#### Supplement to Kant's Theory of Judgment

## Do the Apparent Limitations and Confusions of Kant’s Logic Undermine his Theory of Judgment?

From a contemporary point of view, Kant’s pure general logic can
seem *limited* in two fundamental ways. First, since his
propositions are all either simple 1-place subject-predicate
propositions or else truth-functional compounds of these, he
apparently ignores relational predicates, the logic of relations, and
the logic of multiple quantification. This is directly reflected in
the fact that the argument-schemata explicitly considered by him in
the *Jäsche Logic* are all either truth-functional,
syllogistic, or based on analytic containment. So his pure general
logic is at most what we would now call a *monadic* logic (see
Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 25), although second-order. Second,
since Kant’s list of propositional relations leaves out
conjunction, even his propositional logic of truth-functions is
apparently incomplete. The result of these apparent limitations is
that Kant’s logic is significantly weaker than
“elementary” logic (i.e., bivalent first-order
propositional and polyadic predicate logic plus identity) and thus
cannot be equivalent to a mathematical logic in the Frege-Russell
sense, which includes both elementary logic and also quantification
over properties, classes, or functions (a.k.a. “second-order
logic”). Indeed, elementary logic and mathematical logic in the
Frege-Russell sense would count as varieties of
*transcendental* logic for Kant, not as pure general logic.

Again from a contemporary point of view, Kant’s logic can also
seem *confused* in at least four basic ways. First, he
construes the so-called “*A*” propositions of the
Aristotelian-Scholastic square of opposition—i.e., universal
affirmative propositions of the form “All *Fs* are
*G*s”—in the Aristotelian manner as carrying
existential commitment in the “*F*” term, and
therefore apparently overlooks the correct interpretation of
“*A*” propositions as non-existentially-committed
material conditionals of the form “For all *x*, if
*F**x* then *G**x*.” Second, he
construes the “if-then” or hypothetical conditional as the
ground-consequence relation, and therefore apparently confuses strict
or formal conditionals (i.e., logically necessary material
conditionals) with material conditionals (according to which “if
*P* then *Q*” is equivalent with
“not-*P* or *Q*”). Third, in his distinction
between negative and infinite judgments he apparently needlessly
distinguishes between a “wide scope” negation of whole
propositions and a “narrow scope” negation of predicates,
thus creating a systematic ambiguity in interpreting propositions of
the form “*Fs* are not *Gs,*” which can then
be construed either as “no *Fs* are *Gs*” or
as “*Fs* are non-*Gs*.” The ambiguity here
is that because Kant assumes existential commitment in the
“*F*” term of universal affirmative propositions,
and because “*Fs* are non-*Gs*” can be
construed a special case of an “*A*” proposition,
then “*Fs* are non-*Gs*” has existential
commitment, whereas “no *Fs* are *Gs*” does
not. Fourth, he construes disjunction as the “exclusive
*or*,” which implies that if “*P* or
*Q*” is true then “*P* and *Q*”
is false, and therefore apparently overlooks the correct
interpretation of disjunction as the “inclusive
*or*,” which implies that the truth of “*P*
or *Q*” is consistent with the truth of “*P*
and *Q*.” So the joint result of these four apparent
confusions is that in this respect Kant’s logic is significantly
stronger than elementary logic and Frege-Russell logic alike, and in
fact it is not an extensional logic.

Now it is true that for Kant all judgments are inherently a priori
constrained by pure general logic, and it is also true that from a
contemporary point of view Kant’s logic can seem limited and
confused in several fundamental ways. But is this actually a serious
problem for his theory of judgment? No. To see why it is not, notice
that the ascription of limitations and confusions to his logical
theory depends almost entirely on taking a *special* point of
view on the nature of logic, namely the viewpoint of Fregean and
Russellian *logicism*, which posits the reducibility of
mathematics (or at least arithmetic) to some version of second-order
logic. This leads to two Kantian rejoinders. First, while it is quite
true that Kant’s pure general logic includes no logic of
relations or multiple quantification, this is precisely because
mathematical relations generally for him are represented
spatiotemporally in pure or formal intuition, and *not*
represented logically in the understanding. In other words, he
*does* have a theory of mathematical relations, but it belongs
to transcendental aesthetic, not to pure general logic. As a
consequence of this, true mathematical propositions for Kant are not
truths of logic—which are all analytic truths, or concept-based
truths—but instead are synthetic truths, or intuition-based
truths (see Section 2.2.2). So for Kant, by the very nature of
mathematical truth there can be no such thing as an authentically
“mathematical logic.” And this is a substantive thesis
about logic and mathematics that cannot be simply dismissed, in view
of what we now know to be the very problematic status of logicism in
relation to Russell’s paradox, Alonzo Church’s theorem on
the undecidability of classical predicate logic, Kurt
Gödel’s first incompleteness theorem on the unprovability
of classical predicate logic plus the Peano axioms for arithmetic,
Alfred Tarski’s closely related theorem on the indefinability of
truth (Boolos & Jeffrey 1989, ch. 15), Frege’s
“Caesar” problem about uniquely identifying the numbers
(Frege 1953), Paul Benacerraf’s closely related worry about
referential indeterminacy in any attempt to identify the numbers with
objects (Benacerraf 1965), and ongoing debates about the supposedly
analytic definability of the numbers in second-order logic plus
Hume’s principle of equinumerosity (Boolos 1998). Second, while
it is again quite true that Kant does not include conjunction in his
list of logical constants and that he construes disjunction as
exclusive, it is also true (i) that he is clearly aware of inclusive
disjunction, when he remarks that if we assume the truth of the
ground-consequence conditional, then “whether both of these
propositions are in themselves true remains unsettled here,” and
then immediately distinguishes the “relation of
consequence” from exclusive disjunction (A73/B98–99), and
(ii) that as Augustus De Morgan and Harry Sheffer later showed,
conjunction is systematically definable in terms of negation and
inclusive disjunction (De Morgan), and all possible truth-functions
(including of course exclusive disjunction) can be expressed as
functions of a single truth-function of two propositions involving
only negation and inclusive disjunction (Sheffer). So at least
implicitly, Kant’s propositional logic of truth-functions is
complete. Third and finally, while it is yet again quite true that
Kant’s logic is not extensional, this is precisely because his
logic is an *intensional* *logic* of non-uniform
existential commitments, primitive modalities, and finegrained
conceptual structures. So given Kant’s conception of logic, his
list of logical forms will automatically be in one way much more
narrowly restricted (because of his focus on monadic logic) and in
another way automatically much more broadly inclusive (because of his
focus on intensional logic), than those of elementary logic or
second-order logic. But this dual focus also presents a uniquely
Kantian conception of logic that cannot be simply dismissed, in view
of (a) the important fact that amongst the classical predicate logics
monadic logic alone (whether first-order or second-order) is decidable
*and* provable or complete (Boolos & Jeffrey 1989; Denyer
1992), which well supports a claim to the effect that Kant’s
pure general logic is the “a priori core” of classical
predicate logic, and (b) the equally important fact of the rigorous
development and burgeoning of intensional logics—and
non-classical logics more generally—since the middle of the 20th
century (Priest 2001).