Kant’s Theory of Judgment
Theories of judgment, whether cognitive (i.e., object-representing, thought-expressing, truth-apt) judgment or practical (i.e., act-representing, choice-expressing, evaluation-apt) judgment, bring together fundamental issues in semantics, logic, cognitive psychology, and epistemology (collectively providing for what can be called the four “faces” of cognitive judgment [see also Martin 2006]), as well as action theory, moral psychology, and ethics (collectively providing for the three “faces” of practical judgment): indeed, the notion of judgment is central to any general theory of human rationality. But Kant’s theory of judgment differs sharply from many other theories of judgment, both traditional and contemporary, in three ways: (1) by taking the innate capacity for judgment to be the central cognitive faculty of the rational human mind, (2) by insisting on the semantic, logical, psychological, epistemic, and practical priority of the propositional content of a judgment, and (3) by systematically embedding judgment within the metaphysics of transcendental idealism . Several serious problems are generated by the interplay of the first two factors with the third. This in turn suggests that the other two parts of Kant’s theory of judgment can be logically detached from the strongest version of his transcendental idealism and defended independently of it. This entry also includes five supplementary documents covering (i) the debate about Kant’s conceptualism vs. Kant’s non-conceptualism, (ii) the epistemology of Kantian judgment and the ethics of Kantian belief, (iii) Kant’s logic in relation to his theory of judgment, (iv) kinds of use for judgments, and (v) completing the picture of Kant’s metaphysics of judgment.
- 1. The Nature of Judgment
- 1.1 The power of judgment and the other faculties of cognition
- 1.2 Judgments are essentially propositional cognitions
- 1.3 Judgments, objective validity, objective reality, and truth
- Supplement: The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism
- Supplement: Judging, Believing, and Scientific knowing
- 2. Kinds of Judgments
- 3. The Metaphysics of Judgment: Transcendental Idealism
- 4. Problems and Prospects
- 4.1 The bottom-up problem: essentially non-conceptual intuitions, rogue objects, and the gap in the B Deduction
- 4.2 The top-down problem: judgment, transcendental affinity, and the systematic unity of nature
- 4.3 The dream-skeptical problem: judgment, problematic idealism, and the gap in the Second Analogy
- 4.4 Conclusion: judgment without strong transcendental idealism?
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Theories of cognitive judgment both prior to and after Kant tend to divide dichotomously into the psychologistic and platonistic camps, according to which, on the one hand, cognitive judgments are nothing but mental representations of relations of ideas, as, e.g., in the Port Royal Logic (Arnaud & Nicole 1996), or mentalistic ordered combinings of real individuals, universals, and logical constants, as, e.g., in Russell’s early theory of judgment (Russell 1966), or on the other hand, cognitive judgments are nothing but assertoric psychological states or attitudes aimed at mind-independent, abstract propositions or thoughts, as, e.g., in Bolzano’s and Frege’s theories of judgment (Bolzano 1972, Frege 1979, Frege 1984). And, seemingly, never the twain shall meet (Martin 2006, Hanna 2006a, ch. 1). But by sharp contrast to both the psychologistic and platonistic camps, Kant’s theory of judgment is at once cognitivist, anti-psychologistic, and anti-platonistic. More precisely, according to Kant, judgments are complex conscious cognitions that (i) refer to objects either directly (via intuitions) or indirectly (via concepts), (ii) include concepts that are predicated either of those objects or of other constituent concepts, (iii) exemplify pure logical concepts and enter into inferences according to pure logical laws, (iv) essentially involve both the following of rules and the application of rules to the objects picked out by intuitions, (v) express true or false propositions (truth-aptness), (vi) mediate the formation of beliefs and other intentional acts, and (vii) are unified and self-conscious.
The three leading features of this account are, first, Kant’s taking the innate capacity for judgment to be the central cognitive faculty of the human mind, in the sense that judgment, alone among our various cognitive achievements, is the joint product of all of the other cognitive faculties operating coherently and systematically together under a single higher-order unity of rational self-consciousness (the centrality thesis); second, Kant’s insistence on the explanatory priority of the propositional content of a judgment over its basic cognitive-semantic constituents (i.e., intuitions and concepts), over the logical form of judgments, over the inferential role of judgments, over the rule-like character of the judgment, over the self-conscious psychological states in which propositions are grasped as well as the non-self-conscious psychological processes in which propositions are synthetically generated, over epistemic beliefs in those propositions, over all other propositional attitudes, and also over intentional acts guided and mediated by those propositions, including non-epistemic acts of various kinds (the priority-of-the-proposition thesis); and third, Kant’s background metaphysical doctrine to the effect that judgments are empirically meaningful (objectively valid) and true (objectively real) if and only if transcendental idealism is correct (the transcendental idealism thesis).
According to Kant, a “judgment” (Urteil) is a specific kind of “cognition” (Erkenntnis)—which he generically defines as any conscious mental representation of an object (A320/B376)—that is the characteristic output of the “power of judgment” (Urteilskraft). The power of judgment, in turn, is a cognitive “capacity” (Fähigkeit) but also specifically a spontaneous and innate cognitive capacity, and in virtue of these it is the “faculty of judging” (Vermögen zu urteilen) (A69/B94), which is also the same as the “faculty of thinking” (Vermögen zu denken) (A81/B106).
For Kant the mind is essentially active and vital—“the mind (Gemüt) for itself is entirely life (the principle of life itself)” (5: 278)—and a cognitive capacity in turn is a determinate conscious propensity of the mind to generate objective representations of certain kinds under certain conditions. What do spontaneity and innateness add to a mere capacity for cognition, so that it becomes a “faculty of cognition” (Erkenntnisvermögen)? A cognitive faculty is spontaneous in that whenever it is externally stimulated by raw unstructured sensory data as inputs, it then automatically organizes or “synthesizes” those data in an unprecedented way relative to those inputs, thereby yielding novel structured cognitions as outputs (B1–2, A50/B74, B132, B152). So cognitive spontaneity is a structural creativity of the mind with respect to its representations. It is a controverted question of recent Kant-interpretation whether cognitive spontaneity derives exclusively from the conceptual or discursive capacity of the rational human mind (B152) (Longuenesse 1998, chs. 1–3, 5, 8), or can also derive independently from the intuitional, non-conceptual, or sensible capacity of the rational human mind, shared with minded non-rational human or non-human animals (B151) (Hanna 2006b, ch. 1, McLear 2011). Correspondingly, it is also a controverted question whether according to Kant there is only one basic kind of synthesis, i.e., conceptual/discursive synthesis, or two basic kinds, i.e., conceptual/discursive synthesis and intuitional/non-conceptual/sensible synthesis. These controverted questions, in turn, are closely connected with the recent vigorous debate about Kant’s conceptualism vs. Kant’s non-conceptualism in relation to his theory of judgment, and the implications of this for interpreting and critically evaluating Kant’s transcendental idealism and the Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding, a.k.a. “the Categories” (see the supplementary document The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism and Sections 4.1 to 4.2 below).
Kant also uses the term ‘spontaneity’ in a somewhat different sense in a metaphysical context, to refer to a mental cause that can sufficiently determine an effect in time while also lacking any temporally prior sufficient cause of itself (A445/B473). Call this practical spontaneity. What is shared between the two senses of spontaneity, practical and cognitive, is the unprecedented, creative character of the mind’s operations. But in the cognitive sense of spontaneity, what is crucial is that the sensory data manifest “poverty of the stimulus” (Cook & Newson 1996, 81–85)—significant underdetermination of the outputs of an embodied cognitive capacity by the relevant inputs to that capacity, plus previous experiences or habituation—although the faculty’s spontaneity must also always be minimally conditioned by external sensory triggering (B1–2). Correspondingly, a Kantian cognitive faculty is innate in the threefold sense that (i) it is intrinsic to the mind, hence a necessary part of the nature of the rational animal possessing that faculty, (ii) it contains internal structures that are necessarily or strictly underdetermined by any and all sensory impressions and/or empirical facts—which is the same as their being a priori (B2), and (iii) it automatically systematically synthesizes those sensory inputs according to special normative rules that directly reflect the internal structures of the faculty, thereby generating its correlatively-structured outputs. So Kantian innateness is essentially a procedure-based innateness, consisting in an a priori active readiness of the mind for implementing normative rules of synthesis, as opposed to the content-based innateness of Cartesian and Leibnizian innate ideas, according to which an infinitely large supply of complete (e.g., mathematical) beliefs, propositions, or concepts themselves are either occurrently or dispositionally intrinsic to the mind. But as Locke pointed out, this implausibly overloads the human mind’s limited storage capacities.
In contrast to both Rationalists and Empiricists, who hold that the human mind has only one basic cognitive faculty—reason or sense perception, respectively—Kant is a cognitive-faculty dualist who holds that the human mind has two basic cognitive faculties: (i) the “understanding” (Verstand), the faculty of concepts, thought, and discursivity, and (ii) the “sensibility” (Sinnlichkeit), the faculty of intuitions/non-conceptual cognitions, sense perception, and mental imagery (A51/B75). The essential difference between the faculties of understanding and sensibility, and correspondingly the essential difference between concepts and intuitions (A50–52/B74–76), as distinct kinds of cognition, is a fundamental commitment of Kant’s theory of cognition generally and of his theory of judgment more specifically. Concepts are at once (a) general representations having the logical form of universality (9: 91), (b) discursive representations expressing pure logical forms and falling under pure logical laws (A68–70/B92–94, A239/B298), (c) complex intensions ranging over “comprehensions” (Umfangen) that contain all actual and possible objects falling under those intensions, as well as other narrower comprehensions (9: 95–96), (d) mediate or indirect (i.e., attributive or descriptive) representations of individual objects (A320/B376–377), (e) rules for classifying and organizing perceptions of objects (A106), and (f) “reflected” representations expressing the higher-order unity of rational self-consciousness, a.k.a. “apperception” (B133 and 133n.). Intuitions by contrast are conscious object-directed representations that are (1) singular (A320/B377) (9: 91), (2) sense-related (A19/B33, A51/B75), (3) object-dependent (B72) (4: 281), (4) immediate, or directly referential (A90–91/B122–123, B132, B145), and, above all, (5) non-conceptual (A284/B340) (9: 99) (Hanna 2001, ch. 4).
Understanding and sensibility are both subserved by the faculty of “imagination” (Einbildungskraft), which when taken generically is the source or engine of all sorts of synthesis, but which when taken as a “dedicated” or task-sensitive cognitive faculty, construed as either “productive” or “reproductive,” more specifically generates (α) the spatial and temporal forms of intuition, (β) novel mental imagery in conscious sensory states, (γ) reproductive imagery or memories, and (δ) “schemata,” which are supplementary rules for interpreting general conceptual rules in terms of more specific figural (spatiotemporal) forms and sensory images (A78/B103, B151, A100–102, A137–142/B176–181) (7: 167). At least in principle, then, the imagination mediates between the understanding and the sensibility by virtue of being an autonomous third basic cognitive capacity containing elements of each of the basic dual capacities (see,e.g., A115–119 and A139–142/B178–181)—which would, in effect, make Kant a cognitive-capacity trinitarian. But sometimes, contrariwise and somewhat incoherently, Kant seems instead to say that the imagination at once (i) belongs to sensibility and yet also (ii) is caused by the action of the understanding on sensibility. This deep unclarity about the nature of the imagination, in addition to being a flashpoint for important longstanding disagreements in Kant-scholarship on his theory of judgment (see, e.g., Heidegger 1990, Waxman 1991, Longuenesse 1998), also has some serious implications for Kant’s theory of judgment itself (again, see the supplementary document The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism and Sections 4.1 to 4.2 below).
Just as understanding and sensibility are subserved by the bottom-up cognitive processing of the imagination, so in turn they are also superserved by the top-down cognitive processing of the faculty of “reason” (Vernunft), which produces logical inferences, carries out pragmatic or moral choices and decisions, a.k.a. “practical judgments”), imposes coherence and consistency on all sorts of cognitions, and above all recognizes and implements strongly modal and categorically normative concepts such as necessary truth and unconditional obligation, in the form of lawlike “principles” (Principien, Grundsätze) (A299–304/B355–361, A800–804/B828–832).
Finally, the objective unity of any judgment whatsoever is guaranteed by the faculty of apperception or rational self-consciousness, which plays the “executive” role in the corporate organization of the mind by introducing a single higher-order unity into all of its lower-order representations, via judgment, and whose characteristic output is the cogito-like self-directed judgment-forming representation “I think” (Ich denke): as in “I think about X” (where X is some concept, say the concept of being a philosopher) or “I think that P” (where that-P is some proposition, say the proposition that Kant is a philosopher) (B131–132). The I think according to Kant is “the vehicle of all concepts and judgments whatever” (A341/B399), because it is both a necessary condition of the objective unity of every judgment and also automatically implements one or another of a set of primitive pure a priori logical forms or functions of unity in judgments or thoughts—“the pure concepts of the understanding” or “categories” (A66–83/B91–116)—in the several semantic constituents of that judgment.
The power of judgment, while a non-basic faculty, is nevertheless the central cognitive faculty of the human mind. This is because judging brings together all the otherwise uncoordinated sub-acts and sub-contents of intuition, conceptualization, imagination, and reason, via apperception or rational self-consciousness, for the purpose of generating a single cognitive product, the judgment, under the overarching pure concepts of the understanding or categories, thereby fully integrating the several distinct cognitive faculties and their several distinct sorts of representational information, and thereby also constituting a single rational human animal. For Kant then, rational humans are judging animals.
But what exactly are judgments? Kant’s answer, in a nutshell, is that they are essentially propositional cognitions—from which it immediately follows that rational humans are, more precisely, propositional animals. In what sense, however, is this the case?
Logicians before Kant, e.g., the Port Royalists, tended to define judgment as a “representation of a relation between two concepts” (B140). This pre-Kantian definition implied that all judgments are of subject-predicate form; but in fact, as Kant points out (here following the Stoic logicians), some judgments—e.g., disjunctive judgments, and hypothetical conditional judgments—are truth-valued relational complexes of subject-predicate judgments and thus, apparently, have essentially truth-functional form, not subject-predicate form. This idea later heavily influenced George Boole’s ground-breaking view of logic as a set of a priori “laws of thought” governing a formal calculus of binary functions that mimic the “bipolar” behavior of the classical truth and falsity of propositions (Boole 1854). Perhaps even more importantly however, the pre-Kantian definition also failed to explain the unity of a judgment, and the difference between a judgment and a mere list of concepts. So in order to solve this “unity-of-the-judgment” problem—which later re-surfaced as “the problem of the unity of the proposition” in early analytic philosophy (Hylton 1984, Linsky 1992)—Kant offers a radically new conception of the judgment as a higher-order cognitive binding function for different types of lower-order objective representational content. In a pre-Critical essay, “The False Subtlety of the Four Syllogistic Figures,” he says that a judgment is an act of logical predication whereby a concept is applied to a thing, as expressed by the copula ‘is’ or ‘are’ (2: 47). In his logical textbook, the Jäsche Logic, he says that it is a representation of the unity of consciousness linking together several other representations, or a representation of their relation in a single concept (9: 101). And in the Critique of Pure Reason he characterizes judgment at least four times:
Judgment is … the mediate cognition of an object, hence the representation of a representation of it. In every judgment there is a concept that holds of many [representations], and that among this many also comprehends a given representation, which is then immediately referred to the object. (A68/B93)
All judgments are … functions of unity among our representations, since instead of an immediate representation a higher one, which comprehends this and other representations under itself, is used for the cognition of the object, and many possible cognitions are hereby drawn together into one. (A69/B94)
A judgment is nothing other than the way to bring given cognitions to the objective unity of apperception. That is the aim of the copula is in them: to distinguish the objective unity of given representations from the subjective. (B141).
[Pure general logic] deals with concepts, judgments, and inferences, corresponding exactly to the functions and order of those powers of the mind, which are comprehended under the broad designation of understanding in general… If the understanding in general is explained as the faculty of rules, then the power of judgment is the faculty of subsuming under rules, i.e., of determining whether something stands under a given rule (casus datae legis) or not. (A130–132/B170–172)
Despite the superficial differences in emphasis and formulation, these six characterizations all converge on the same basic account: a judgment is a higher-order complex conscious cognition that refers to objects either directly (via the essentially indexical content of intuitions/non-conceptual cognitions)or indirectly (via the essentially attributive or descriptive content of concepts); in which concepts are predicated either of those objects or of other constituent concepts; in which concepts are intrinsically related to one another and to intuitional/non-conceptual cognitions by pure general logical forms/pure concepts of the understanding that express various modifications and, apparently, truth-functional compounds of the predicative copula; which enters into inferences according to a priori laws of pure general logic; which essentially involves both the following of rules and the application of rules to the perceptual objects picked out by intuition/non-conceptual cognition; and in which a composite objective representation is generated and unified by the higher-order executive mental processing of a single self-conscious rational subject. The crucial take-away points here are (a) a judgment’s referential bottoming-out in intuitions/non-conceptual cognitions, which thereby constitute directly-referential singular terms in singular categorical judgments, that cannot be semantically replaced by individual concepts or definite descriptions without change or loss of meaning (contrast, e.g., Thompson 1972 and Hanna 2001, ch. 4), (b) the “privileging of predication” (Longuenesse 1998, 104) over other sorts of logical operations, (c) the intrinsic logico-syntactic and logico-semantic form of the judgment, based on modifications or compound truth-functional relations of the predicative copula, (d) the rule-like character of the judgment, (e) the judgment’s unified conscious objective representational (i.e., semantic) content, and above all (f) its higher-order rationally self-conscious ground of objective unity. As such, Kantian judgments are neither merely psychological objects or processes (as in psychologistic theories of judgment), nor are they essentially mind-independent, abstract objects (as in platonistic theories of judgment), nor again are they inherently assertoric takings of propositions to be true (as, e.g., in Frege’s theory of judgment). Instead, Kantian judgments are intersubjectively shareable, rationally communicable, cognitively-generated mental-act structures or types whose logically-structured truth-apt semantic contents can be the targets of many different kinds of epistemic or non-epistemic propositional attitudes.
As just noted, every judgment has an intrinsic logical form that is both syntactic and semantic in nature, centered on predication. Even more fundamentally however, every judgment also has an “intension” (Inhalt) or semantic content: the “proposition” (Satz). A propositional content is not monolithic but rather a unified composite of individually meaningful proper parts. More specifically, a proposition is the logically well-formed and semantically well-composed, truth-valued, unified objective representational content of a judgment; and more generally it is “what is judged” in the act of putting forward any sort of rational claim about the world (9: 109) (14: 659–660) (24: 934). Although a proposition is always generated by means of psychological processes, it is not, however, psychologically private and incommunicable: on the contrary, it is intersubjectively shareable and rationally communicable, due to the fact that the very same propositional form-and-content can be individually generated by many different judging animals, provided they are all equipped with the same basic cognitive architecture. In this way judgments for Kant are essentially propositional cognitions, in that the primary function of the faculty of judgment is just to generate these logically well-formed, semantically well-composed, truth-valued, intersubjectively shareable, rationally communicable, unified objective representational contents.
Given the seminal role of the judgment’s propositional content, it is easy to see then that for Kant the propositional function of the judgment is more basic than its inferential role—although every judgment does indeed play an inferential role (Longuenesse 1998, 90–95)—and for this reason Kant’s logical constants (i.e., all, some, this/the, affirmation, propositional negation, predicate-negation, the predicative copula, if-then, disjunction, necessarily, possibly, and actually) are defined strictly in terms of their specific roles in the propositional content of judgments, quite apart from the ways those judgments can enter into inferences (A69–76/B94–102). In recent years, however, inferentialist treatments of Kant’s theory of judgment and Kant’s logic, which treat the semantic contents and logical constants of judgment as essentially dependent on and determined by their inferential roles, have become increasingly popular and influential (see, e.g., Landy 2009 and Leech 2012).
The characteristically rational activity of taking-for-true implies the subjective validity of a judgment, or its apparent meaningfulness and apparent truth for an individual rational cognizer. By contrast, the “objective validity” (objektiv Gültigkeit) of a judgment is its empirical meaningfulness, precisely because it is compositionally based on the empirical “reference” (Beziehung)—whether singular or comprehensional—of the basic constituent objective representations of any judgment, namely intuitions and concepts. The empirical reference of intuitions and concepts, in turn, is necessarily constrained by the specifically aesthetic or sensible, non-conceptual, non-discursive, and pre-rational or proto-rational dimension of human experience, which itself is jointly determined by (a) the brute givenness of material objects to our receptive capacity for empirical intuition, via the relation of external affection, and (b) the necessary and non-empirical forms of empirical intuition, our representations of space and time (A19–22/B33–36), which ultimately express the outer and inner sensory aspects of the embodiment of our minds). In this way, an intuition is objectively valid if and only if either (i) it directly refers to some individual actual or possible external sensible object or to the subject’s phenomenally conscious inner response to this outer reference (this accounts for the objective validity of empirical intuitions), or else (ii) it represents a phenomenally immanent necessary condition of empirical intuitions (this accounts for the objective validity of the forms of intuition) (A239–240/B298–299). By contrast, a concept is objectively valid if and only if either it applies to some actual or possible objects of empirical intuition (this accounts for the objective validity of empirical concepts) or else it represents a necessary condition of empirical concepts (this accounts for the objective validity of pure concepts) (A239–240/B298–299, A240–242/B299–300).
A necessary but not sufficient condition of the objective validity of a judgment is its logico-syntactic well-formedness (grammatical correctness) and logico-semantic well-formedness (sortal correctness) (A73/98, A240–248/B300–305). So a judgment is objectively valid if and only if it is logically well-formed and all of its constituent intuitions and concepts are objectively valid (A155–156/B194–195). Otherwise put, and fully spelled-out, the objective validity of a judgment is its anthropocentric rational empirical referential meaningfulness. Kant also sometimes uses the notion of “objective reality” (objektive Realität) to characterize objectively valid representations that apply specifically to actually or really existing objects, and not to merely possible objects (A242 n.). True judgments are thus objectively real propositions. Objective validity, in turn, is a necessary but not sufficient condition of truth, and hence of objectively real propositions, for false judgments are also objectively valid (A58/B83). In this way the objective validity of a judgment is equivalent to its propositional truth-valuedness, but not equivalent to its propositional truth.
By contrast, all judgments that are not objectively valid are “empty” (leer) or truth-valueless. Nevertheless, it must be noted that for Kant empty judgments can still be rationally intelligible and not in any way nonsensical, if all the concepts contained within them are at least logically consistent or “thinkable” (Bxxvi n.). In this way, e.g., some judgments containing concepts of noumenal objects (things-in-themselves, or real essences) or noumenal subjects (rational-agents-in-themselves, or persons) are empirically meaningless and truth-valueless, hence empty, yet also are rationally intelligible targets of what Kant calls “doctrinal” belief (see the supplementary document Judging, Believing, and Scientific Knowing), and even, at least from a certain Critical meta-philosophical standpoint, essential both to Kant’s theoretical metaphysics (A254–255/B309–310, A650–654/B678–682) and also to his practical metaphysics of freedom and morality (A530–558/B566–586).
So much for truth-valuedness: but what is truth? According to Kant, truth is a predicate of whole judgments, and not a predicate of the representational proper parts of judgments, i.e., intuitions/non-conceptual cognitions and concepts (A293/B350). Furthermore we already know that objective validity is a necessary but not sufficient condition of the truth of a judgment. Kant also holds that logical consistency is a necessary but not sufficient condition of the truth of a judgment (A60/B85). Most importantly however, according to Kant the “nominal definition” of truth is that it is the “agreement” or “correspondence” (Übereinstimmung) of a cognition (i.e., in this context, an objectively valid judgment) with its object (A58/B82). Now a Kantian nominal definition is a special type of analytic definition that picks out the “logical essence” of that concept—i.e., the generic and specific intensional criteria for bringing things under that concept—but without also picking out the “inner determinations” or real essences of the things falling within the comprehension of that concept, which would be the job of a real definition (9: 142–143). So the nominal definition of truth means that for Kant truth just is agreement or correspondence, which can then be further unpacked as a relation between a judgment and an object such that (i) the form or structure of the object is isomorphic with the logico-syntactic and logico-semantic form of the proposition expressed by the judgment, (ii) the judger cognitively orients herself in the world by projecting the object under specific “points of view” (Gesichtspunkte) or modes of presentation that would also be typically cognitively associated with the constituent concepts of the judgment by any other rational human animal in that context (8: 134–137) (9: 57, 147) (24: 779), and (iii) the object represented by the judgment really exists (Hanna 2006b, ch. 5). Another way of putting this is to say that truth is nothing but the objective reality of the total propositional form-and-content of the judgment: that is, nothing but the real existence of that which is precisely specified by the logico-syntactic and logico-semantic features of the judgment taken together with the judger’s intersubjectively rationally communicable cognitive orientation. Or in still other words, true judgments are nothing but ways of rationally projecting ourselves onto actual truth-makers. This is not what is nowadays called a “deflationist” conception of truth, however, because Kant is not saying that truth is nothing but asserting the corresponding actual facts. On the contrary, for Kant truth is irreducible to merely asserting the facts, because for him the concept of truth also inherently expresses both the judger’s fundamental rational interest in “getting it right” (whether theoretically via true judgment or practically via good intentional action) and also her intersubjectively shareable and rationally communicable cognitive orientation, as well as belonging intrinsically to the core moral concept of sincerity.
In any case, the nominal definition of truth must be sharply distinguished from the real definition of truth, i.e., the “criterion” (Kriterium) of truth, which is a rule for determining the truth or falsity of judgments in specific contexts (A58/B82). According to Kant there is no all-purpose or absolutely general criterion of truth (A58–59), such as the “clarity-and-distinctness” criterion of the Cartesians. Nevertheless there are special criteria of truth for each of the basic classes of judgments: analytic judgments, synthetic a posteriori (or empirical) judgments, and synthetic a priori judgments (for more details about this threefold distinction and the special truth-criteria, see Section 2).
The truth of empirical judgments is the bottom-level sort of truth for Kant, in that all of the other kinds of truth presuppose it. In turn, the proper object of an empirical judgment is an actual or possible “object of experience” (Gegenstand der Erfahrung), which is an empirical state-of-affairs, or a really possible individual material object insofar as it has macroscopic physical or “phenomenological” (in the Newtonian sense) properties and can enter into causal or otherwise dynamical relations in the spatiotemporal material world according to necessary laws of nature (A176–218/B218–265). By the nominal definition of truth as agreement or correspondence, this entails that actual objects of experience are the truth-makers of empirical judgments. It also leads to what Kant calls “the criterion of empirical truth” which states that since the objectively valid propositional content of an empirical judgment can be specified as a necessary conceptual rule of sensory appearances, then if that rule is effectively applied to the temporal succession of our sensory representations of the phenomenal material world, and that rule coheres with the causal-dynamic laws of nature, then that judgment is true (A191/B236, A451/B479) (4: 290) (18: 234).
See the supplementary documents:
One of the most controversial, influential, and striking parts of Kant’s theory of judgment is his multiple classification of judgments according to kinds of logical form and kinds of semantic content. Indeed the very importance of Kant’s multiple classification of judgments has sometimes led to the misconception that his theory of judgment will stand or fall according to the fate of, e.g., his analytic-synthetic distinction, or his doctrine of synthetic a priori judgments. Important as these classifications are however, it is crucial to remember that the core of Kant’s theory of judgment consists in the centrality thesis, the priority-of-the-proposition thesis, and the transcendental idealism thesis, all of which can still hold even if some of his classifications of judgments are rejected.
The modern conception of logical form—as found, e.g., in the symbolic and mathematical logic of Gottlob Frege’s Begriffsschrift (“Conceptual Notation”) (Frege 1972), Bertrand Russell and A.N. Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (Whitehead and Russell 1962), and Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (Wittgenstein 1922)—owes much to Kant’s conception of logical form, if not so very much to his particular conception of logic, which from a contemporary point of view can seem “terrifyingly narrow-minded and mathematically trivial,” as Allen Hazen has drily put it (Hazen 1999). On the other hand, however, it is clearly true that Kant’s conception of mathematical form, which is found in his theory of pure or formal intuition, substantially influenced Wittgenstein’s view of logical form in the Tractatus (Wittgenstein 1922, props. 2.013, 5.552, 5.61, and 6.13). There is an ongoing scholarly debate about whether Kant’s conception of mathematical form is a direct expression of the narrow-mindedness of his logical theory, or instead a direct expression of the striking originality of his philosophy of mathematics (Parsons 1983, Friedman 1992, Shabel 2003, Hanna 2006b, ch. 6, Shabel 2006). But even more importantly, Kant’s deep idea that logic and logical form can exist only in the context of the judging activities and judging capacities of rational human animals, has heavily influenced some heavily influential philosophers of logic, linguists, philosophers of language, and cognitive scientists from Boole and Wilhelm von Humboldt (Von Humboldt 1988), to Frege, the later Wittgenstein, and Noam Chomsky (Wittgenstein 1953, para. 241–242, Chomsky 1975, Bell 1979, Bell 1987).
2.1.1 Pure general logic and the table of judgments
As mentioned in Section 1, every judgment for Kant has an intrinsic logical form. These logical forms correspond one-to-one to the pure concepts of the understanding or categories, a claim which is argued-for in what Kant calls the metaphysical deduction of the categories (A76–83/B102–109, B159). On the basis of this, it is possible to argue that all concepts, whether pure or empirical, have a logical ground (Newton 2015). In any case, the total set of such logical forms/pure concepts is the “table of judgments,” which Kant also describes as “the functions of unity in judgments” (A69/B94, emphasis added). He does this in order to draw special attention to the fact that for him the very idea of a logical form/pure concept is essentially judgment-based: logical form is nothing but the intrinsic logico-syntactic and logico-semantic form of and in a proposition. So for Kant the propositional content of a judgment is more explanatorily basic than its logical form or pure-conceptual structure.
The table of judgments, in turn, captures a fundamental part of the science of pure general logic: pure, because it is a priori, necessary, hence strictly universally true, and also without any associated sensory content; general, because it is strictly underdetermined by all objectively valid representational contents and also abstracts away from all specific or particular differences between represented objects (cf. MacFarlane 2002), and thereby “has to do with nothing but the mere form of thinking” (A54/B78); and logic because, in addition to the table of judgments, it also systematically provides categorically normative conditio sine qua non rules for the truth of judgments (i.e., the law of non-contradiction or logical consistency) and for valid inference (i.e., the law of logical consequence) (A52–55/B76–79) (9: 11–16).
In this connection, there are two crucial points to note about Kant’s pure general logic.
First, pure general logic is sharply distinct from transcendental logic, in that, although both logics are pure and a priori, whereas pure general logic is “general” in that it is strictly underdetermined by all objectively valid representational contents and also abstracts away from all specific or particular differences between represented objects, hence is ontically unrestricted, nevertheless transcendental logic is “special” in that it is ontically restricted, i.e., objectually-committed, and thereby presupposes the existence of certain specific categories or kinds (including natural kinds) of objects (A55–57/B79–82). In this way, transcendental logic presupposes pure general logic, and is synthetic a priori, not analytic. Some recent Kant-commentators, however, have argued that on the contrary, pure general logic presupposes transcendental logic (see, e.g., Rödl 2008, Tolley 2012), on the grounds that for Kant, thought by its very nature is object-directed. But the generality and inherently formal character of pure general logic is fully consistent with its being objectively valid: hence the fact that thought by its very nature is object-directed does not by itself imply that the logic governing thought is ontically restricted or objectually-committed.
Second, pure general logic is absolutely binding on any rational human thinker and provides an unconditional logical ought: the laws of logic are the categorically normative laws of thought for all actual and possible rational animals. Thus pure general logic is both a formal science and also a moral science, but not a natural science. As such, pure general logic fully heeds the lesson of the Naturalistic Fallacy, that is, the irreducibility of the ought to the is. Correspondingly, just like the unconditional moral ought, as expressed by the Categorical Imperative, the logical ought, as expressed by, e.g., the law of non-contradiction, is rarely correctly obeyed in the real world by finite flawed thinkers like us, who commit logical fallacies and moral sins with comparable frequency: sadly, ought does not entail is. Still, as non-naturalistic, Kant’s pure general logic is irreducible to all contingent facts and especially to all empirical psychological facts; hence his logic is thoroughly anti-psychologistic, which exploits the flip-side of unconditional obligation, whether logical or moral: happily, is does not entail ought.
Kant’s table of judgments lays out a (putatively) exhaustive list of the different possible logical forms of propositions under four major headings, each major heading containing three sub-kinds, as follows.
Table of Judgments
- Quantity of Judgments: Universal, Particular, Singular.
- Quality: Affirmative, Negative, Infinite
- Relation: Categorical, Hypothetical, Disjunctive
- Modality: Problematic, Assertoric, Apodictic (A70/B95)
Consistently with Kant’s “privileging of predication,” it is arguable that his logical forms are all either modifications or else truth-functional compounds of simple monadic (i.e.,1-place) categorical (i.e., subject-predicate) propositions of the general form “Fs are Gs.”
In this way, e.g., the three kinds of quantity of judgments are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which the comprehensions of the two constituent concepts of a simple monadic categorical proposition are logically combined and separated. So Kant says that universal judgments are of the form “All Fs are Gs”; that particular judgments are of the form “Some Fs are Gs”; and that singular judgments are of the form “This F is G” or “The F is G.”
By contrast, the three kinds of quality of judgments are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which the constituent concepts of a simple monadic categorical judgment can be either existentially posited or gesetzt, or else existentially cancelled or aufhebe, by respectively assigning non-empty actual extensions to concepts, or null actual extensions to concepts (A594–595/622–623). So Kant says that affirmative judgments are of the form “it is the case that Fs are Gs” (or more simply: “Fs are Gs”), negative judgments are of the form “no Fs are Gs”; and infinite judgments are of the form “Fs are non-Gs.”
By contrast again, the three kinds of relation of judgments are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which simple 1-place subject-predicate propositions can be either atomic (elementary) or molecular (compound) in respect of their truth-values. So Kant says that categorical judgments repeat the simple atomic 1-place subject-predicate form “Fs are Gs”; molecular hypothetical judgments are of the form “If Fs are Gs, then Hs are Is” (or: “If P then Q”); and molecular disjunctive judgments are of the form “Fs are either Gs or Hs or …” (where each partition of the total domain is mutually exclusive and the total set of partitions is exhaustive).
By contrast yet again and finally, the three kinds of modality of a judgment are supposed by Kant to capture the three basic ways in which the copula of a simple 1-place subject-predicate proposition “contributes nothing to the content of the judgment … but rather concerns only the value of the copula in relation to thinking in general” (A74/B99–100). This doctrine might seem to confuse the three propositional attitudes of “opining” (Meinen), epistemic belief, and certainty (A820–823/B848–851), as discussed in the supplementary document Judging, Believing, and Scientific Knowing, with the alethic modal notions of possibility, actuality, and necessity. Or even worse, it might seem to psychologize modality.
And this in turn raises in a pointed way a general difficulty in the common interpretation of Kant’s theory of judgment: the tendency to hold that his logic and theory of judgment are at bottom epistemological or empirical psychological theories. But this common interpretation, as specifically applied to Kant’s view of the modality of judgments, should be rejected for four reasons. First, he explicitly isolates and discusses propositional attitudes in the context of his epistemology of judgment and his ethics of belief, so it is obvious that he does not confuse logical modality with propositional attitudes. Second, he firmly rejects logical psychologism, as we have already seen. Third, the notion of “value” (Wert) here clearly means the truth-value of a whole proposition, not its propositional content specifically, which explains why a modal predicate “contributes nothing to the content of a judgment,” i.e., it contributes nothing to the specific content of a judgment over and above its truth-value. Fourth and most importantly, the notion of “thinking in general” for Kant is the conceptual equivalent of Leibnizian logically possible worlds (Bxvii n., A573/B601). Thus the three kinds of modality of a judgment for Kant are, at bottom, the three basic ways in which truth can be assigned to simple 1-place subject-predicate propositions, or to non-categorical sentential propositions, across logically possible worlds—whether to some worlds (possibility), to this world alone (actuality, as essentially indexically determined by human sensory intuition/non-conceptual cognition), or to all worlds (necessity). So Kant says that problematic judgments are of the form “Possibly, Fs are Gs” (or: “Possibly P”); assertoric judgments are of the form “Actually, Fs are Gs” (or: “Actually P”); and apodictic judgments are of the form “Necessarily, Fs are Gs” (or: “Necessarily P”).
See the supplementary document:
For Kant, as we have seen, the propositional content of a judgment is more basic than its logical form. The propositional content of a judgment, in turn, can vary along at least three different dimensions: (1) its relation to sensory content, (2) its relation to the truth-conditions of propositions, and (3) its relation to the conditions for objective validity.
2.2.1 A priori judgments and a posteriori judgments
The notion of “cognitive content” for Kant has two sharply distinct senses: (i) intension or Inhalt, which is objective and representational (semantic content); and (ii) sensory matter or Materie, which is subjective and non-representational, reflecting only the immediate conscious response of the mind to the external impressions or inputs that trigger the operations of the faculty of sensibility (phenomenal qualitative content) (A19–20/B34, A320/B376). To be sure, for Kant just as for the Empiricists, all cognition “begins with” (mit … anfange) the raw data of sensory impressions. But in a crucial departure from Empiricism and towards what might be called a mitigated rationalism, Kant also holds that not all cognition “arises from” (entspringt … aus) sensory impressions: so for him, a significant and unique contribution to both the form and the objective representational content of cognition arises from the innate spontaneous cognitive capacities (B1). This notion of cognition’s “arising from” either sensory impressions or innate spontaneous cognitive capacities can best be construed as a strict determination relation (similar to what is nowadays called “strong supervenience”) such that X strictly determines Y if and only if the X-features of something are sufficient for its Y-features, and there cannot be a change in anything’s Y-features without a corresponding change in its X-features. This allows us to say that a cognition is a posteriori, empirical, or dependent on sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts just in case it is strictly determined in its form or in its semantic content by sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts; but a cognition is a priori, non-empirical, or absolutely independent of all sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts just in case it is not strictly determined in its form or in its semantic content by sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts and is instead strictly determined in its form or in its semantic content by our innate spontaneous cognitive faculties (B2–3). It should be noted that the apriority of a cognition in this sense is perfectly consistent with all sorts of associated sensory impressions and also with the actual presence of sensory matter in that cognition, caused by contingent natural objects or facts, so long as neither the form nor the semantic content is strictly determined by those sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts. “Pure” a priori cognitions are those that in addition to being a priori or absolutely independent of all sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts, also contain no sensory matter whatsoever (B3). So in other words, some but not all a priori cognitions are pure.
Applying these notions to judgments, it follows that a judgment is a posteriori if and only if either its logical form or its propositional content is strictly determined by sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts; and a judgment is a priori if and only if neither its logical form nor its propositional content is strictly determined by sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts, and both are instead strictly determined by our innate spontaneous cognitive faculties, whether or not that cognition also contains sensory matter. Kant also holds that a judgment is a priori if and only if it is necessarily true (Axv, B3–4, A76/B101). This strong connection between necessity and apriority expresses (i) Kant’s view that the contingency of a judgment is bound up with the modal dependence of its semantic content on sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts, i.e., its aposteriority (B3), (ii) his view that necessity is equivalent with strict universality or strenge Allgemeinheit, which he defines in turn as a proposition’s lack of any possible counterexamples or falsity-makers (B4), and (iii) his view that necessity entails truth (A75–76/B100–101). Furthermore Kant explicitly holds that not only do a priori judgments really exist in various sciences, including physics and legitimate (i.e., transcendental idealist) metaphysics, but also that there really are some pure a priori judgments, e.g., in mathematics (B4–5, B14–18).
2.2.2 Analytic judgments and synthetic judgments
Kant’s distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments is the historical origin of, and therefore significantly related to, but—crucially—not precisely equivalent, either in intension or extension, with the nowadays more familiar analytic-synthetic distinction, according to which (1) analyticity is truth by virtue of linguistic meaning alone, exclusive of empirical facts, (2) syntheticity is truth by virtue of empirical facts, and (3) the necessary statement vs. contingent statement distinction is formally and materially equivalent to the analytic-synthetic distinction. By 1950 this more familiar distinction was accepted as gospel truth by virtually all analytic philosophers: but in the two decades after the publication of W.V.O. Quine’s iconoclastic “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” in 1951 (Quine 1961), it was gradually replaced by the new-and-improved post-Quinean gospel truth that there is no such thing as an acceptable analytic-synthetic distinction. This plain historical fact is closely related to the highly regrettable further fact that Kant’s analytic-synthetic distinction is nowadays often wrongly interpreted (i) in terms of the more familiar and now largely discredited analytic-synthetic distinction, and also (ii) as reducible to an epistemic distinction between uninformatively or trivially true a priori judgments and informative judgments. Ironically Frege, the father or grandfather of analytic philosophy, was much nearer the mark in the Foundations of Arithmetic when he correctly construed Kant’s theory of analyticity semantically, as a theory about necessary internal relations between concepts; although at the same time he not quite so correctly said that Kantian analyticity boils down to “simply taking out of the box again what we have just put into it” (Frege 1953, 101). Frege’s 19th century characterization of Kantian analyticity, it turns out, has significant parallels with the 18th century Leibnizian and Wolffian theories of conceptual and/or logical truth that heavily influenced Kant’s work on analyticity (Anderson 2015). Backing away now from Frege and the Leibniz-Wolff tradition, however, the crucial fact is that Kant’s analytic-synthetic distinction concerns two irreducibly different kinds of semantic content within objectively valid propositions (Hanna 2001, chs. 3–4), and this distinction is neither primarily epistemic in character (although it does have some important epistemic implications [Hanna 2006b, 362–379]) nor does it specifically concern the logical form of judgments (4: 266).
Frege regarded Kant’s notion of analyticity as trivial; and, correspondingly, it is also true that if the Leibniz-Wolff approach to conceptual and/or logical truth largely determined Kant’s theory of analyticity, then Kant’s notion of analyticity is impoverished (Anderson 2015). But on the contrary Kant’s notion of analyticity is substantive, by virtue of five important ideas: first, Kant’s pro-Leibnizian idea that all concepts have intensional microstructures, or what he calls “logical essences” or “conceptual essences” (9: 61); second, his anti-Leibnizian idea that logically possible worlds are nothing but maximal logically consistent sets of concepts, not things-in-themselves (A571–573/B599–601); third, his referentialist idea that all grammatically well-formed, sortally correct, and logically consistent concepts have non-empty cross-possible-worlds extensions (a.k.a. “comprehensions”) (A239/B298–299) (9: 95–96); fourth, his semantic restrictionist idea that all and only objectively valid propositions have truth-values; and fifth, finally, and most importantly, his logical analyticity idea that the notion of analyticity covers not only the so-called “containment”of predicate-concepts in subject-concepts in categorical propositions, and not only the intensional identity of subject-concepts and predicate-concepts, but also all the logical truths of truth-functional logic and monadic predicate logic. Then for Kant a judgment is analytic if and only if its propositional content is necessarily true either by virtue of necessary internal relations between its objectively valid conceptual microstructures and/or its conceptual comprehensions, or by virtue of its truth-functional logical connectives, or by virtue of its monadic predicate logical connectives (Hanna 2001, ch. 3), leaving open the question of whether for Kant all logical connectives are strictly truth-functional. In any case, let this be repeated with strong emphasis: Kant does not define analyticity in terms of either the containment or the identity of concepts, which are at best sufficient conditions for analyticity and not also necessary conditions for analyticity. On the contrary, Kant explicitly states a universal, necessary, and sufficient semantic criterion for the truth of analytic judgments, namely that a judgment is analytically true if and only if its denial entails a contradiction, in a broad sense of “entailment” that includes intensional entailment and not merely classical deductive entailment (A151/B190–191). This criterion also directly connects the notion of an analytic truth with the notion of a logical truth in a correspondingly broad sense that fully includes the tautologies and valid sentences of truth-functional logic and monadic predicate logic, but is neither restricted to nor reducible to (with the addition of “logical definitions” [Frege 1953], whatever they actually turn out to be on Frege’s account, which is not at all clear [Benacerraf 1981]) the truth-functional tautologies and valid sentences of classical polyadic predicate logic.
Needless to say, however, if one holds that the Kantian definition of analyticity is truth-in-virtue-of-containment, and also that the Kantian definition of syntheticity is truth-in-virtue-of-non-containment, together with a Kantian conceptualist view of the nature of judgment, then one’s conception of Kant’s analytic and synthetic judgments will be correspondingly different (Anderson 2004, Anderson 2005, Anderson 2009, Anderson 2015).
But what about syntheticity? Since for Kant the analytic-synthetic distinction is exhaustive in the sense that every proposition is either analytic or synthetic but not both, his two-part doctrine of analyticity in turn provides him with a two-part negative doctrine of syntheticity: A proposition is synthetic if and only if its truth is not strictly determined by relations between its conceptual microstructures or conceptual comprehensions alone, or by truth-functional logic or monadic predicate logic alone (which for Kant is expressively captured by the table of judgments and the table of pure concepts of the understanding); and a judgment is synthetically true if and only if it is true and its denial does not entail a contradiction. But this negative characterization of course does not tell us what the truth of synthetic judgments positively consists in. In order to do this, Kant directly connects the semantics of syntheticity with the semantics of intuitions, just as he directly connects the semantics of analyticity with the semantics of concepts (including both empirical concepts and the pure concepts of the understanding). Then positively put, a judgment is synthetic if and only if its meaning and its truth are strictly determined by its constituent intuitions, whether empirical intuitions or pure intuitions (A8, A154–155/B193–194, A721/B749) (8: 245) (11: 38). This is not to say either that synthetic judgments do not contain any concepts (in fact they always do contain empirical or pure concepts), or even that the conceptual components of a synthetic judgment are irrelevant to its meaning or truth (in fact empirical or pure concepts always are semantically relevant), but only to say that in a synthetic judgment it is the intuitional components that strictly determine its meaning and truth, not its empirical-conceptual or pure-conceptual components. In short, a synthetic judgment is an intuition-based proposition.
2.2.3 Synthetic a priori judgments
Every reader of the Critique of Pure Reason knows that Kant glosses his philosophical project in that book as a complete and systematic answer to the question, “how are synthetic a priori judgments possible?” (B19). Also every reader of the first Critique knows that Kant asserts the existence of synthetic a priori judgments in mathematics, physics, and metaphysics (B14–18, A158/B197). But fewer readers are aware that this assertion, whether right or wrong, is certainly the boldest and perhaps also the most important claim in post-Cartesian metaphysics. This is because it posits the thesis of modal dualism, or the claim that there are two irreducibly different basic types of necessary truth, in the face of the almost universally-held counter-thesis of modal monism, or the claim that there is one and only basic type of necessary truth, i.e., analytically or logically necessary truth. Given Kant’s theory of truth, modal dualism also implies the worldly existence of two irreducibly different types of modal facts as truth-makers for analytically and synthetically necessary truths respectively. In short if Kant is right, then there are fundamentally more things in heaven and earth than modal monists are prepared to acknowledge. Moreover Kant holds that all the basic statements of traditional metaphysics are, at least in intention, synthetic a priori judgments (B18). Hence his famous critique of traditional metaphysics in the Transcendental Dialectic is nothing but a deepened and extended investigation of the possibility of synthetic a priori judgments.
But what is a synthetic a priori judgment? Combining the a priori-a posteriori distinction with the analytic-synthetic distinction, Kant derives four possible kinds of judgment: (1) analytic a priori, (2) analytic a posteriori, (3) synthetic a priori, and (4) synthetic a posteriori. By virtue of the fact that analytic judgments are necessarily true, and given Kant’s thesis that necessity entails apriority, it follows that all analytic judgments are a priori and that there is no such thing as an analytic a posteriori judgment. By contrast, synthetic judgments can be either a priori or a posteriori. Synthetic a posteriori judgments are empirical, contingent judgments, although they may vary widely as to their degree of generality. Synthetic a priori judgments, by contrast, are non-empirical, non-contingent judgments.
More precisely however, synthetic a priori judgments have three essential features. First, because a synthetic a priori judgment is a priori, its meaning and truth are strictly underdetermined by sensory impressions and/or contingent natural objects or facts, and it is also necessarily true. Second, because a synthetic a priori judgment is synthetic, not analytic, its truth is not determined by conceptual/truth-functional-logical/monadic-predicate-logical factors alone, and its denial is logically consistent. Third, as is the case with all synthetic judgments, the meaning and truth of a synthetic a priori judgment is intuition-based. This third factor is the crucial one. For while the meaning and truth of synthetic a posteriori judgments is based on empirical intuitions, the meaning and truth of synthetic a priori judgments is based on pure intuitions or our a priori formal representations of space and time (B73) (8: 245) (11: 38). Now since according to Kant our a priori formal representations of space and time are both necessary conditions of the possibility of human experience and also necessary conditions of the objective validity or empirical meaningfulness of judgments, which in turn confers truth-valuedness upon propositions, it then follows that a synthetic a priori judgment is a proposition that is true in all and only the humanly experienceable possible worlds and truth-valueless otherwise (Hanna 2001, 239–245). By sharp contrast, analytic judgments, as logical truths in either a narrow (truth-functional or syllogistic) or broad (intensional logic) sense, are true in all logically possible worlds, including those logically possible worlds in which human experience is not possible, i.e., the worlds containing non-phenomenal or non-apparent entities, especially including things-in-themselves, i.e., the “noumenal worlds.”
So analytic and synthetic a priori judgments sharply differ not only in the nature of their semantic content (i.e., concept-based/truth-functional-logic-based/monadic-predicate-logic-based vs. intuition-based) but also in their modal scope (true in all logically possible worlds vs. true in all and only humanly experienceable worlds and truth-valueless otherwise). Nevertheless, despite this sharp difference in modal scope—from which it follows, perhaps surprisingly, that for Kant there are logically possible worlds in which synthetic a priori propositions such as “7+5=12” are thinkably deniable—since synthetic a priori judgments are either true or truth-valueless in every logically possible world, it also follows that they are never false in any logically possible world and thus satisfy Kant’s general definition of a necessary truth, i.e., that a proposition is necessary if and only if it is strictly universally true, in that it is true in every member of a complete class of possible worlds and has no possible counterexamples or falsity-makers (Hanna 2001, ch. 5). Less abstractly and gallumphingly put, a synthetic a priori judgment is a necessary truth with a human face.
In the discussion so far, judgments are essentially identified with their propositional contents. But according to Kant it is also possible for a rational cognizer to use the very same propositional content in different ways. The fundamental difference in uses of judgments is between (a) theoretical judgments and (b) non-theoretical judgments. But there are also some crucial differences between theoretical uses of judgments. For a discussion of these kinds of use, see the following supplementary document:
There is a very real sense in which Kant’s positive metaphysics in the Critique of Pure Reason is essentially an elaboration of his theory of judgment: “it is not at all [traditional] metaphysics that the Critique is doing but a whole new science, never before attempted, namely the critique of an a priori judging reason” (10: 340). This results directly from the conjunction of the centrality thesis and the transcendental idealism thesis: judgment is the central cognitive activity of the human mind, and judgments are objectively valid and true if and only if the metaphysics of transcendental idealism is correct. In this section, the crucial connection between judgment and transcendental idealism will be spelled out in more detail.
Transcendental idealism is the conjunction of two theses: (1) cognitive idealism, which says that all the proper objects of human cognition are nothing but mind-dependent sensory appearances or phenomena, not things-in-themselves or noumena (A369), and (2) representational transcendentalism , which says that all representations and their contents necessarily conform to the forms or structures of our innate spontaneous cognitive capacities (Bxvi, A11/B25) (4: 373 n.). There are weaker and stronger interpretations of these theses (see, e.g., Allais 2015), but in any case transcendental idealism in its strongest version directly entails that all the objects of human experience are token-identical with objectively-valid sensory representational contents:
You put the matter quite precisely when you say The content (Innbegriff) of a representation is itself the object; and the activity of the mind whereby the content of a representation is represented is what is meant by ‘referring to the object. (11: 314)
Longuenesse aptly dubs this Kantian thesis “the internalization to representation of the object of representation” (Longuenesse 1998, 20, 108). But perhaps even more importantly, Kant’s “internalization to representation of the object of representation” entails that all the basic phenomenal forms or structures of those objects of experience are type-identical with the forms or structures introduced into representations by the innately pre-programmed spontaneous operations of our cognitive faculties, and in particular with the spatiotemporal structures of our subjective forms of sensory intuition. Indeed, Kant explicitly holds that space and time are nothing but our subjective forms of intuition, which is his controversial thesis of “the transcendental ideality of space and time” (A28–30/B44–45, A36/B52–53, A42–43/B59–60). The upshot is that according to the strongest version of transcendental idealism, all the objects of human experience are nothing but what we represent them to be, when we represent sensory objects according to the a priori normative principles of our understanding and our reason: so our cognition does not conform to the objects we cognize, rather those objects necessarily conform to our innate a priori normatively-governed faculties of cognition (Bxvi, A92/B125–126).
Now assume that this strongest version of transcendental idealism is correct. Then add to this assumption Kant’s centrality thesis, to the effect that judgment is the central human cognitive faculty, and also the priority-of-the-proposition thesis. It follows immediately that all the objects of human experience are token-identical with the propositional contents of objectively valid empirical judgments, and also that all the basic phenomenal forms or structures of objects of human experience are type-identical with the spatiotemporal and logico-syntactic and logico-semantic forms or structures that are inherent in the propositional contents of empirical judgments, which we can now see to be forms or structures that have been introduced directly into nature by the acts of the cognitive faculties of sensibility, imagination, understanding, apperception, and reason, which are all brought together and fused in the unifying act of judgment or thought . In short, the strongest version of Kant’s transcendental idealism is also a judgment-based idealism, according to which actual or non-actual/merely possible empirical objects or states-of-affairs are nothing but true or false empirical propositions, and according to which the basic phenomenal contours of the world we cognize are precisely the same as the innate intuitional, formal-syntactic, and semantic contours of the several cognitive faculties that jointly generate our judgments.
Kant’s judgment-based idealism has some crucial consequences for his theory of truth. If the strongest version of transcendental idealism is correct, then to every true empirical judgment there necessarily corresponds an actual empirical fact, and conversely, and also to every true a priori judgment there necessarily corresponds some objectively real conceptually-represented or intuitionally-represented structure across a complete set of logically or experientially possible worlds. What this means is that whereas Kant’s theory of truth is explicitly realistic at the empirical level—which is what he calls his “empirical realism” (A28/B44, A35/B52, A370–373)—in that actual empirical facts or modal facts (whether these are conceptually-represented logical world-structures or intuitionally-represented non-logical world-structures) always present themselves as in some irreducible respects external or extrinsic to our cognition, and therefore not controlled by us, nevertheless at the transcendental level his theory of truth is fully anti-realistic: transcendentally speaking, we impose truth upon the world . In short, the strongest version of transcendental idealism plus the centrality thesis plus the priority-of-the-proposition thesis jointly necessarily guarantee that all and only the cognitively well-generated judgments are true. This is what Kant calls the “transcendental truth” of judgments (A146/B185). Transcendental falsity, by contrast, is always the result of some special idiosyncrasy or accidental glitch in the cognitive generation of a given judgment, and thus represents a mere “performance error” in the operation of our cognitive faculties, and not a gap in our transcendental cognitive “competence.” Thus any sort of serious skepticism at the transcendental level of Kant’s theory of judgment is automatically ruled out of court.
One important critical question that needs to be raised is whether, in view of the strongest version of his transcendental idealism, Kant’s theory of judgment is reductionist in some basic respects, and in particular whether he reduces the meaning or propositional content of a judgment to a rule for confirming or disconfirming the assertion of that propositional content in the tribunal of sensory experience. This is of course the thesis of verificationism. Several important Kant commentators—e.g., Bird 1962, Strawson 1966, and Stroud 1968—have held that Kant’s theory of judgment is verificationist. Familiar problems with verificationism include its susceptibility to epistemic skepticism, its commitment to an implausible coherence theory of truth, and specific difficulties about how to confirm or disconfirm judgments about the non-immediate past or future.
It cannot be denied that there are some verificationist strands in Kant’s theory. For one thing, his “criterion of empirical truth” (see Section 1.3 above) is in effect verificationist. Moreover, to the extent that both Kant’s theory of transcendental truth and also his verificationism are anti-realist and judgment-based, there is at least an elective affinity if not precisely an equivalence between the two doctrines. Nevertheless, Kant is not a reductionist about meaning. In other words, he is not committed to the thesis that the propositional content of a judgment is nothing but a rule for confirming or disconfirming the assertion of that propositional content in the tribunal of sensory experience. While he does seem to be committed to the thesis that the propositional content of a judgment will be empirically meaningful or objectively valid only if it contains a rule for confirming or disconfirming the assertion of that propositional content in the tribunal of sensory experience, this does not by any means exhaust the propositional content of that judgment. Over and above its verificationist element, the propositional content of every judgment also contains a “thick” or non-deflationary correspondence-relation to relatively external or extrinsic actual facts (see Section 1.3 above). Furthermore the propositional content of every judgment contains a set of a priori logical forms deriving from the pure understanding, as well as a higher-order a priori rational subjective unity deriving from the faculty for apperception or rational self-consciousness (see Section 2.1.1 above). What this means is that Kant is at most a weak verificationist, and that the verificationist elements of his theory of judgment are significantly tempered by his semantic non-reductionism, his empirical realism, and his mitigated rationalism.
A more complete picture of Kant’s metaphysics of judgment is obtained by sketching in accounts of judgments of experience and transcendental judgments. These are discussed in the following supplementary document:
The basic parts of Kant’s theory of judgment are now all in place. In this concluding section, we will look briefly at several serious problems for Kant’s theory. These problems, which come to a head in the debate about Kant’s conceptualism vs. Kant’s non-conceptualism (see the supplementary document The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism), all ultimately stem from the interplay between either the centrality thesis or the priority-of-the-proposition thesis, and the transcendental ideality thesis. This in turn suggests that the other two parts of Kant’s theory can be logically detached from his transcendental idealism and defended independently of it.
4.1 The bottom-up problem: essentially non-conceptual intuitions, rogue objects, and the gap in the B Deduction
What can be called the bottom-up problem for Kant’s metaphysics of judgment follows directly from his non-conceptualism (see the supplement The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism), and exposes a fundamental gap in the B Deduction. In our discussion of the B Deduction (see the supplement Completing the Picture of Kant’s Metaphysics of Judgment) it was noted that Kant’s argument for the objective validity of the categories will go through only if all the objects of human intuition are necessarily also objects of human experience, that is, are necessarily also objects correctly represented by true judgments of experience, that is, are necessarily also objects falling under all of the categories, or at the very least under the principle of the Second Analogy of Experience, which provides the criterion of the objectivity of objects of experience. But if this claim fails, then there can in principle be nomologically ill-behaved or “rogue” objects of human intuition that fall outside the scope of judgments of experience and thus also outside the categories, or at least outside the scope of the Second Analogy. As several Kant-interpreters have pointed out, given the possibility of essentially non-conceptual intuitions, then the B Deduction is in big trouble (Kitcher 1990, Hanna 2016b). More precisely, Kant’s non-conceptualism entails that there can be objectively valid empirical intuitions that are both autonomous from and also independent of concepts, and thereby directly refer to objects. Since the cognition of these objects does not require either concepts or the faculty of understanding, and since these intuitions consciously represent objects over and above any conceptual content whatsoever, then some of these intuitions can pick out rogue objects that fall outside the constraints of all the categories, and thereby outside the constraints of the Second Analogy in particular. So it is not true that the categories and principles of pure understanding necessarily apply to all objects of conscious human perception, and the categorial anarchy of at least some sensory objects is really possible. Therefore the B Deduction is unsound.
The bottom-up problem has a metaphysical mirror-image, which can be called the top-down problem. This problem afflicts Kant’s transcendental doctrine of judgment, and consequently also his theory of the principles of pure understanding (see the supplement Completing the Picture of Kant’s Metaphysics of Judgment). The worry here is simply that even allowing for the transcendental schematism of the judgment, there is still no absolute guarantee that a given universal transcendental principle or transcendental concept of the understanding, construed as a rule for ordering sensory appearances or sensory objects, has been completely applied to sensory appearances or objects. In other words, even allowing for his transcendental doctrine of the judgment, Kant has not given us good reason to think that there cannot be any sensory appearances or objects that fail to be subsumed under the transcendental principles of nature. In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant calls the specifically causal-law-governed or nomological interconnection of all sensory appearances or objects under transcendental principles the “transcendental affinity”of the sensory manifold of intuitions (A114). In the A edition of the first Critique, Kant asserts that if the categories are objectively valid, then the transcendental affinity of the manifold automatically follows. Then, assuming the strongest version of transcendental idealism, he further asserts that from transcendental affinity, an “empirical affinity” of the sensory manifold of intuitions also directly follows (A115). Now since empirical affinity is the complete application to actual empirical nature of the system of causal laws under transcendental principles, it follows that empirical affinity is the same as the systematic unity of nature. So Kant is saying that the systematic unity of nature is a trivial consequence of transcendental affinity.
In the first Critique’s Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic however, Kant quietly but very significantly backtracks on this crucial point and treats the principle of the systematic unity of nature as stemming only from a regulative but not a constitutive use of judgment, although this principle is also asserted to have some sort of transcendental force (see the supplement Kinds of Use). Then in the first Introduction to the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant explicitly says that
[it] is quite possible in itself (at least as far as the understanding can make out a priori), [that] the multiplicity of these [empirical] laws, along with the natural forms corresponding to them, being infinitely great, [could] … present to us a raw chaotic aggregate and not the least trace of a system, even though we must presuppose such a system in accordance with transcendental laws. (20: 209)
In other words, now Kant is saying that the transcendental affinity of the manifold does not entail an empirical affinity of the manifold or the systematic unity of nature. To be sure, in the third Critique, he also explicitly ties together the principle of systematic unity with the regulative use of reflective judgments of taste, and says that it is a subjectively necessary transcendental principle presupposed by legitimate judgments of taste (see the supplement Kinds of Use). But if the principle of systematic unity is only subjectively and not in fact objectively necessary, then Kant has not shown us that the system of causal laws of nature must be completely applied to sensory appearances or objects. Rather he has shown only that we must epistemically believe it to be completely applied to sensory appearances or objects. So there remains the real possibility of relatively or absolutely chaotic aggregates of sensory appearances or objects that are not subsumed or even in principle cannot be subsumed under the transcendental affinity of the manifold, i.e., the real possibility of the categorial anarchy of rogue objects. In other words, for all that Kant has argued, and by his own reckoning, even assuming transcendental affinity there might still be no complete application of transcendental laws to nature. So the transcendental schematism of the pure concepts is insufficient to bridge the gap between categories and sensory appearances, and the transcendental doctrine of judgment fails.
As we saw in the supplement Completing the Picture of Kant’s Metaphysics of Judgment, the Second Analogy of Experience, if true, guarantees both the objectivity and the universal diachronic or temporally successive causal necessitation of objects of experience and all of their parts, under natural laws. As we also saw in Section 1.3, the “criterion of empirical truth” for a judgment of experience says that since the objectively valid propositional content of an empirical judgment can be specified as a necessary conceptual rule of sensory appearances or objects, then if that rule is effectively applied to the temporal succession of our sensory representations of the phenomenal material world, and that rule coheres with the causal-dynamic laws of nature, then that judgment is true. And finally, as we also saw in Section 3.1, the centrality thesis, the priority-of-the-proposition thesis, and the transcendental idealism thesis jointly entail the “transcendental truth” of judgment, which is that necessarily every well-generated judgment of experience is true and corresponds to an actual object of experience, that is, to an actual empirical fact.
But here is a simple objection to this three-part doctrine, borrowed from Descartes’s famous “dream skepticism” in the first of the Meditations on First Philosophy. Kant calls this form of skepticism “problematic idealism” (B274). To generate the relevant version of problematic idealism, suppose that all the sensory appearances or objects currently falling under the Second Analogy, the criterion of empirical truth, and the principle of transcendental truth are nothing but causally well-ordered parts of my inner sense alone. Then any object of experience corresponding to my currently true judgment of experience might be nothing but a very coherent dream or a hallucination. Nothing Kant has said can rule this out. Even the famous Refutation of Idealism in the first Critique, if sound, says only that “inner experience is possible only through outer experience in general” (B278–279), and Kant explicitly concedes that at any given time, for all we know, we could be dreaming or hallucinating:
from the fact that the existence of outer objects is required for the possibility of a determinate consciousness of our self it does not follow that every intuitive representation of outer things includes at the same time their existence, for that may well be the mere effect of the imagination (in dreams as well as delusions). (B278)
So even if inner experience and outer experience are necessarily connected in general, the truth and objectivity of any particular judgment of experience, by Kant’s own criteria for truth and objectivity, are consistent with the possibility that the particular object of experience corresponding to that judgment is nothing but very coherent dream or a hallucination. After all, I can perfectly well dream or hallucinate a boat going downstream, as well as actually seeing one. It is true that Kant does remark in the General Note on the System of Principles in the B edition of the first Critique that “in order to understand the possibility of things in accordance with the categories, and thus to establish the objective reality of the latter, we do not merely need intuitions, but always outer intuitions” (B291). This seems correct. But unfortunately, given what Kant says at B278, nothing in his transcendentally idealistic metaphysics of judgment will guarantee that any set of sensory appearances or objects satisfying his criteria for the truth and objectivity of judgments of experience on any particular occasion will in fact be material objects in space corresponding to outer intuitions, and not merely causally well-ordered mental imagery corresponding to inner intuitions, i.e., mere “phantoms of my brain.” So the Second Analogy’s criterion of objectivity is ultimately insufficient to yield the empirical truth of judgments of experience, despite Kant’s explicit claim that this criterion does yield both their objective validity and their empirical truth (A202/B247).
As we have seen in Sections 4.1 to 4.3, Kant’s theory of judgment leads to at least three serious problems when it is taken in conjunction with the issue about his conceptualism vs. his non-conceptualism (in the supplement The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism) and his metaphysics of strong transcendental idealism (Section 3.1 and the supplement Completing the Picture of Kant’s Metaphysics of Judgment). Does this mean his theory of judgment is philosophically unacceptable and at best an antiquarian curiosity of 18th century German philosophy? No. This is because it seems very likely that the problems in Kant’s theory of judgment are principally due to his conjoining the centrality thesis and the priority-of-the-proposition thesis with the thesis of transcendental idealism. But suppose that the strongest version of transcendental idealism is false, and that the transcendental idealism thesis is either logically detached from the other two theses or else retained but instead based on a significantly weaker version of transcendental idealism (Hanna 2006b, ch. 5): what remains? We are left with a general Kantian theory of human rationality that is essentially oriented towards judgment, and then in turn with specific Kantian accounts of the nature of judgment and of the various irreducibly different kinds of judgment, that are essentially oriented towards the anthropocentric empirical meaningfulness and truth of the proposition. As such, Kant’s theory of judgment is thoroughly cognitivist but also anti-psychologistic and anti-platonistic, and it thereby smoothly combines the several “faces” of judgment into a unified doctrine. So the fact that Kantian non-conceptualism (see the supplement The Togetherness Principle, Kant’s Conceptualism, and Kant’s Non-Conceptualism) makes serious trouble for the B Deduction (Section 4.1), together with the further fact that the strongest version of transcendental idealism is very likely false—since the unqualified transcendental ideality thesis, when conjoined with the centrality thesis and the priority-of-the-proposition thesis, collectively entail contradictions in Kant’s theory that are not entailed by the conjunction of the other two theses alone—do not ultimately compromise the inherent philosophical interest, contemporary relevance, and critical defensibility of the other basic parts of Kant’s theory of judgment.
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- “The Role of Imagination in Kant’s Theory of Experience”, by Wilfrid Sellars.