Central questions of intergenerational justice are: first, whether present generations can be duty-bound because of considerations of justice to past and future people; second, whether other moral considerations should guide those currently alive in relating to both past and future people; and third, how to interpret the significance of past injustices in terms of what is owed to the descendants of the direct victims of the injustices.
Discussions of what we owe to future people go back to ancient times (Auerbach 1995: 27–35) and ancient philosophy provides resources and insights for intergenerational ethics (Lane 2012). Important contributions within the utilitarian tradition include the analysis of the moral status of future sentient beings (see, e.g., Sidgwick 1907 [1981: 414]), of optimal savings (Ramsey 1928, see entry on Ramsey and intergenerational welfare economics), and of obligations of reproduction (Narveson 1967; see §2.2). Within a theory of justice we owe the first systematic account of obligations to future people to John Rawls (see §4.4/§4.5). Derek Parfit’s work has defined the problems of how we can and should relate to future people (see especially §3).
- 1. How Intergenerational Relations Differ from Relations Among Contemporaries
- 2. Rights of Future People vis-à-vis Presently Living People
- 3. No Rights Due to Contingency of Future People Upon Our Decisions?
- 4. How to Specify the Threshold
- 4.1 Specifying the Threshold by Egalitarian Considerations
- 4.2 Specifying the Threshold by Prioritarian Reasoning
- 4.3 Specifying the Threshold as a Sufficientarian Standard
- 4.4 On the Currency of Intergenerational Justice
- 4.5 Rawls’s Just Savings Principle
- 4.6 Limits of a Rights-Based Account: Duties Towards the Future
- 5. The Significance of Past Wrongdoing
- 6. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. How Intergenerational Relations Differ from Relations Among Contemporaries
It may seem that considerations of justice do not apply to intergenerational relations, because there is a lack of direct reciprocity between generations of people who are not contemporaries. Among non-contemporaries, there is no mutual cooperation and there are no exchanges in kind (see Barry 1989b: 189–203; Barry 1991: 231–234; Heyd 2009a: 167–176; but see Gosseries 2009, Mazor 2010, and Brandstedt 2015 for conceptions of indirect and transgenerational reciprocity that do not require that the initial contributor is among the final beneficiaries). This fact about the relations between present and remote past or future generations is closely related to a second feature of intergenerational relations: the permanent asymmetry in power-relations between living people and those who will live in the future. These power relations are qualitatively different from those among contemporaries, which are relatively fluid and subject to change (Barry 1977: 243–44; Barry 1989b: 189).
Not only can the present generation influence the conduct of future people by affecting their desires and circumstances, it can also exercise power by setting back the interests of future generations. It can, for example, pursue a natural-resource policy with long-term negative consequences. In this case, the present generation imposes upon future generations the risk of having their options reduced to an inadequate range—unless, that is, future generations will have available to them and can afford to use technologies that allow them to adapt to the circumstances (Barry 1999; Beckerman 1999; Heyward 2017). By contrast, remote future people cannot at all affect the well-being of the lives of the presently living, at least not today and according to conceptions of well-being that have a subjective component. Still, such future people might nevertheless be considered able to set back the interests of or even wrong present or past persons insofar as the latter have, or had, interests with respect to posthumous future states of affairs. In the same way, the presently living may be morally constrained in their actions that relate to people who lived in the remote past (see §5.4).
Third, those presently alive can affect the very existence of future people (whether or not future people will exist), the number of future people (how many future people will exist), and the identity of future people (who will exist). In short: future people’s existence, number, and specific identity depend (are contingent) upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. A decision taken by present generations could conceivably result in the termination of human life (see, e.g., Scheffler 2013; Mulgan 2015; McKinnon 2017); there is a long tradition of institutionalized population policy whose goal is to control the size of future generations (see, e.g., McMahan 1981); and, more prosaically, a couple can certainly decide whether or not to have children (see §2.2 and §3.2). Furthermore, many of our decisions have indirect effects on how many people will live and who they are, for many of our decisions affect who meets whom and who decides to have children with whom. To explain such “different people choices”, Parfit adopts the genetic identity view of personal identity: the identity of a person is at least in part constituted by the DNA the person has as a result of which ovum was fertilized by this or that spermatozoon in the creation of this person. Our actions thus have an effect on the genetic identity of future people in so far as they affect from which particular pairs of cells future people will grow—and any action that affects people’s reproductive choices, directly or indirectly, will do that. Many of our actions in fact have an indirect effect on when future people will be conceived. If we decide between two long-term policies regarding the use of natural resources, for example, we know that depending on which we choose, different (and most likely also a different number of) future people will come into existence. For example, the European Commission finds that more than one million babies may have been produced as a result of the Erasmus Programme (the European Community Action Scheme for the Mobility of University Students, and with more than three million students participating since 1987), most of who would very likely not have come to existence without at least one of their parents participating in the Programme (European Commission 2014: 130–131).
By contrast, when we make decisions affecting our contemporaries, we do not face different people choices. Our decisions may affect their existence only with respect to their survival; their number only with respect to how many survive; their identity only in the sense that we might be in a position to change their conditions of life, character, and self-understanding. Of course, we can affect neither the number nor the identity of past generations.
Lastly, our knowledge of the future is limited. While we can know the particular identities of presently existing people (and very many previously living people), we are normally not in a position to refer to specifically identifiable future persons. It is not that all predictions about the future decrease in certainty at some constant rate (see Cowen & Parfit 1992: 148). Indeed, many predictions are more likely to be true concerning the further future than the more immediate future. For example, the prediction that some policy will have changed or that certain resources will have been exhausted is more likely to be true in the further future. Nonetheless, we cannot know the specific identities of persons in the further future. Our lack of certain knowledge of the future also means that we often will be in a position to know at best merely the likelihood of normatively relevant consequences of alternative long-term policies.
These differences between our relations to one another and our relations to subsequent or antecedent generations give rise to a number of important debates. Among them are the following: The first concerns the normative significance of the non-changeable fact that remote future people as well as deceased people do not even have the potential for exercising power over presently living people. According to the Will Theory, for a person to have a right vis-à-vis another person requires the former to be able to exercise his or her rights with respect to the conduct of the latter (Hart 1955: 183–184; Hart 1982: 183; Wellman 1995: 91–92; Steiner 1994: 59–73). Thus, the unchangeable power-asymmetry among non-contemporaries will exclude the possibility of future non-contemporaries and deceased people being bearers of rights claims against presently living people (Steiner 1983; Steiner 1994: 249–261; Fabre 2001; see also Ackerman 1980: 70–75). Consequently, for the proponents of the Will Theory considerations of justice (as understood in this entry) do not apply to intergenerational relations. According to the Interest Theory of Rights (Raz 1984; Raz 1986: 166–188; Raz 1994: 45–51; Kramer 1998: 60–101) being able to exercise one’s rights—to demand or waive the enforcement of a right—is neither sufficient nor necessary for someone to be the bearer of the right. For a person to hold a right, the right, when actual, necessarily preserves one or more of the persons’ interests (Kramer 1998: 62). Understanding the relations between currently living people and future non-contemporaries in terms of justice assumes that for a person to have a valid justice claim vis-à-vis another person (who stands under the correlative duties) does not depend upon being able to harm or benefit the other person (Barry 1989b: chs. 4–6; Buchanan 1990; but see Gauthier 1986; Heyd 2009a; Hiskes 2009: 9).
The second debate concerns the normative significance of the contingency of future people upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. If and insofar as the existence, identity, or number of future people depend upon present decisions and actions, to what extent can the former be said to be harmed by the latter? Furthermore, can presently existing persons, in making such decisions, be guided by the interests of future persons? These are the questions that underlie the so-called “Non-Identity-Problem” (see §3 and §4; see also entry on nonidentity problem).
The third debate concerns the status of previously living people. Is it possible for currently living people to harm past people, and do currently living people have duties toward them? (See §5)
Other important debates include the interpretation of the significance of our limited knowledge of the future. As we know at best merely the likelihood of the differing consequences of alternative policies, how should we assess the imposition of differing risks on and the likely or uncertain provision of benefits for future people? (See, e.g., Birnbacher 1988: 140–172, 175–179; Jonas’ notion of a “Heuristik der Furcht” (heuristics of fear) in 1979: 63–64; Mintz-Woo 2019). Some focus on how how to assess the imposition of differing risks of rights violations (see, e.g., McCarthy 1997; Oberdiek 2012; Perry 2014; Meyer & Stelzer 2018). Another issue is whether we have reasons to discount the future in the sense of discounting future persons’ well-being (see, e.g., Sidgwick 1907 [1981: 414]; Ramsey 1928: 261; Rawls 1971: 263; Parfit 1984: appendix F; Cowen & Parfit 1992; Broome 1994; Mintz-Woo forthcoming). A further debate concerns the motivation that currently living have for fulfilling their supposed duties to future people, given that currently living people know neither future people’s individual identities nor their particular preferences. Partly due to these features as well as the unchangeable asymmetry in power-relations between currently living people and remote future generations, currently living people’s compliance with their obligations to remote future people is likely to be less reliable (see Birnbacher 2009)
The entry will report on the second and third debates as they are centrally important for understanding the very possibility of intergenerational justice. In both debates one needs to be clear about how one assesses an act as harmful or beneficial. Owing to the death of the bearer of interests and the contingency of future people the way in which currently living people can be said to harm or benefit previously living and future people is problematic. According to the so-called person-affecting view, an act can be wrong only if that act harms, or will harm or can be expected to harm, a person who does or will exist (see especially Parfit 1984: 363, 295–396; Heyd 1992 and 2014: 2–3; Boonin 2008; Roberts 2013). One important issue is whether one should adopt a person-affecting view or an impersonal view. Some interpret duties of intergenerational justice on the basis of what might be called a weak person-affecting view. According to this view, in assessing whether an act is harmful or wrongful what matters is what has been done to a particular existing or future person. A weakly person-affecting assessment does not require that the act under scrutiny make an existing or future person worse off or harm that person by comparing how well off the person was before. Concerning the questions of whether a future person will be harmed or wronged by having been brought into existence under certain conditions the weak person affecting view relies neither on a comparison with the state the person would have been in had she not been brought into existence, that is with the person’s never-ever existing, nor on a comparison with how well off other people would have been had currently living people acted differently. Never-ever existing and potentially existing people do not count; only those people who actually exist at some time count.
This weak person-affecting view stands in contrast to a strong person-affecting view according to which an act or action harms a person only if the same person is worse off than she would otherwise at that time have been. Both the weak and the strong person-affecting views differ from impersonal views according to which the value of states of affairs is not reducible to their effect on the interests of actual people. Currently living people ought to choose to bring about the state of affairs in which more of the morally relevant values will be realized irrespective of who the people are who will live. Many theorists claim that a plausible understanding of intergenerational ethics must be impersonal or must combine person-affecting and impersonal considerations (see especially J. Harris 1992: 94–95; Singer 1998; Buchanan et al. 2000: 249; Harman 2004: 101–102; McBrayer 2008: 304; Holtug 2009: 71–92; McMahan 2009: 49–68; Temkin 2012: 313–362; Williams & Harris 2014: 347; Heyd’s interpretation of Parfit 2011 in Heyd 2014; Parfit 2017). The differences between the person-affecting and impersonal understandings will come to the fore in Section 2.2 and Section 3 on intergenerational duties that reflect what is owed to future people as a matter of justice as well as in Section 4.6 on the limits of a rights-based account of intergenerational ethics.
2. Rights of Future People vis-à-vis Presently Living People
On a person-affecting view, future people count if, and insofar as, they have interests, just claims, or rights vis-à-vis currently living people. Some philosophers deny that this can ever be the case. In addition to an argument reflecting the “Non-Identity-Problem” (§§2.2; 3–4.3) we can distinguish at least three further arguments in support of the denial of the possibility of future people having rights vis-à-vis us.
2.1 Doubts about the Possibility of Future People Having Rights
First, some philosophers have denied that future people can have rights (or just claims), based simply on the fact that they will live in the future. Consider the following claim:
Future generations by definition do not exist now. They cannot now, therefore, be the present bearer or subject of anything, including rights. (De George 1981: 161; see also Macklin 1981: 151–152; Beckerman & Pasek 2001: 14–23; Herstein 2009: 1180–1182)
Claiming that we can violate the rights of future people now does not, however, imply that future people have rights now (though see Partridge 1990: 54–55, who suggests that future people have rights in the present). That implication would hold only if it were conceded that presently existing rights alone constrain present action. But we can safely assume, first, that future people will be bearers of rights in the future, second, that the rights they have will be determined by the interests they have then, and third, that our present actions and policies can affect their interests. If we can violate a person’s rights by frustrating her interests severely, and if we can so severely frustrate such interests of future people, we can violate their future rights (see Hoerster 1991: 98–102). Their future existence itself is thus insufficient to ground the claim that we cannot now violate the rights of future persons.
According to the second argument, for future people to have rights vis-à-vis us we would have to ascribe a right to existence to them. However, we are not committed to the claim that if we are able now to violate the rights of future generations, it is their rights to existence that we violate. Since it is implausible that anyone has a right to existence as such, it is implausible that future persons have rights to existence. Furthermore, when we prevent someone’s existence, we do not thereby harm the hypothetical interests of this potential subject. Thus, claiming that actual future people have rights vis-à-vis currently living people now cannot commit us to claiming that possible future people have a right to existence.
The third argument points to the fact that our epistemic situation does not allow us to relate to future people as individuals. Can our present actions nonetheless be constrained by rights of future generations that are based on interests other than existence as such, interests such as subsistence, etc.? This is possible only if attributing rights to people does not require us to make reference to individual persons (Herstein 2009: 1180–1182). However, third, lack of particular knowledge of future people as individuals does not stand in the way of attributing to them welfare rights, such as a right to subsistence.  The corresponding obligations do not depend on the particular identity of future persons. Rather, such obligations are grounded in the fact that future persons are human beings; that is, they share those properties of being human that permit and require us to relate morally to them as fellow humans who should be able to pursue their own well-being.
Having reported on skeptical doubts concerning the possibility of future people having rights vis-à-vis currently living people we now turn to an analysis of the relevance of the contingency of future people—the subject that, under the title of the “Non-Identity-Problem” has been at the core of much of the philosophical inquiry into the foundations of intergenerational justice (§§3–4.4; see also entry nonidentity problem). We will introduce that core issue by addressing a specific criticism of the person-affecting view in the context of intergenerational justice (§2.2): Some have argued that a person-affecting view cannot account for the widely held belief that persons have the right not to be brought into existence if the person-to-be would not reach a sufficiently good (or decent) level of well-being.
2.2 A Right to Non-Existence?
Can prospective children be said to have an interest that their parents not act in a way likely to lead to their birth when the parents are in a position to know that the life of the child, should it be born, would fall below some relevant threshold of well-being? (On the significance of the notion of a threshold level of well-being, see below, §3 and §4). John Stuart Mill endorses the idea of a procreational duty of omission, namely, not to bring a person into existence unless the person will have “at least the ordinary chances of a desirable existence” (see Mill 1859 [1977: 301–304]). It is a widely held belief that under certain circumstances prospective parents should refrain from procreating owing to the predicted plight of the would-be child. Antinatalists hold that these conditions hold generally (see, e.g., Schopenhauer, 1851: vol. 2, ch. xii, § 149; Cioran, 1978: 117; Horstmann 1983: 99–101). More recently, for example, Seana Shiffrin (1999) and David Benatar (2006: esp. ch. 2) have argued that causing someone to exist always entails the frustration of some of the person’s interests and nontrivial harm to that person, and therefore we ought to refrain from procreating.
Since the publication of Narveson’s seminal paper “Utilitarianism and New Generations” (Narveson 1967; see also Narveson 1973), many have contributed to the debate on whether a person-affecting approach can account for the asymmetry of our procreational duties (Parfit 1976; Feinberg 1984: 101, and 1986; Mulgan 2006: ch. 6; Rivera-López 2009). The claimed asymmetry is the following: while prospective parents have no obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of possible future children, they have an obligation not to beget children who are going to be miserable.
Some have argued that belief in such an asymmetry is incompatible with a person-affecting view and, more particularly, with the claim that possible people cannot be said to have, against us, a right to existence. It is helpful at this point to make a distinction between the reasoning of potential parents that involves a possible future child and reasoning that involves their future child (see Govier 1979: 111). For instance, in deciding not to procreate at all people do not thereby harm the children they could have brought into existence (see §2.1) since these are merely possible individuals. Thus, much reasoning about whether or not to have a child should concern the interests of those already alive; it is actual people’s lives that would be affected by whether or not the child comes into existence (see Heyd 1992: 96–97; Roberts 2009: sec. 2). Nonetheless, people might make choices about procreation based on the welfare of their future child; that is, the welfare of that as yet non-existent individual would feature in their reasoning. When prospective parents decide in favor of having a child and now learn that this child, if born, would have a life that falls below a certain threshold of well-being (see §4) they ought to consider the effects of their actions on their child and might well decide not to have a child after all.
Objections to the asymmetry view presented above concern, in particular, the claim that after having made a decision to have children, prospective parents should revise their decision out of regard for their would-be child(ren) when they learn that the prospective child(ren) would have a life that falls below the relevant threshold. Why, under these circumstances, should parents revise their decision to have children out of regard for the children? Some argue that they would harm the would-be child, and, thus, arguably, would act wrongly toward it. Here, harming their child-to-be would inflict a wrong on it. When prospective parents learn that their child would have a life that falls below the relevant threshold, they should refrain from having it, for by bringing the child into existence they would cause harm to it. In bringing about a child’s existence they can harm this child.
This claim has been said to be incompatible with a person-affecting view (see Heyd 1992: 102, 105–106, 241–242). In Section 3, two notions of harm will be distinguished. The first relies on comparing a person’s actual state to a counterfactual (or historical) state of the same person. The second relies on no such comparison. Both notions of harm require us to ask: for whom is the action worse? However, while both notions can be understood to reflect the person-affecting view as specified above (§1), only the first fulfills the stronger conditions of Parfit’s “two-state requirement” or “better-or-worse-for-the-same-person” requirement:
we benefit or harm someone only if we cause him to be better or worse off than he would otherwise at that time have been. (Parfit 1984: 487)
This requirement characterizes the strong person-affecting view (as introduced in §1). The contingency of future people will often mean that the same person could not or is not likely to have come into existence as a result of two alternative acts or actions (see below §3.1). As will be shown in Section 3.2 below, in applying the second notion of harm, we do not have to compare the value of life below some threshold with nonexistence (or with how well off another person or other people would have been) in order to be able to claim that we can cause harm to a person by bringing about that person’s existence. The second notion fulfills the conditions of the weak person-affecting view (as introduced in §1).
If on the basis of this reflection we assume that the person can be considered harmed, why was the person wronged by having been brought into existence if the person has a life worth living? If we specify the threshold in terms of rights we might think that the person would waive whatever right was violated by having been brought into existence as the person can be assumed to much prefer living to never-ever-coming into existence. Then we might believe that bringing into existence a person whose life is worth living, but below the threshold, is a case of wrongless harm-doing if we consider the issue in person-affecting terms (see J. Harris 1992: 94–96; Williams & Harris 2014, 347–348).
The assumed fact that the person would waive her right clearly does not settle the matter of whether she was wronged by having been brought into existence (Harman 2004: 89–101; Liberto 2014: 79–80). A person can have a legitimate complaint about having been brought into existence although she does not wish that the action had not occurred, although she (the same person) could not be in the state of not having been wronged (but see Heyd 2014: 4–5), and even though she enjoys a life worth living.
The claim that bringing into existence a person in a harmed state according to a certain threshold is wrongful implies that this person is worse off than she ought to be. That the person will have a life worth living is not a sufficient reason to render permissible bringing the person into existence and in a harmed sub-threshold state. The ground for this reason does not rely on a comparison with how well off the person or other people would be if we refrain from bringing the person into existence or acted differently (but see Harman 2004: 101–102; McBrayer 2008: 304; Woollard 2012). The reason understood in person-affecting terms does not reflect the view that the person would be better off if he or she would never ever come to existence or the view that we should bring into existence another person whose life is above the threshold or the view that we should maximize the number of people with lives above the threshold. Rather, if we have a choice between bringing into existence a person with a life worth living, but below the threshold, and bringing into existence a person with a life worth living at or above the threshold, the reason, namely, that persons can be worse off than they ought to be, speaks against doing the former but not in favor of doing the latter. This is how we can argue on the basis of a weak person-affecting view (see §1) and a threshold conception of harm (see §3).
Let us note that one can also defend the asymmetry of our procreational duties from an impersonal view, according to which the value of states of affairs is not reducible to how these states affect the interests of people. From an impersonal view one does not have to claim that prospective parents should refrain from procreation out of regard for the children they would have. Based on this view, two alternative interpretations of the asymmetry of our procreational duties have been discussed in the literature. One could adopt a version of negative consequentialism and argue that the universe would be better if present generations were guided by a criterion of right action that requires them to give priority to the prevention of suffering over the creation of good and happiness (see Heyd 1992: 59–60, for problems with this account). Alternatively, an impersonal approach could argue that we have a prima facie duty to promote over-all happiness by creating new well off people—which duty, however, may be more easily overridden than duties not to cause harm. The paradoxical implications of the latter view have been prominently explored by Derek Parfit.
3. No Rights Due to Contingency of Future People Upon Our Decisions?
The main source of skepticism concerning the very possibility of future people having welfare rights vis-à-vis those currently living rests upon the contingency of future people upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. We know, of course, that when we harm future people’s interests and violate their rights, specific persons are harmed. But the decision we take counts as a necessary condition of the very existence of this genetically and numerically specific set of people at some future point in time. The so-called “Non-Identity-Problem” presupposes this fact and interprets it as a challenge to the very possibility of intergenerational justice.
3.1 Responses to the “Non-Identity-Problem”
Consider a policy of making intensive and extensive use of exhaustible resources for the aim of increasing the welfare of currently living people. If the policy is criticized for harming future people on the ground that this policy will predictably worsen their conditions of life and thus is likely to violate their welfare rights, a defender of the policy could reply by saying: many, if not all of our actions have (indirect) effects not only on the conditions of life, but also on the number, existence, and identity of future persons. This is also true for actions that allegedly harm future persons. If the non-performance of the allegedly harmful action would have resulted in the allegedly harmed person not coming into existence, then that person cannot be said to have been harmed by this action—or, at any rate, according to the common understanding of harm (see Meyer 2003: 147–149, 155–158, for a detailed discussion).
The common understanding is informed by a diachronic notion of harm and a notion that requires a subjunctive comparison with a historical baseline (hereinafter subjunctive-historical notion of harm). Both the diachronic and the subjunctive-historical notions of harm require that the existence of the harmed person or people qua individuals is independent of the harming act or policy. On the diachronic notion of harm, the following formula holds:
- (diachronic) An action (or inaction) at time \(t_1\) harms someone only if the agent causes (allows) this person to be worse off at some later time \(t_2\) than the person was before \(t_1\).
On the subjunctive-historical notion of harm, the corresponding necessary condition for harming is:
- (subjunctive-historical) An action (or inaction) at time \(t_1\) harms someone only if the agent causes (or allows) this person to be worse off at some later time \(t_2\) than the person would have been at \(t_2\) had the agent not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all.
When considering future individuals as possible individuals both the diachronic and the subjunctive-historical notions of harm will exclude the possibility of present people harming future people, for the (future) people whose interests and rights they are required to respect are not in a particular state of well-being at the time they take their decision—they do not, at that time, exist. But according to (I) unless we can claim that the person is in a particular state of well-being at the time of our decision, that is, at \(t_1\), we cannot say that the person is worse off at \(t_2\) owing to our decision at \(t_1\). And likewise with (II): unless we can claim that there is a specific person who would have been better off at \(t_2\) than this person actually is at \(t_2\) had we not acted with respect to this person at all, this notion of harm makes no sense.
Adopting either the diachronic or the subjunctive-historical notions of harm excludes the possibility of our harming future people when we choose among long-term policies with significantly differing consequences for the quality of life of future people. With respect to persons whose existence is dependent upon the allegedly harming action, they cannot be worse (or, indeed, better) off owing to this action than they would have been had this action not been carried out. For in that case, they would not have existed.
We can distinguish four main responses to the “Non-Identity-Problem” so understood (compare Boonin 2008: 134 ff; Page 2008; Heyd 2009b; Roberts 2013; Wrigley 2012: 178): First, some philosophers hold the view that future people whose existence depends upon currently living people’s actions cannot have rights vis-à-vis the latter people’s actions (see Schwartz 1978; cf. Adams 1979; Kavka 1982; Parfit 1984: part iv; Boonin 2008; Roberts 2009). Second, others argue that currently living people can violate the rights of future people even if the former cannot harm the latter (see Kumar 2003). If so, future people cannot have welfare rights vis-à-vis currently living people insofar as violating welfare rights implies setting back or harming the interests of the right holders. Third, we can attempt to limit the practical significance of the non-identity-problem by limiting the relevant actions to those that are not only likely but indeed necessary conditions of the existence of the concerned person.
Finally, some have sought to circumvent the non-identity-problem by suggesting an alternative notion of harm that is unaffected by the non-identity-problem, the so-called “Threshold Conception of Harm” (Hanser 1990, 2009; McMahan 1998; Shiffrin 1999; Meyer 2003, 2009a; Harman 2004, 2009; Rivera-López 2009). The response to the “Non-Identity-Problem” based on the threshold conception is relevantly different from other responses (such as those criticized by Heyd in 2009b). The threshold response can be understood to be person-affecting in the weak sense (see §1 above): While the person being harmed according to the threshold notion does not imply that the same person is worse off than she would have otherwise been at that time, it does imply that this person is worse off than she ought to be. We owe it to the person when she will have come to existence that she is not in a harmed state (see §2.2 above). Such an understanding is relevantly different from an impersonal understanding according to which the universe is a better place when it does not include people in a harmed state as judged by the threshold Notion (but see Wrigley 2012: 178).
The threshold notion substitutes the necessary condition:
- (threshold) An action (or inaction) at time \(t_1\) harms a person only if the agent thereby causes (allows) either the coming into existence of this person in a sub-threshold state or the already existing person to be in a sub-threshold state; further, only if this person would not be in the harmed state had the agent not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all; and furthermore, only if the agent, if he cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, does not minimize the harm.
According to such a threshold notion of harm an action harms a person only if, as a consequence of that action, the (then existing) person falls below a normatively defined threshold (see McMahan 1998: 223–229; Shiffrin 1999). This threshold notion is unaffected by the non-identity-problem, for here the finding of harm does not require that the person who is in the sub-threshold state would be in a better state in the situation that would have obtained in the absence of the harming action. Thus, future people can be said to be harmed by currently living people’s actions even if these actions are among the necessary conditions of the existence, identity or number of future people. Such a notion of harm limits the practical significance of the non-identity-problem to different degrees depending upon how the threshold is substantially defined (see §4 below).
first, that considerations reflecting the welfare rights of future people vis-à-vis present people can guide the latter in choosing among long-term policies, and
second, that considerations of the rights of people not to be brought into existence if they are likely not to realise a certain level of well-being can guide prospective parents in deciding not to conceive out of regard for the children they would otherwise have,
can be read as relying upon a threshold notion of harm (Meyer 2003).
Adopting either the diachronic or the subjunctive-historical notions of harm (I and II, above) or both excludes, firstly, the possibility of our harming future people when we choose among long-term policies with significantly differing consequences for the quality of life of future people, and, secondly, the possibility that we harm persons by bringing them into existence if they will have a life worth living. But if we adopt the threshold notion of harm at ((III) above), future people can be said to be wronged by our choice of a policy that harms them, notwithstanding the fact that the existence of the specific people who are said to be harmed is causally dependent on our decision to pursue this policy. According to (III) parents could act in light of an interest on the part of their would-be child in never existing at all: if the child were to be born, it would have a life below the relevant threshold. The subject of harm is the person when she is brought into existence in a harmed state. That she would not be worse or better off than she otherwise would have been is irrelevant for determining that she is or will be in a harmed sub-threshold state (see §2.2).
3.2 Derek Parfit’s No-Difference View and the Disjunctive Notion of Harm
Derek Parfit has introduced the “No-Difference View”: It makes no (theoretical or practical) difference to how we should act, all things considered, whether the size and composition of future generations depend upon our present decision or not. The relevant reasons are the same or have the same strength.
To what extent we can defend that view will depend on how we understand the relation between the notions of harm as distinguished in Section 3.1. Here we will delineate two views of how to understand these notions of harm and investigate the question of the extent to which these two alternative views support Parfit’s “No-Difference View”. According to our first view, one must choose between the “single threshold” and the “single subjunctive-historical” notion of harm: to claim that rights-considerations can guide us in choosing among long-term policies we will have to adopt one of these notions of harm as specifying necessary conditions of harm; in doing so, we have to deny that the other notion specifies necessary (or sufficient) conditions of harm. In other words, the first view considers the “single threshold” and the “single subjunctive-historical” notion of harm as exclusive notions. According to the second view, the threshold notion of harm and the subjunctive-historical notion can be combined.
According to this “disjunctive notion” the necessary condition for harming is the disjunction of the conditions for harming as set out by the notions of harm at (II) and (III). The proposal is this: instead of interpreting accounts of harm at (II) and (III) as providing alternative necessary conditions for harming, we can take these two notions to provide the disjuncts for a necessary condition for harming. This disjunctive notion of harm substitutes yet a fourth necessary condition of what it means to harm someone:
- (disjunctive) An action (or inaction) at time \(t_1\) harms someone only if either the conditions of harming as in III or as in II are fulfilled.
We clearly ought to prefer the disjunctive notion to the single subjunctive-historical view according to which the subjunctive-historical notion of harm specifies necessary conditions of harm (and the threshold notion at (III) specifies neither necessary nor sufficient conditions). The disjunctive notion is compatible with the thesis of this entry that relies upon our employing a threshold notion of harm where the subjunctive-historical and the diachronic notions do not apply. Some authors also argue that being worse off than the same person was or would have been is not a necessary condition for harm where the identity of the person is independent of the harming action (Hanser 1990; Shiffrin 1999; Harman 2004: 98–101; Woollard 2012: 681–683; but see Roberts 2009: 19–20). Ought we to prefer the disjunctive notion to the single threshold notion according to which the threshold condition is a necessary condition of harm? The advantage of the disjunctive notion is that this view of harm allows us to rely on the subjunctive-historical notion of harm whenever it is applicable, that is, when we will harm an existing person. In these cases the notion of harm at (II) provides us with what most consider a straightforward account of the harm caused (see also §5.2).
Consider the type of case where we can act in a way that diminishes the well-being of a person who lives above any plausibly construed threshold. However, we will diminish the person’s well-being to a level still clearly above the threshold. For example, someone breaks into the garage of a mansion and steals the new convertible while the wealthy owner is at his penthouse in the city. This theft is not likely to cause the wealthy person’s well-being to fall below any plausibly construed threshold of harm, and thus according to (III) does not harm him. This seems implausible. Such a case is normally understood as a case in which the affected person is clearly harmed. More generally, the objection is that the threshold conception is under-inclusive in interpreting which acts we consider harmful.
The single threshold view by itself does not provide us with a response to this objection. For a plausible substantive specification of a threshold notion (see §4.3 below) will not include a concern for the well-being of those above the threshold. Thus, in responding to the objection we would have to add an additional obligation. For example, we could appeal to the additional obligation of minimizing harm to other persons: The obligation requires that we not cause another person to fall to a lower level of well-being quite independently of the level of well-being the person already realizes. What counts as a lower level of well-being can be measured by the specified threshold.
On the other hand, the disjunctive notion allows us to rely on the notion of harm at (II). This provides us with a straightforward account of the harm caused. Thus, the disjunctive notion is not open to the objection as stated. However, while the single threshold view can be shown to be fully compatible with Parfit’s No-Difference View, the disjunctive notion of harm raises difficult questions of interpretation of its own.
Parfit illustrates the No-Difference View by considering two medical programs (1984: 367). In each case a certain rare condition can be passed from mother to child. One involves pregnancy testing. If the test comes out positive, fetuses are treated for the rare condition. The other involves preconception testing. The women who test positive as carriers of the rare condition are told to postpone conception for at least two months and to undergo (harmless) treatment after which the condition will have disappeared. Available funds can be spent on one or the other program, and the other must be cancelled. Assuming that both programs have equivalent effects on parents, that the conditions lead to the same particular handicap in children, and that the two programs will achieve a similar success rate, the programs differ only in affecting actual people (pregnancy testing) or possible people (preconception testing). The (practical) no-difference view says: our reason to prevent harm to possible future people (those who might be conceived) is as strong as our reason to prevent harm to actual people (those already conceived who will develop from the already existing fetuses in due course). The two medical programs in Parfit’s example are equally worthy and it makes no moral difference which is cancelled.
Is the disjunctive notion of harm compatible with the no-difference view, thus understood? Here we cannot discuss the implications of the disjunctive notion in any detail. We might first observe that both the subjunctive-historical and threshold notions of harm can be employed to interpret many core cases of harm. That is to say, both sets of conditions as specified by the two notions of harm will arguably be satisfied in many cases where most people agree that harm was caused—at least under plausible construals of both notions of harm. Second, in the cases in which not both sets of conditions obtain, we still find that harm was caused, namely, as long as at least one set of conditions obtains. If the threshold notion of harm applies, we find that harm was caused. The disjunctive notion entails that canceling either test causes harm.
However, the disjunctive notion does not entail that it makes no practical difference which test we cancel. A plausible interpretation of the disjunctive notion might be the following: satisfying either set of the conditions provides a reason for objecting to the proposed action; if both sets of conditions obtain, the objection is presumably stronger than when only one set of conditions obtains. According to this understanding of the disjunctive notion and assuming that in Parfit’s example of the two medical programs the children, if either they or their mothers are not treated, will suffer a severe handicap, the objection to canceling pregnancy testing is stronger than the objection to canceling the preconception testing program. Because the handicap is severe, the children will fall below the threshold and the threshold notion of harm provides the same reason for objecting to canceling either program. But if pregnancy testing is cancelled this will be worse for the children who are not treated—the subjunctive-historical notion of harm applies. The subjunctive-historical notion of harm does not, however, provide a reason for objecting to cancellation of preconception testing. The children who will be born handicapped would never have existed if there had been testing prior to conception. This understanding of the disjunctive notion may not, then, be compatible with the no-difference view. An alternative understanding would deny that where both notions of harm are applicable this strengthens the objection to the harmful act. Whether this strengthens the objection and, if so, how much more is a matter of future research (see Woollard 2012: 684–689).
The single threshold interpretation of harm is also compatible with a second and stronger understanding of the no-difference view (Woodward 1986: sects. II and III; Parfit 1986: 856–859): there is no theoretical difference in harming possible future people and harming actual people since the very same reasons hold against harming either group. The disjunctive notion is clearly incompatible with the theoretical understanding of the no-difference view. According to the disjunctive notion it would often not be true that the same reasons hold against harming either such group. When we object to the harming of actual people we will often have additional reasons that reflect the fact that the subjunctive-historical notion of harm applies.
4. How to Specify the Threshold
In Section 2.2 and Section 3 we introduced (the weak person-affecting interpretation of) the threshold conception of harm as a response to the logical-conceptual non-identity-problem. By itself this does not answer the question how this conception is to be understood as an element of a substantive understanding of distributive justice of intergenerational relations. Two debates are particularly relevant: first, the debate on how to understand the principle of distributive justice; and, second, the debate on the currency—that is, how to measure the relevant differences in well-being.
An interpretation of the threshold as an element of a sufficiency conception of intergenerational justice is not mandatory, but seems plausible (as discussed in §4.4): the threshold can be interpreted as a sufficiency standard that is defined in terms of absolute, non-comparative conditions (defined by a certain level of well-being and not comparing the well-being levels of people) and which all people have a priority claim to achieve (Shiffrin 1999: 123–124; McMahan 1998: 223–229; Page 2006: esp. 90–95, 170–173; Casal 2007: 298–299; Meyer & Roser 2009: 226–243; Huseby 2012; Shields 2016: 34–35; Meyer & Pölzler forthcoming). Whether one and the same threshold is applicable to all decisions is controversial. Whether we wrongfully inflict non-comparative harms on a person by causing this person’s existence is often considered a special case for which a particularly low threshold is relevant: we cause such harm by bringing a person to existence only if this person’s postnatal potential of development and his life span are drastically reduced (Kavka 1982: 105–106) and especially so if the person experiences pain (C. E. Harris 1991: 65–66; Schöne-Seifert & Krüger 1993: 257–258; Merkel 2001).
4.1 Specifying the Threshold by Egalitarian Considerations
We might want to understand the threshold as an element of an egalitarian understanding of intergenerational justice. Egalitarian reasons allow us to object to inequalities, for egalitarian reasons make it possible for us to understand relative differences between the states of persons as something “which is itself to be eliminated or reduced” (Scanlon 2005: 6). We might hold that the standing of people relative to their contemporaries is (extrinsically or intrinsically) important (see the entry on equality) and that the threshold notion of harm ought to reflect, say, the average level of well-being that people realize—or that future people will realize: the higher the average level of well-being, the higher the threshold level of harm should be set.
Egalitarian considerations that address relative differences between people can help specify the standard in at least two ways. First, presently existing people may be thought to harm future people by causing them to realize a (much) lower level of well-being than their own contemporaries (Sher 1979: 389). In addition or alternatively, we might hold that the threshold level ought to reflect, say, the average level of well-being of the present generations upon whose decisions the well-being of future people depend. According to such an interpretation presently existing people harm future people by causing them to realize a (much) lower level of well-being than they enjoy themselves (see, for example, Barry 1999).
Still, even if egalitarian considerations that reflect a concern with the relative differences between people can contribute to the specification of the threshold, a plausible threshold arguably is not going to be based on that concern only. Otherwise—this is an implication of the first interpretation—any level of well-being would be considered justified as long as all future people fare equally badly. This presupposes attributing intrinsic value exclusively to equality—an implausible view (see the entry on equality and §4.2 below and §4.5 below). Moreover, to define the threshold standard of well-being of future people as the level of well-being achieved by currently living people (whatever it may be) is less than plausible, unless we were to attribute intrinsic value exclusively to intergenerational equality, so understood (see Marmor 2003, Steiner 2003, Raz 2003, Gosepath 2004: 454–63; and Holtug & Lippert-Rasmussen 2007). This understanding does not only imply that it is worse for future generations to be worse off than the present generation; it also implies that it is, in one respect, worse for future generations to be better off. In the intragenerational context some philosophers have argued that this implication (the recommendation to “level down” persons’ well-being) is implausible (see Parfit 1997; Raz 1986: 230–235). An analogous objection applies to intergenerational relations as well. It is doubtful that a more equal distribution across generations is better if it came at the cost of some generations being worse off, and none being better off. Under certain circumstances this view would deny that currently living people may stand under a duty of justice positively to save for future people so that they will achieve a sufficientarian level of well-being (see §4.5 on Rawls’ “savings principle”).
4.2 Specifying the Threshold by Prioritarian Reasoning
According to the priority view (Parfit 1997: 213; Holtug 2007; Attas 2009: 207–211), equality as such does not matter. It is therefore not open to objections against holding equality to be of intrinsic value. A plausible version of the priority view reads as follows:
Priority view: Benefiting persons matters more the worse off the person is to whom the benefits accrue, the more people are being benefited and the greater the benefits in question.
The priority view has a built-in tendency towards equality, for the view accepts the following egalitarian condition: If X is worse off than Y, we have at least a prima facie reason for promoting the well-being of X rather than Y (unless conditions obtain under which the only or best way of raising the well-being of X is by raising the well-being of Y or conditions under which promoting the well-being of X brings about raising the well-being of Y as a side-effect). Even if prioritarians do not see anything intrinsically bad in social, economic or other differences, their priority view is a derivatively egalitarian view. To this extent it is correctly described as non-relational egalitarianism.
We might want to rely on the priority view for specifying the threshold of harm. On this interpretation, future people are in a harmed state unless they are as well off as such a prioritarian view requires. There are at least two problems in understanding the threshold as an element of a prioritarian understanding of intergenerational justice: First, the priority view is likely to entail excessive intergenerational requirements. Present actions or inactions can improve the well-being of many future generations to at least some extent. Moreover, the number of future people will likely be very large and depends in part upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. Hence, according to prioritarianism, we ought to sacrifice more of our present well-being for the sake of future generations than seems plausible. It might even be the case that we are required to incur significant costs for the sake of only minuscule future benefits (as in this way we might maximize the weighted sum of benefits for future persons (see Rawls 1999: 287; Wolf 2009: 373; Meyer & Roser 2009: 233–235). How likely it is that the priority view has this implication will also depend upon the strength the view gives to the priority of the worse off who are (very) badly off. Of course, the priority view will not have this implication if (whatever currently living people do) all future people were to enjoy levels of well-being that are higher than those of all or most currently living people.
Second, the priority view does not entail a plausible population cap. Under some circumstances having large but badly off future generations might be consistent with prioritizing the number of beneficiaries, the size of benefits and those who are worse off (see entry on repugnant conclusion; Meyer 1997: 139–140).
4.3 Specifying the Threshold as a Sufficientarian Standard
Interpreting the threshold concept as an element of a sufficiency conception of intergenerational justice can take a number of different forms (see Benbaji 2005: 316–321 and 2006; Casal 2007: 312–326; Huseby 2010a). A plausible version is characterized by two theses, namely by what scholars have called the “Positive Thesis” (see especially Casal 2007: 298–299) and the “Shift Thesis” (Shields 2016: 34–35). The Positive Thesis states that we have weighty non-instrumental reasons to secure at least enough of some benefit(s). According to the Shift Thesis,
once people have secured enough there is a discontinuity in the rate of change of the marginal weight of our reasons to benefit individuals further. (Shields 2018: 211)
The Shift Thesis is compatible with several understandings of the relevance of justice-based reasons above the threshold, among them: First, once a person is above the threshold of sufficiency there is no justice-based reason to benefit this person. This claim is often referred to as the “Negative Thesis” of sufficientarianism and has been much criticized (Casal 2007: 299–304). Second, other justice-based reasons apply above the threshold that are less weighty. This would mean that additional justice claims reflecting, for example, prioritarian or egalitarian reasoning (see §4.2 and §4.3) can be valid. Third, the same justice-based reasons as below the threshold undergo a relative change of weight at the sufficiency threshold.
The third understanding of the Shift Thesis relates to a further distinction of how to understand the sufficiency conception. Versions of sufficientarianism differ in how they take into account ethical or justice-based reasons to benefit persons above the threshold of sufficiency. Strong sufficientarianism gives absolute, weak sufficientarianism gives some but not absolute priority to those who are below the threshold. In the intergenerational context weak sufficientiarianism seems more plausible than strong sufficientarianism (Meyer & Stelzer 2018).
Suppose not all presently living and future persons’ claims to sufficiency well-being can be met (but see Wolf 2009: 362). Then we would need to weigh all people’s claims. Proponents of sufficientarianism have proposed different principles of distribution below the threshold of sufficiency. Most prominently, they have argued that we ought to maximize the well-being of present and future individuals below the threshold (so-called “min-deprivation”; Wolf 2009: 356–357); or that we ought to maximize the number of individuals who are sufficiently well-off (so-called “headcount”; Page 2007a: 85–95). Both of these below-threshold principles seem problematic. They will often imply that we ought to sacrifice the worst-off present or future persons for the sake of better-off, but still badly-off persons. According to a third understanding, we should rely on a priority view for unavoidable sub-threshold distributions: benefitting persons below the threshold of sufficiency matters more the more claimants are benefitted and the greater these benefits (Meyer 2009a, 2009b, 2015; Meyer & Roser 2009). This understanding only entails sacrificing the worst-off individuals for the sake of better off but still badly off individuals under circumstances where the former higher weighted claims will be outweighed by the sum of the less weighty claims of more better-off people.
Richard Arneson and others (Arneson 1999, 2000; Roemer 2004; and see Casal 2007: esp. 312–314, 315–318) have objected to thresholds, and especially those that designate an absolute priority—as is characteristic of the position of strong sufficientarianism—on the grounds that we cannot avoid an arbitrary specification of such priority thresholds and, further, that such thresholds are incompatible with our distributive convictions’ being continuous (that is, that they all can be accounted for by means of one principle of distribution). Others have defended a priority threshold against both objections (Crisp 2003: 753–757; Benbaji 2006: 332–344; Page 2007a: 16–18; Dorsey 2008; Huseby 2010b: 180–182; Freiman 2012: 30–33; Shields 2012: 111–115; Sher 2014: chs. 8 and 9; Meyer & Pölzler forthcoming). In specifying a priority threshold one important issue is on what currency we should rely (see §4.4). .
Defining a threshold of well-being according to which both currently and future living people are able to reach a sufficientarian threshold arguably avoids the implausible implications of the egalitarian and prioritarian alternatives when we understand the latter to define thresholds of harm (see §4.1 and §4.2): First, avoiding or reducing differences must not lead to a state of affairs in which people are worse off than they ought to be. Secondly, claims against currently living people are unreasonable if in fulfilling them the currently living people will bring about minimal or even trivial improvements of the well-being of future people but suffer losses themselves, causing them to fall below a plausible threshold level of well-being. Third, the number of people brought into existence ought to be compatible with all people having sufficiently good lives or lives worth living (see Meyer 1997: 139–140).
To be sure, according to the “shift thesis” justice-based reasons may apply above the threshold and they can include egalitarian or prioritarian reasons. And one should note that the reasons for a sufficientarian understanding of intergenerational justice are at least in part specific reasons and are not necessarily relevant for understanding either global justice or the notion of justice that holds among contemporary members of well-ordered societies.
4.4 On the Currency of Intergenerational Justice
If we interpret the threshold as an element of a sufficiency conception of intergenerational justice the threshold identifies a sufficiency standard which all people have a priority claim to achieve. Such an interpretation is supported by a view of the currency of well-being that helps explain why failure to meet the threshold significantly harms people. Basic needs are such a view. If people cannot satisfy their basic needs, they are necessarily and severely damaged: necessarily as the damage does not occur because of special environmental conditions or as the person concerned has special characteristics. Rather, it is because of such conditions and characteristics that currently apply and will remain foreseeably and largely unchanged (Wiggins 1998: 15). The damage is significant because it undermines the conditions for the possibility of a minimally good life (Wiggins 1998: 14). For example, if a person has no access to food, this leads to apathy, organ damage or even death of the person. Such damage is physiologically necessary, regardless of, for example, the nationality, social status or religion of the person concerned. Being able to satisfy basic needs when understood in this way can be protected for reasons of justice by ascribing the corresponding moral rights. The same list of such rights is attributed to all people (wherever and whenever they live), which does not exclude the possibility that changing social, economic and cultural conditions also change the means of satisfying basic needs (the so-called satisfiers of basic needs) (see, e.g., Braybrooke 1987; Sen 1984; Nussbaum 2000: 132–133; Page 2006: 71–75).
The currency of central capabilities (see Nussbaum 2006; Petz 2018) is highly similar to basic needs. Other currencies differ in relevant ways (Meyer & Pölzler forthcoming). For example, the currency of preference-satisfaction (whatever these preferences happen to be) (see, e.g., Arrow 1963; Goodin 1995; Singer 1979) measures well-being not in objective, but in subjective terms: what a person prefers is contingent on mental states, namely on the preferences of this person. Also, the direction of future changes in preferences is difficult to predict; it is possible and plausible that future persons will have (fundamentally) different preferences than persons living today. The currency of impersonal resources (i.e., goods that can be used to produce many kinds of benefits; for example, income and wealth) (see, e.g., Barry 1989a; Rawls 2001) faces a different problem: people’s levels of impersonal resources do not necessarily correlate with levels of well-being realized. Impersonal resources are unreliable indicators of well-being (see Page 2007b: 457–458; Sen 1982: 19–21, 26–30).
4.5 Rawls’s Just Savings Principle
John Rawls was the first to develop a systematic account of obligations to future people as a central element of a theory of justice (Rawls 1971, 1999, especially section 44; Rawls 1993: 274; Rawls 2001: especially sections 49.2 and 3). Rawls proposes a principle of “just savings”. Long before Rawls Frank Ramsey developed a model for determining the optimal savings within a utilitarian framework (Ramsey 1928; see entry on Ramsey and intergenerational welfare economics) disregarding distributional considerations. Following Sidgwick (1907 [1981: 414]) Ramsey (1928: 261) as well as Rawls (1971: 263) and Parfit (1984: appendix F) reject what is called “pure time discounting”, that is, giving less weight to the well-being or legitimate claims of future people just because they live in the future. A long-standing issue in economics is how loans and taxes for financing public policies compare in terms of the burdens imposed on future generations (see e.g., Pigou 1920: ch. ix; Viner 1920; Mishan 1963). Provisions to protect the welfare interests of future generations have been in place since ancient times (Auerbach 1995: 27–35; Wissowa et al. 1937: vol. xi, 2011, 2014, 2021).
In proposing a principle of “just savings” Rawls never discusses the non-identity-problem and for most of his discussions (but see Rawls rev. edition 1999: 141) he assumes that the number of future people is constant (for criticism see Heyd 1992: 47; Dasgupta 1994; Casal & Williams 1995; Barry 1999: 107–111; Gosseries 2001: 330–333). However, his principle of just savings can be understood to provide us with a substantive understanding of intergenerational sufficientarianism. It can be understood as an interpretation of a threshold notion of harm in different number choices (see Reiman 2007; Attas 2009).
Rawls specifies the sufficientarian threshold relevant for defining currently living people’s obligations of justice vis-à-vis future people: “the conditions needed to establish and to preserve a just basic structure over time” (Rawls 2001: 159; on the basic structure as the subject of the application of a sufficientarian principle see also Freiman 2012: 33–37; Meyer 2015). Rawls distinguishes two stages of societal development for the application of his principle of just savings. Currently living people have a justice-based reason to save for future people only if such saving is necessary for allowing future people to reach the sufficientarian threshold as specified. This is known as the accumulation stage. Once just institutions are securely established—this is known as the steady-state stage—justice does not require people to save for future people. Rather they should do what is necessary to allow future people to continue to live under just institutions. Rawls also holds that, in that second stage, people ought to leave their descendants at least the equivalent of what they received from the previous generation (see Gosseries 2001 for a comparative assessment of Rawls’s substantive principle). This additional claim can be supported by egalitarian considerations (see §4.1), the idea of a presumption in favor of equality (see Sidgwick 1907 [1981: 379–380], and the entry on equality) and by the considerations delineated in the next section (§4.6).
As is characteristic of Rawls’s work, he presents the just savings principle as the outcome of a decision reached in the contractualist (hypothetical and non-historical) decision-situation of the original position. Who are the persons in the original position? Rawls considers an original position in which every generation is represented. However, as the relations between the contractors so conceived are not characterized by the “circumstances of justice” (Rawls 1971: paragraph 22), the question of justice as Rawls understands it does not arise: We cannot cooperate with previous generations and, while previous generations can benefit or harm us, we cannot benefit or harm them (see §1). Instead Rawls therefore adjusts the (present-time of entry) interpretation of the original position for the intergenerational context (Rawls 1993: 274; Rawls 2001: paragraph 25.2). The contractors know that they belong to one generation, but the veil of ignorance blinds them to which particular generation they belong (see Gardiner 2009: esp. 97–116, and Heyd 2009a: esp. 170–176, for a comparative analysis of how contract theories can be extended to the subject matter of intergenerational relations). From the position of the original position the contractors determine a just savings rate.
While the circumstances of justice clearly hold among contemporaries, the contractors cannot know whether previous generations have saved for them. Why then should they agree to save for future generations? In A Theory of Justice (1971: 284–293), Rawls stipulates “a motivational assumption” according to which the contractors care for their descendants so that they will want to agree to save for their successors—irrespective of whether previous generations saved for them (for criticism see, e.g., Hubin 1976/77: 70–83; English 1977: 91–104; Heyd 1992: 41–51). In Political Liberalism, Rawls withdraws this motivational assumption. He now understands previous generations’ non-compliance with a just savings principle as a problem of non-ideal theory (Rawls 1993: 274, fn. 12; for criticism see, e.g., Dasgupta 1994: 107–108).The original position, however, belongs to ideal theory: strict compliance with whatever principles are agreed on is assumed (Rawls 1971: 144–145). Rawls introduces problems of partial and non-compliance only at the level of non-ideal theory (Rawls 1971: ch. iv). In accordance with this understanding of ideal theory, Rawls assumes that the generations are mutually disinterested. He takes the contractors to agree to a savings principle
subject to the further condition that they must want all previous generations to have followed it.
Thus the correct principle is that which the members of any generation (and so all generations) would adopt as the one their generation is to follow and as the principle they would want preceding generations to have followed (and later generations to follow), no matter how far back (or forward) in time. (Rawls 1993: 274; Rawls 2001: 160)
The principle of just savings thus agreed on is thought to be binding for all previous and future generations.
4.6 Limits of a Rights-Based Account: Duties Towards the Future
A sufficientarian interpretation of the threshold notion of harm (together with an appropriate conception of wrongdoing) seems to provide us with a plausible understanding of what is owed to future people: the fact that future persons’ existence is contingent on our present decisions does not matter where what is in question is our ability to harm future people’s interests and to violate their rights. By employing a non-comparative notion of harm one can justify the present generation’s duties not to violate the rights of future generations against being harmed. Accordingly, rights-based considerations may not bear merely upon “same people choices”, but will bear also upon both types of “different people choices” that Parfit distinguishes, namely “same number choices” (in which the same number of future people live, irrespective of present choices) and “different number choices” (in which a different number of future people will live depending on which choices we now make) (Parfit 1984: 355–356). Thus, intergenerational sufficientarianism allows us to specify the considerations of justice relevant for decisions concerning population policies: Future people have rights vis-à-vis us that reflect considerations of justice as specified by intergenerational sufficientarianism. Our correlative duties set a normative framework for most of our decisions concerning future people, including those that have an impact on their number and identity.
However, such a framework does not provide a complete moral theory of intergenerational relations and especially not in the context of decisions on the existence, number, and identity of future people. There are concerns for future people that cannot be accounted for by rights-based considerations (Jonas 1979; Heyd 1992 and 2009a; De-Shalit 1995: ch. 1; Meyer 1997; Thompson 2009; Scheffler 2013: 60–63, 72–73,80–81; Sanklecha 2017a, 2017b). First, consider the notion that it is important that there be future people at all. However, a person-affecting intergenerational sufficientarianism will account for the asymmetry of our procreational duties (see §2.2): On the one hand, prospective parents should refrain from procreation out of regard for the child(ren) they would have if the life of their child(ren) would fall below the relevant sufficientarian threshold. On the other hand, people have no obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of possible future children. Possible people have no right to be brought into existence (and we do not have the correlative obligation to procreate).
Second, consider the claim that future people should have a life that is well above the level of well-being specified by a threshold notion of harm. According to the Shift Thesis (introduced in §4.3) intergenerational sufficientarianism is compatible with denying that people have above-threshold justice claims and with understanding these claims as less weighty justice claims. The second concern, in part, reflects a third concern, namely the notion that future people should be able to share (at least certain aspects of) the particular way of life of currently living people. But, presumably, currently living people do not violate the rights of future people by failing to sustain particularly valuable aspects of their way of life for them. Thus, if we take into account all three of the above restrictions, intergenerational sufficientarianism may specify no reason for preferring a future with people all of whom have lives far above the level of a sufficiency threshold to a future with no people.
Clearly, considerations based on the rights of future people cannot or cannot fully account for all the concerns we might have for future people. What considerations besides rights-based considerations can guide us in our relations to future people? It has been suggested that the widely shared concerns about the continuation of human life on earth at a high level of well-being can, at least in part, be accounted for by an obligation toward future people that have no correlatives in future people’s rights vis-à-vis current people. This obligation reflects those widely shared concerns about future people which cannot be accounted for by rights-based considerations. The obligation can be described along the following lines (Baier 1981; Meyer 2005: chs. 4 and 5; Thompson 2009): those currently alive owe respect to highly valuable goods that their predecessors bequeathed to them as well as to more remote future people, and they also owe respect to the highly valuable future-oriented projects of their contemporaries. Owing such respect gives rise to a general obligation, namely that current people should not willfully destroy the inherited goods and the conditions that are constitutive of persons’ pursuit of future-oriented projects. In other words, such respect gives rise to a general obligation that one not willfully destroy the social practices on which the possibility of people pursuing future-oriented projects depends. While future people belong to the beneficiaries, the obligation is owed to both present and past people (see also §5.4).
5. The Significance of Past Wrongdoing
Intergenerational justice concerns the relations between generations. This section discusses the three issues that have been central to the philosophical investigation of the relations between past people and currently living people and to understanding the significance of what happened in the past (and, in particular, of past wrongs) for currently living (and future) people’s justice claims: First, how can currently living people be understood to be negatively affected by historical injustices? Second, can the ongoing effect of past wrongs become legitimate when circumstances change? And, thirdly, we need to address the question of the moral status of deceased persons and dead victims of injustice in particular.
5.1 Non-Identity-Problem and Claims to Compensation
Concerning the first issue the non-identity-problem can be relevant: how can individuals today have a just claim to compensation owing to what was done to others in the past when the (potential) claimants may not exist today had past people not suffered these harms (Morris 1984; Kumar & Silver 2004; Kershnar 2004: 70–75; Meyer 2004b and 2013)? For example, do African Americans, whose ancestors were subjected to the terrible injustices of being kidnapped in Africa and subsequently enslaved, have a just claim to compensation? (See, e.g., Bedau 1972; Boxill 1984 ; Brooks 1999: parts 6 and 7; Soyinka 1999: 44–69; Fullinwider 2000; Lyons 2004b; Miller & Kumar [eds] 2007) Let us set aside a host of specifically legal questions concerning, for example, the statute of limitations and liability. Let us also assume that it is sometimes possible to identify with certainty direct descendants of enslaved people. Consider the case of Robert, who has been identified as one such person (see Fishkin 1991: 91–93). People can claim compensation for harms they suffered. As a descendant of enslaved people, has Robert been harmed owing to the injustices suffered by his ancestors?
First, consider briefly the common understanding of harm, namely the subjunctive-historical understanding (see §3.1). According to this interpretation of harm, a person can be understood to be fully compensated for an act or policy (or event) when she is as well off as she would have been had the act not been carried out. According to this interpretation of harm, it is not the case that Robert has been harmed by his ancestors’ having been kidnapped and enslaved. If his ancestors had not been kidnapped and enslaved, Robert would not exist today. His existence depends on the fact that the genealogical chain was not broken at any point. Hence, the initial kidnapping in Africa, the transport to America, and the slavery of his ancestors are necessary conditions for Robert’s having come into existence at all. He would not have been better off had his ancestors not been badly wronged. Thus, we cannot rely upon this interpretation of harm and its accompanying interpretations of compensation in claiming that Robert has been harmed and should be compensated; the required state of affairs under this interpretation implies the nonexistence of the claimant to compensation.
To this claim we can respond in a number of ways. As suggested by our discussion in section 3 and section 4 we can allow for an identity-independent notion of harm in addition to the common identity-dependent notion of harm. Consider the threshold notion of harm at (III). Under this interpretation of harm, a person can be understood to be fully compensated for an act or policy (or event) if that person does not fall below the specified standard. According to this interpretation, Robert can be harmed because his ancestors were kidnapped and enslaved. Whether Robert has been harmed due to the way his ancestors were treated depends upon whether the way they were treated has led to Robert’s falling below the specified standard of well-being. That this is true in the case of Robert, however, will turn on a causal link between the past injustices and his current state of well-being. Employing this interpretation of harm and its accompanying interpretation of compensation requires a forward-looking assessment of what others ought to do today in terms of providing compensation for past injustice. By providing measures of compensation they ought to counteract the consequences of past wrongs in such a way that the indirect currently living and future indirect victims are as well off as they ought to be. When we analyze historical claims on the basis of such a threshold notion of harm, the current (and future) normative relevance of past wrongs will depend upon their causal relevance for the well-being of currently living (and future) generations. Fulfilling our duties to both the latter might well require compensation for the consequences that stem from the fact that their predecessors have been badly wronged. That their predecessors were wronged, however, does not in itself (independently from its particular consequences) give rise to just claims of compensation on the part of their descendants today.
5.2 The Common Understanding of Harm and Compensation for Past Injustices
The common understanding of harm (see §3.1) can be relevant for the justification of measures of compensation for past injustices. First, the non-identity-problem does not arise with respect to surviving victims of wrongs. The harm done to surviving victims can be understood in accordance with the common understanding of harm: the past wrongdoing caused these people to be worse off than they would have been in the absence of that act or policy. These individuals would be fully compensated for the harm done to them where it the case that as a result of compensation undertaken they are as well off as they would be if the policy had not been carried out.
Second, consider the case of people having been wrongfully expelled from their homeland and not having received compensation for the wrongs inflicted upon them. For their descendants it might well be true that they would not exist had their parents and (great-) grandparents not been expelled. However, the descendants can be said to be victims of the additional wrong that their parents did not receive compensation for the wrongs inflicted upon them. The individual descendants can be said to have been harmed from conception or birth because of the lack of sufficient compensation to their parents (Sher 2005; and see Butt 2006, Cohen 2009, and Herstein 2008). Again, the harm done to them can be understood in accordance with the common understanding of harm: If those entities which stand under the obligation to provide compensation to the first generation of displaced persons do not (entirely) fulfill their obligations, they thereby harm the descendants of the first generation of displaced people by making those descendants worse off than they would otherwise be—that is, if (sufficient) compensation had been provided by the first generation. This line of argument can be extended to the second, third, fourth etc. generation: generation X of displaced people would be fully compensated for the harm done to them were it the case that as a result of compensation undertaken the people of generation X are as well off as the people of this generation would be if the first generation of displaced people had received the compensation they were entitled to. While it is clear that thus understood the later generations’ claims to compensation do not have to contend with the non-identity-problem (Sher 2005), what is owed to them will depend on how best to understand the counterfactual relevant to determine the amount of compensation owed.
How best to understand the relevant counterfactual is an intricate problem (cf. Sher 1979, 1981). Let us take note of two issues. First, the legitimacy of people’s claims to compensation arguably can depend upon their actions (and inactions) and the impact these have on their well-being. Of course, these actions (and inactions) can normatively be attributed to people only insofar as they make the decision to act (or not act) under certain conditions, for example, specified in terms of rational and autonomous agency. If so, then the strength of later generations’ claim to compensation—owing to the failure of providing sufficient compensation to the first generation that suffered the initial harm—may wane over time. The more the descendants’ well-being can be attributed to actions or inactions for which they themselves or members of the intermediate generations are responsible, the less the hypothetical state of affairs that would obtain had the direct victims received adequate compensation is relevant for the determination of the claims of the indirect victims (assuming we could know what that state would be) (Sher 1981). This insight is likely to be of little practical significance for the claims to compensation of the first couple of generations of descendants for the direct victims. The harm done to their ancestors is not ancient. Thus, the descendants’ claim to compensation—based on the harm inflicted on them due to the failure of providing adequate compensation for the initial harm—is likely to be strong.
Second, the claims to compensation may be thought to increase over time. Historical injustices may well have resulted in ongoing systemically unequal distributions of life chances due to the inheritance of the benefits stemming from historical injustices on the side of the descendants of the perpetrators (see Butt 2013). These differences can be considered relevant for how much compensation is owed to currently living indirect victims.
5.3 Superseding Historical Injustices
We now turn to a second source of doubts about the validity of historical claims to reparations. Injustices committed against people in the past may not give rise to claims to reparations today if such claims can be understood to presuppose an indefensible interpretation of property entitlements. Jeremy Waldron (Waldron 1992a; Waldron 1992b: 27; Waldron 2002, 2003, 2004a; Waldron 2004b: 37; Waldron 2006a, 2006b, 2007; Quist & Veraart 2009; see also Lyons 1977) argues that the view that once we acquire entitlements they continue until we transfer or relinquish them is indefensible since there are reasons of principle (not only pragmatic reasons for, e.g., the statutes of limitations and the doctrine of adverse possession (see Marmor 2004: 326–329)) for holding that entitlements and rights are sensitive to changes of circumstances that typically occur in time. So-called “supersession” of claims owing to past injustices arguably might concern different types of claims and occur through changes in several types of circumstances, which have consequences for the (1) distributions of goods, (2) connections to specific objects, (3) group identity, and for (4) sovereignty (Meyer & Waligore 2018).
Waldron put forward the supersession thesis with respect to indigenous peoples in the U.S., Canada, Australia, and New Zealand, and others have discussed the idea in this context (Patton 2005; Sanderson 2011; Spinner-Halev 2012; Waligore 2016, 2017, 2018). The supersession thesis has also been discussed in the context of Israel/Palestine (Meisels 2003, 2009: ch. 2; Meyer 2004b; Gans 2008: ch. 4), Fiji (Carens 2000: ch. 9), and Pacific Island nations threatened by climate change (Nine 2010). The supersession thesis has become influential among theorists both skeptical and supportive of reparations for past injustice (see, for example, Kymlicka 1995: 220; Thompson 2002; R. Hill 2002; Wenar 2006; Nine 2008;; Waligore 2009; Marmor 2004; Hendrix 2005; Kolers 2009: ch. 3; Butt 2009: 145–48).
According to Waldron, entitlement to land is based upon the idea that such entitlement can be an integral part of people’s life plans and projects as individuals and as members of groups. Entitlements to land can be important for people being able to autonomously realize particular goods of their way of life. When circumstances change the entitlement might no longer be important in that sense or decrease in its normative significance. For example, the entitlement of original owners might weaken over time if they are separated from the land. Having been separated from the land, entitlement to the land might no longer be important for the original owners autonomously realizing their way of life. Thus, generally speaking, entitlements are sensitive to background circumstances and they are vulnerable to prescription. As Waldron argues, property entitlement is a set of claim rights, liberty rights and powers that are “circumstantially sensitive” (Waldron 1992b: 23; see also Lyons 1977 [1981: 370]).
Further, if legitimate entitlement is sensitive to background changes, it is possible that the ongoing effect of an illegitimate acquisition and, more generally, of unjust violations of rights of others can become legitimate when circumstances change. Waldron’s primary example of supersession concerns “distributive considerations”. Waldron says that any plausible theory of property must be “circumstantially sensitive” and therefore must allow for the “possibility” of supersession (Waldron 1992b: 25; Waldron 2004a: 67–71). He gives an example in which the violation by one group of the legitimate rights of another group to a given waterhole is superseded by ecological catastrophe such that the interlopers acquire a right to share what they had wrongly begun to use. In these circumstances,
they are entitled to share that water hole. Their use of [the waterhole] no longer counts as an injustice; it is now in fact part of what justice now requires. The initial injustice by [the first group] against [the second] has been superseded by circumstances. (Waldron 2004a: 67)
Hence justice may require that original owners of land share their land with others and they may be required to share even with those who unjustly appropriated the land.
Even in cases of so-called ancient historical injustice one might have doubts that the conditions for supersession are fully met (Patton 2004: 167–171) (so that no historical claims continue to be valid). With respect to more recent injustices the conditions for their supersession will often not be met (see Lyons 2004a: 296; Meyer 2007: 301–305). One might also doubt that supersession is to be understood as final. In order to account for the complexities of the real world cases of historical injustice and their consequences it might be helpful to distinguish between “partial supersession” and “full supersession” (Meyer & Waligore 2018: 227–228) and between “final supersession” and “dormant supersession” (Meyer & Waligore 2018: 228–229).
5.4 Surviving Duties
The considerations of section 5.1 and section 5.2 suggest that currently living and future people can have a just claim to compensation owing to what was done to others in the past. If so, currently living people ought to attempt to counteract the negative impact of past wrongs for the well-being of current and future people. However, one could argue that such an interpretation of the relevance of past injustices is incomplete when understood as a statement of how we ought to respond to the fact that past people were severely wronged. To many it is intuitively plausible that present generations can have duties to dead victims owing to the wrongs committed against them (by others) in the past. The moral significance of past wrongs does not exclusively lie in their impact on present and future people’s well-being; rather, the significance of past wrongs is also to be seen in the fact that past people were victims of these injustices. If this intuition can be defended, we have duties to past generations that are grounded in past deeds. This would imply that at least some aspects of historical injustice cannot be accounted for by an historically informed theory of justice between contemporaries (or between contemporaries and future people).
To attribute rights to dead people may seem unproblematic if we assume that people continue to exist after their physical death and that they may be affected by (and affect) events of this world. These assumptions about the ontological status of previously living people are, however, at least as controversial as their converse (see Mulgan 1999: 54–55). Assuming that dead people cannot be bearers of interests or rights and thus that those presently alive can neither harm nor wrong dead people, Joel Feinberg and others have discussed two alternative interpretations of posthumous harm (Boonin 2019). Both positions are compatible with the hypothesis that
- either the deceased do not exist (a1) or, if they do exist, there is no connection between them and those currently alive (a2).
According to the first interpretation, present generations can be said to owe something to surviving interests as such—that is, to interests that the deceased had, while alive, with respect to future posthumous states of affairs. However, while we have reasons to care about individual people, it is not clear that we have reasons to care about interests as such. According to the second (re-)interpretation (see Feinberg 1974 ; Feinberg 1977: 301–302), the significance of posthumous events is fully accounted for by the harm that these events cause a person during her life. However, this interpretation is not an interpretation of posthumous harm as such but of harm to living people that is caused by posthumous events. Arguably, this position is not compatible with our normal understanding of the significance of posthumous events (see Gosseries 2004: ch. iv, sects. 4–5).
A fourth position, the position of surviving duties, is compatible with presupposition (A) and does not rely on any of the criticized views (see Wellman 1995: 155–157; Meyer 2005: chs. 4 and 5; Scheffler 2013: esp. 42–43, 52–53). The position of surviving duties relies upon the following claims: Some rights are future-oriented in the sense that they impose duties in the future. Such rights can impose surviving duties; they imply duties that are (also) binding after the death of the bearer of the right if the appropriate bearer of the duty is identified. According to this position, duties survive the death of the bearer of the right. While the bearer of the right no longer exists, currently living people can stand under the correlative duties. The notion of surviving duties relies on the idea that the reasons for a person’s right imply reasons for a correlative duty under which other people may stand even after the death of the bearer of the right. If it is a moral right, then these reasons will also include general social reasons which are relevant not only for the bearer of the right but also for the bearer(s) of the surviving duty, his contemporaries (and future people). For example, we all have reasons to protect people’s trust that promises be kept and that people have the reputation they deserve. The reasons for the surviving duties also include the reasons that are necessary for showing that a particular person had the moral right.
The idea of surviving duties rests neither on the claim that deceased people can be bearers of interests or rights (contrary to the first position), nor on the claim that we have reason to care about interests that have no current bearers (contrary to the second position). The position of surviving duties does not reject the notion that currently living people can be harmed by what are to them posthumous events (for example, when people learn shortly before their death that a project that they deeply care about is doomed to failure). However, the position of surviving duties is meant to answer a different question, namely, whether present generations can be said to owe something to dead people and, in particular, to those who were victims of past injustices.
One might wonder whether this interpretation of surviving duties is compatible with the presupposition that dead people are bearers of neither interests nor rights and that they cannot be affected by the actions of present persons. At the very least, the position of surviving duties as delineated presupposes the possibility of the attribution of posthumous properties and, more particularly, of their change—an assumption that has been defended as rather unproblematic (see Ruben 1988: 223–231).
5.5 Carrying Out Acts of Symbolic Compensation in Fulfilling a Surviving Duty Towards the Dead Victims
Does the theory of surviving duties contribute to an understanding of the moral significance of the fact that past people were severely wronged? Here we consider the notion that if people (possibly as members of ongoing societies) can be said to have an obligation to compensate surviving and indirect victims of past injustices (see §5.1 and §5.2), they may also have an obligation symbolically to compensate dead victims of past injustices, people who cannot now be affected by actions of currently living people (Meyer 2005: ch. 3; Meyer 2018).
Let us suppose that currently living people can stand under surviving duties toward past people even though they can neither change the value to them of any moment of their lives since they cannot be affected by what people do after their death nor can they be thought to be bearers of interests or rights (see §5.4). If so, currently living people can act in ways that will constitute a violation of the surviving duties under which they stand owing to the rights the deceased once held. Currently living people may be thought to stand under particular surviving duties toward the deceased owing to their future-oriented projects, the promises they made to them, or the contractual obligations they entered into with them. However, not all people have the opportunity or the wish to have a specific impact on posthumous states of affairs. Not all people pursue projects that are future-oriented in the relevant way and not all people oblige others to bring about what for them are posthumous states of affairs. Here one suggestion is that currently living people can stand under surviving duties toward dead people owing to the fact that they were victims of historical injustices. In order to show that currently living people can stand under such duties, one will have to assume that people generally have interests with respect to posthumous states of affairs. Indeed, people can generally be thought to be interested in enjoying a good reputation both during their lifetime and posthumously (Meyer 2005: 99–104).
On the basis of this assumption the theory of surviving duties contributes to an understanding of the moral significance of the fact that past people were severely wronged When people were violated in their rights, and badly so, their posthumous reputation depends upon their being publicly acknowledged as victims of these wrongs, and others being identified as the wrongdoers (see also Margalit 2002: chs. 2–4). In acknowledging past individuals as victims of egregious wrongs we cannot affect their well-being. Also, such acknowledgment cannot be expressed face to face with the dead victims, but only vis-à-vis currently living people in light of the wrongs past people suffered. However, if it is true that currently living people stand under surviving duties toward past victims of historical injustice owing to the wrongs they suffered, then currently living people fulfilling the duty by publicly acknowledging the past injustices they suffered will change the relation between them and the dead victims of historical injustice. It will be true of the past victims of these injustices that they have the posthumous property that currently living people fulfilled their surviving duty toward them. To be sure, a change of the relation between an existent person and a dead person does not bring about a real change to the latter. Rather, the relational change is based upon the real change of the person who carries out the act (see Ruben 1988: 223–31).
For currently living people to bring about public acknowledgment of past people as victims of historical injustice can require different measures under different circumstances. They can express their acknowledgment of past people as victims of past wrongs in an indirect way, namely, by providing compensation for those who are worse off than they should be owing to the effects of the past injustices suffered by their predecessors or by conferring benefits on living people in whose well-being as members of a group we assume the dead victims of past wrongs had an interest. The message of such compensation can contain the acknowledgment that past people were victims of past wrongs. Arguably, efforts at appropriate commemoration of past victims can be understood as symbolic compensation and restitution.
Establishing a memorial is the typical course of action where the effort is made to realize the symbolic value of compensating those victims who are no longer living. A memorial may be a public speech, a day in the official calendar, a conference, a public space or a monument—for example, a sculpture or an installation. Often these memorials are meant to commemorate crimes that previous members committed in the name of a political society whose currently living members now want to carry out actions of public symbolic compensation or restitution for these crimes toward the victims and their descendants. Such acts have been carried out since the 1970s in Germany, and there is evidence of an international practice of symbolic compensation. Those who carry out acts of symbolic compensation will want to provide some real compensation to those who currently suffer as a result of the same past wrongs, to help those who currently are victims of similar injustices, and to prevent such injustices from happening again. The reasons for acts of symbolic compensation provide reasons for real compensation where this is possible. Symbolic compensation belongs to the measures likely to have the effect of providing surviving victims or groups with assistance in recovering or regaining membership and recognition in their respective societies, such that they are once again able to lead lives under conditions of justice.
The practice of symbolic compensation as understood here aims at recognizing past people as victims of injustices without presupposing that they can be current bearers of interests or rights. Insofar as people generally have an interest and a just claim to enjoy the reputation they deserve while alive, and insofar as the reasons for their just claim can oblige us even after the bearer of the interest and the just claim has ceased to exist, our carrying out acts of symbolic compensation can be understood as fulfilling a surviving duty toward dead people who were wronged in the past, namely the duty of restoring to them the posthumous reputation they deserve.
6. Concluding Remarks
Arguments as developed in the ongoing debates on (the foundations of) intergenerational justice can help to justify several obligations of currently living people vis-à-vis future people and towards past people. Currently living people are obliged (i) not to violate the rights of future generations (§2) and (ii) (at least some presently living people might well be obliged) to provide compensation to contemporaries with respect to harms victims in the past suffered at the hands of past perpetrators (§5).
By employing a threshold notion of harm which may be understood as a central element of a sufficientarian conception of intergenerational justice (§4.4), but could also be an element of other substantive understandings of intergenerational justice (§4.2 and §4.3), we can justify conclusions about both types of present generations’ duties. Basic needs or central capabilities are plausible currencies of a sufficientarian interpretation of intergenerational justice that relies on the threshold notion of harm (§4.1). The threshold notion of harm can be understood as a constitutive element of a complex understanding of harm (disjunctive notion) (§3, and, in particular, §3.2).
The special features of our relations to (remote) future people—especially the lack of particular knowledge, the impossibility of cooperation, and the permanent asymmetry of influence (§1)—do not stand in the way of attributing rights to them that ground corresponding duties owed by us (§2 and §3). The fact that past wrongs are among the necessary conditions for the existence and identity of people currently alive is compatible with the view that these persons have rights to compensation owing to the impact of these past wrongs on their well-being, and that these rights can ground corresponding duties owed by their contemporaries (forward-looking understanding of the significance of past injustices) (§5.1). However, the Non-Identity Problem is not relevant for many indirect victims’ claims to compensation owing to past and historical injustices (§5.2). Even when we allow for the possibility of the ongoing impact of past injustices to be just today, namely owing to changes of relevant circumstances, we will have to investigate the extent to which the conditions for such a supersession of historical claims are met for each case. If supersession of historical claims occurs it might well be partial and and for the time being, and not full and final (§5.3).
Rights-based considerations of intergenerational justice bear not only upon “same people choices” but also upon both types of “different people choices” that Parfit distinguishes, including what he calls “different number choices” (§2 and §3). However, widely shared concerns for the continuation of human life and at a high level of well-being cannot be accounted for solely by rights-based considerations (§4.6). Also, the moral significance of past wrongs should not be interpreted solely in terms of the impact of these injustices on present and future people’s well-being. If we allow that intergenerational relations are not exclusively governed by duties with correlative rights, the notion that we can stand under surviving duties towards dead people who cannot be bearers of rights vis-à-vis present people (§§5.4–5) is compatible with the forward-looking understanding of the significance of historical injustice. Also, the notion that we stand under an obligation towards future people to which no rights of future people correspond—namely, under the obligation not to destroy willfully the goods inherited from our predecessors and the conditions that are constitutive of persons’ pursuit of future-oriented projects (§4.6)—is compatible with the view that we do stand under some obligations of intergenerational justice to which the rights of future people correspond.
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For detailed comments and criticisms on a number of drafts of the first version I would like to thank Thomas Pogge. For discussion of early drafts of most sections I am grateful to Brian Barry and David Heyd. Rachel Brown edited my English of the first version of the entry and improved the presentation of the arguments in numerous ways. I would also like to thank Brian Bix, Tony Daniel and Barbara Reiter.
For detailed and extremely helpful comments on the 2008 version of the entry I would like to thank Thomas Pogge. I would also like to thank James Nickel as well as Michael Edward Ravvin and Dominic Roser.
Pranay Sanklecha made very helpful suggestions on the 2015 version of the entry. I would also like to thank Tim Waligore, Naemi Dubbels, and especially Kiley Kost. An anonymous reviewer is thanked for comments and suggestions that helped improve and clarify the article.
Discussions with Thomas Pölzler and Tim Waligore helped me in revising the 2015 version of the entry. I would also like to thank an anonymous reader and the editors for suggestions of revisions of the 2015 version of the entry.