to form the opposite concept and of applying one concept to another to result in a compound propositional thought capable of truth or falsehood (On the Soul III 6; Metaphysics VI 4, IX 10; On Interpretation 1). The abstract content that results from such operations allows us to use symbols to speak and understand one another (On Interpretation 1, 16a3–9).

Aristotle also considers higher-order perception and thought. He offers a regress argument at the beginning of On the Soul III 2 to show that when we perceive that we see or hear, we have a higher-order perceptual awareness of the first-order perceiving (425b12–25) and, while the precise details are a matter of controversy, it is arguably the same act of perception being directed at itself (Caston 2002b; for a response, see Johansen 2005). But Aristotle elsewhere claims that in general states like knowledge, perception, belief, or thought are always directed at something else primarily and themselves only peripherally or “on the side” (en parergōi); only God’s self-reflexive thinking, which he characterizes as a “thinking of thinking” (noēsis noēseōs), has itself as its primary object (Metaph. XII 9, 1074b34–36). Self-directed intentionality raises a number of questions, in particular whether Aristotle is committed to it being a part of every mental act – as he seems to claim at Nicomachean Ethics IX 9, 1170a29–b1, which Brentano 1874 [1995], Book II, chs 2–4 takes up and champions – and whether he thinks it is possible to be in error about the content or character of the first-order state, even if not about its existence (Caston 2002b).

6. The Stoics

The earliest Stoics seem committed to preserving the intuition that whenever we are in a mental state, there is something that our mental state is of or about. But they reject the Parmenidean requirement that this must be something “that is”, something that exists or obtains. On the contrary, they claim that “in the nature of things, some things are and some are not,” since the nature of things includes “anything that comes to mind, such as centaurs, giants or anything else made up by a false thought.” (Seneca Letter 58.15) Accordingly, these Stoics regard Something as the highest genus, rather than What is or What has being, as Plato had. Whenever a phantasia or representation is of something which does not in fact exist, there still is something our representation is of, which they call a phantasma, an “apparition” or “figment”. Even though it does not exist, on this view it is still something and so can serve as the object of our mental state.

This position does not seem to have to have arisen from idle speculation, but rather as part of a response to Plato. The first two heads of the school, Zeno of Citium and Cleanthes of Assos, argue that there are no such things as Plato’s forms. The concept (ennoia) of a kind, that is, of a genus or species, is a thought of what they call an ennoēma, an object that is quite literally “in a thought” (en + noēma), an “immanent object”, but is found only in thought. The precise nature of these objects is controversial. According to one source (Stobaeus, 1.136.21 ff.), they are “not something” and so not something qualified in a certain way, but only “as if” they were something and “as if” they were qualified; they are further said to be only “apparitions” or phantasmata, something merely represented. On this basis, most interpretations take the Stoics to hold that the objects of these thoughts are “not-somethings” (outina): fictions or figments that are so beyond the pale, allegedly, that they do not even count as something. But so understood, the Stoic view would be deeply obscure, if not actually incoherent. If the objects of these thoughts are not something, they are not anything, on pain of contradiction. That, after all, was the point of claiming that Something is the highest or most comprehensive genus: everything is something. But if there are no such things, then what is gained by replacing Platonic forms with ennoēmata, rather than simply eliminating Platonic forms altogether? Worse, what becomes of the intuition that whenever we have a representation, there is something that our representation is of?

The earliest Stoics do think they have gained something by this move, though. They appeal, unsurprisingly, to both genera and species in characterizing the methods of definition and division, which they take to be central to logic and reasoning. Far from being a blank nothing, these objects are distinguished from one another in terms of their common features and differences, as they would have to be for the classificatory system required for dialectic and science. The Stoics, moreover, explicitly quantify over these objects: there is, in fact, a distinct object of thought for each number (Plotinus Enneads–29). In referring to them as “apparitions” (phantasmata), moreover, the Stoics are not eliminating them. They are recognizing them as something that our mind is directed towards whenever something general “appears” to us or is represented (phantasia). For as we have seen, they hold that whatever appears to us is something, even if it is not something that exists or obtains. The natural move for the Stoics, then, would be to say that while Platonic forms aren’t anything at all – there are no such things – there are such things as ennoēmata; they just aren’t anything that is, that exists or obtains. And in fact a parallel report in Diogenes Laertius can be read in precisely this way: although an ennoēma is not anything that exists and so does not possess qualities, it is nevertheless “as if” it were something that exists and “as if” it possessed qualities, “like the impression of a horse when none is present” (Diogenes Laertius VII 61). In such a case, what I imagine is something and indeed something horse–like; but it is not a real horse or anything existent, and so on their view not something that can act or be acted upon and so not a body. It is merely an object of thought.

Such generic objects will further be incomplete or indeterminate. It will not be true to say that the generic human (genikos anthrōpos) is Greek, for example, or equally to say that it is not Greek, even in an “as if” sort of way, since some, but not all, humans are Greek (Sextus Empiricus, Adv. math. VII 246). A generic object will be “as if” it were F if, and only if, all the individuals falling under it are F. This claim need not violate the Principle of the Excluded Middle, since it would still be true of the generic human that it is either Greek or not Greek, since it is true that all humans are either Greek or not Greek. But it would violate the Principle of Bivalence, since it still will be neither true nor false to say that the generic human is Greek. (For further discussion of ennoēmata, see Caston 1999.)

The third head of the school, Chrysippus of Soli, avoids these problems by appealing instead to “that which can be said” or “meant” (lekta, lit. ‘sayables’), certain abstract objects that are signified by our words. Lekta, like place, void, and time, cannot themselves either act or be acted upon, and so in the Stoics’ view cannot be bodies, which are the only existents they recognize; all such entities are instead classified as “incorporeals” (asōmata). But lekta will still be something, since in each case there is something that our words signify; it is just that they “subsist” (huphestanai) rather than exist (einai), as the Stoics sometimes say. Unlike ennoēmata, however, they will not generally be the objects of mental states (except perhaps when we are thinking about Stoic semantics, for example). They serve rather as the contents of mental states, which can be articulated in language, regardless of which objects (if any) these states are directed towards (Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. VIII 11–12, 70, 409; Diogenes Laertius VII 63). There are lekta corresponding to general terms and predicates, as well as to sentences of all kinds: not only to simple and molecular propositions (axiōmata), but also questions, commands, oaths, suggestions, prayers, and so on (Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. VIII 71–73; Diogenes Laertius VII 66–8). For Chrysippus, moreover, a definition like ‘a human is a rational mortal animal’, should not be construed as being about a generic object, even in an “as if” sort of way. Rather it has the same meaning as the universal generalization, ‘if something is a human, then that thing is a rational mortal animal’ (Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. XI 8–11). But such a proposition commits us to nothing more than the relevant individuals that satisfy it (if indeed there are any) and to the lekta signified by its predicates. Finally, unlike generic objects, lekta are not indeterminate. It is simply false to claim that what is expressed by the predicate ‘is a human’ is itself a human (and likewise simply true that the predicate ‘is a predicate’ is itself a predicate). Therefore, lekta need not pose a threat to the Principle of Bivalence.

One of the most tantalizing questions concerns the relationship between mental representations (phantasiai) and lekta. The Stoics effectively endorse a version of Brentano’s Thesis that intentionality is the criterion of the mental, which demarcates the domain of psychology. The Stoics think that representations are what set animals and humans apart from plants and inanimate substances: only things with psuchē or soul have mental representations (phantasiai) of the world and make efforts (hormai) to move and change things (Origen On Principles 3.1.2, 196.12–197.8 Koetschau). But they also think that representations are a pervasive feature of psychological phenomena: every mental state either is a representation or involves one essentially, because it is an assent to a representation as correct or rejection of it as incorrect or withholding assent from it altogether. So representation (phantasia) is a feature of all and only mental states. Lekta constitute the content of these representations. The Stoics in fact define them as “what subsists in correspondence with a rational representation,” where a rational representation is one that belongs to rational animals like ourselves (Diogenes Laertius VII 63; Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. VII 51).

This definition, though, also poses a difficulty. In recent decades, it has been thought to imply that lekta subsist only in connection with the representations of rational animals – something not stated explicitly in our reports – even though this would have problematic consequences: it would imply that nonrational animals and indeed very young humans, before they develop reason, would either paradoxically have representations without any content at all or solely with nonconceptual content that could not be articulated. (For a classic statement of the view, see Frede 1983 [1987], 153–54, 156; for a discussion of the consequences, see Sorabji 1993, 20–28.) Neither the Stoics nor their critics ever mention such consequences, and it would make it difficult, if not impossible, for them to account for animal behavior, much less the emergence of reason itself in humans. They insist that we have no concepts (ennoiai) at birth, comparing the mind to a blank sheet of papyrus, ready to be written upon: it is first inscribed by perceptions and then subsequently, through the sorting and collection of perceptual memories, by experience, issuing in our first natural concepts, from which we can later construct even more complex concepts. Reason only appears later – some sources say at age seven, others at fourteen – when there are sufficient concepts to form a stable, interrelated system (Aetius 4.11.1–4; Plutarch On Common Conceptions 1084f–1085a; Diogenes Laertius VII 53). So on the Stoics’ view, children will possess concepts at some stage before they have reason, since reason emerges from the cumulative acquisition and systematization of concepts, and evidently some of these concepts are formed naturally from perceptions and memories alone, unaided by reason, from which they presumably derive their content at least in part. Since all these states undoubtedly possess content, there is no principled ground for denying analogous content in the case of representations in nonrational animals either, at least for perceptual representations.

If lekta serve here, as elsewhere, as the content of these states, then lekta will not correspond solely to rational representations. But how, one might reasonably ask, can the represenations in nonrational animals and very young humans, who are without concepts and incapable of articulate speech, have lekta corresponding to them? There is a widespread assumption in the secondary literature that whether a lekton corresponds to a representation depends upon which concepts (if any) an individual possesses. But the Stoics cannot accept this assumption. Quite the contrary. They believe that a lekton is involved in every causal interaction, whether animate or inanimate: one body causes a lekton to become true or hold of another body, where the lekton specifies the fully determinate effect of the agent on the patient (Stobaeus 1.138.14; Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. 9.211; Clement of Alexandria Stromata 8.9.3–4; this point is rightly emphasized by Frede 1994). But this analysis of causation immediately becomes pertinent once we acknowledge that the Stoics also hold a causal theory of representation: they define representations as the effect – literally, an “impression” (tupōsis) – that in the paradigmatic case the object of representation produces on the soul (which on their view is a body); and they expressly compare this to the impression a signet ring makes in wax (Diogenes Laertius VII 50; Aetius 4.12.1–4; Plutarch On Common Conceptions 1084f–1085a), and they appeal to sigillary language again when they define the “secure” representation they regard as the criterion of truth and foundation of knowledge (phantasia katalēptikē), which represents the object that produces it in such rich detail that it could be distinguished from anything else, no matter how similar (Cicero Acad. 2.77–78; Sextus Empiricus Adv. math. 7.248 ff.; Diogenes Laertius VII 46).

Whenever an object produces a representation, then, there will be a corresponding lekton that specifies the object’s fully determinate effect on the soul: not only that it is a representation and a representation of a certain sort, but one that represents objects in the world as having various features and standing in various relations, potentially in extraordinarily rich detail. Embedded within this complex lekton will be a clause that exhaustively expresses the content: if all such lekta can be captured with the schema, ‘… forms a representation that –’, whatever fills the second blank will express the total content of the representation. None of this requires concept possession or even conceptual abilities: which lekton belongs to a representation is determined causally by the interaction of a specific object and a specific subject in certain conditions, so long as the subject is capable of forming a representation when affected by appropriate objects in the right way. Perceptual representations even in nonrational animals will ordinarily have tremendously detailed contents, which cannot be exhaustively expressed by a simple proposition, as part of the corresponding lekton. Humans can go further than nonrational animals, though, through their ability to focus selectively on individual parts of such content and respond differentially, assenting to some, rejecting others, and withholding assent on still others. This ability to consider isolated contents is what allows rational animals to entertain abstract representations, whose total content can be expressed by a simple proposition; or indeed to entertain any content formed by logical operations upon these (possibly recursively). It is therefore only by reference to the contents of rational representations that we are able to capture the full domain of lekta, much as the definition in Diogenes Laertius and Sextus Empiricus suggests, so as to include abstract as well as perceptual representations. But this does not exclude nonrational animals from also having lekta corresponding to their representations, thus making intentional explanations of their behavior possible and psychology more generally. (For more on Stoic representations and a fuller defense of the interpretation above, see Caston forthcoming.)


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