Notes to Kant's Transcendental Idealism

1. Ever since the publication of the Critique, this claim, the so-called “doctrine of noumenal affection”, has been especially controversial since it apparently involves predicating a category (cause-effect) of things in themselves. This controversy is discussed below, in section 3.4.

2. In the Critique of Practical Reason, transcendental idealism is invoked to secure the possibility of the highest good (Ak. 5:134–136); in the Critique of Judgment, it is invoked to prove the possibility of a reflective judgment of taste (Ak. 5:338–351) and the possibility of a reflective judgment of purposiveness (Ak. 5:405–415).

3. In the B Edition, Kant adds a footnote here, pointing out that “formal” idealism might be a better term for this view, to distinguish it from “material” idealism (which he elsewhere calls “empirical” idealism).

4. See especially B274, but also B71. Berkeley is also cited as a dogmatic idealist in the Prolegomena (Ak. 4:293, 374) and Refl. 6311 (Ak. 18:610) and the metaphysics lectures (Ak. 28:680, 29:928). Beiser (2002: 79–80) argues that in the A Edition Kant has Leibniz in mind as the representative dogmatic idealist.

5. The empirical thing in itself corresponds roughly to Lockean primary qualities, while the empirical appearance corresponds roughly to its secondary qualities. For Kant’s own comparison of his idealism to that Lockean distinction see Prolegomena (Ak. 4:289); Allais (2007) is a sophisticated discussion of Kant’s secondary quality analogy.

6. E.g. magnetic matter (A226/B273) and “lamellae” (“Discovery”, Ak. 8:205), light particles posited by Newton. See Langton 1998: 186–204.

7. Beiser 1987 and 2002 are particularly illuminating on the influence of the subjectivist reading on the development of post-Kantian German philosophy. See also Vaihinger 1892: vol. 2, 35–55.

8. A translation is published in Sassen 2000: 54–58. The same volume also contains a translation of Garve’s much longer original draft; the originals can be found in Karl Vorländer’s edition of the Prolegomena (Hamburg: Meiner, 1969: 167–74). In a letter to Kant, Garve claims that the published review is mainly Feder’s fault (Ak. 10: 331). However, as Beiser (2002: 88) points out, nearly two thirds of the published review comes from the Garve’s original text.

9. As Beiser (2002) points out, Jacobi, whose influential objections to Kant’s idealism are discussed in section 3.4, cites the following passages in defense of the phenomenalist interpretation: A370, A372–3, A374–75n, A378, A379–80, A36–37, A37n, A491, A101, A125, A126–7.

10. Discussions of Kant’s alleged phenomenalism have been somewhat distorted in Anglophone literature by the emphasis on the semantic version of phenomenalism made popular by (among others) Russell and Carnap according to which sentences about objects are equivalent in meaning to complex sentences about mental states. It is implausible that Kant intended such a semantic reduction. Cf. Bennett 1966: 136–7 and Allison 2004: 38. Van Cleve (1999: 8–12) requires more minimally that facts about objects be “derivable” from facts about mental states, but if “derivable” here means something like “derivable using logic and definitions” it is still too strong for Kant.

11. Kant also points out that that, in contrast to Berkeley’s empiricist theory of ideas, space and time constitute necessary and a priori forms for any experience of objects (for minds like ours). For more on this point, see the supplementary article: Kant’s Attempts to Distance Himself from Berkeley.

12. The relation of Kant to Berkeley has been extensively discussed in the secondary literature. Scholars who agree with Kant that his idealism is fundamentally different than Berkeley’s include Wilson (1971), Allison (1973), Walker (1985), Beiser (2002: 82–103), and Emundts (2008). The similarity of Kant to Berkeley is argued for by Turbayne (1955, 1969).

13. Beiser (2002: 100–102) convincingly argues that Kant’s interpretation of Berkeley fits his later work Siris rather well (the only Berkeleyan work Kant cites by name) rather than his earlier Principles and Dialogues, on which our modern reading of Berkeley is largely based. But this does not affect my point in the body of the text: if Kant is ignorant of, or simply not talking about, Berkeley’s Principles and Dialogues view, his horror at being identified with the good Bishop is not strong evidence against the phenomenalist reading.

14. The idea that the B Edition represents a substantive change in view from the A edition seems to have been originated by Schopenhauer in 1818 in the first volume of Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung (see Schopenhauer 1938: vol. II, 514–517, 526–527); since then, it has been shared by many, including Heidegger (1929) and Guyer (1987).

15. Kant also refers to his own position as “formal” idealism in the Prolegomena (Ak. 4:337). Elsewhere, he refers to it as “critical” idealism (Prolegomena 4:294, 375; On a discovery 8:210).

16. But that definition of transcendental idealism, as we saw earlier, was one of the motivations for the phenomenalist reading in the first place. Kant would have been aware that his early readers picked up on the phenomenalist implications of this passage, for Jacobi cites it as evidence that Kant is a phenomenalist. If Kant wants to prevent the phenomenalist (mis)interpretation popularized by Feder and Garve, why does he add a footnote to, but not otherwise amend, a definition with apparently phenomenalist implications? Some phenomenalist readers might take this as evidence for their reading.

17. In the “Aesthetic”: “what we call outer objects are nothing other than mere representations of our sensibility” (A30/B45). See also A189/B235 and A191/B236.

18. See note 33 for more on the idea of a shift in view from the A to the B Edition.

19. This is appropriate, since Kant seems to have placed a great deal of importance on the Refutation, judging by the number of Reflections about it: 5653–4, 6311–12, 6313–16, 5709, 6317, 6319 and 6323. For critical discussion, see Guyer (1983, 1987: 279–332); Vogel (1993); Hanna (2000); Dicker (2008); Chignell (2010) and Dicker’s reply, (2011).

20. I am thus departing from the interpretation of Guyer (1983, 1987), according to which Kant’s ultimate intention in the Refutation, only fulfilled in later Reflections, is to prove the existence of objects ontologically independent of the self (“things in themselves”).

21. There is, however, a lengthy scholarly controversy over whether the “Refutation of Idealism” is compatible with the A Edition; see Vaihinger (1884) for a survey of the earlier literature and Guyer (1987) for a more recent argument that, with the “Refutation”, Kant fundamentally alters his earlier position.

22. See, though, Kant’s long comment on the “Refutation” in the B Preface (Bxxxix–Bxli), where he remarks:

the representation of something persisting in experience is not the same as the persisting representation. (Bxli)

So there may be room for an identity phenomenalist reading of the “Refutation” after all.

23. I am only claiming that phenomenalism is prima facie compatible with the “Refutation”; on this point, I am in agreement with Guyer (1983: 337–338). Whether or not the argument of the Refutation must ultimately be interpreted in a way that demands realism, I will not attempt to address here.

24. In fact, a broadly phenomenalist analysis of objects is even compatible with Kant’s final note to the argument:

Here it had to be proved that inner experience in general is possible only through outer experience in general. Whether this or that putative experience is not mere imagination must be ascertained according to its particular determinations and through its coherence with the criteria of all actual experience. (B278–9)

Kant points to the distinction between “mere imagination” of objects (dreams, hallucinations, etc.) and veridical perception and claims that his argument has established that self-consciousness requires the latter, although self-consciousness only requires veridical perception “in general”. I take this to mean that a self-conscious subject can sometimes simply be dreaming, but it is impossible that a self-conscious subject only ever dreams or hallucinates. This is compatible with a phenomenalist reading because (as discussed in greater detail in section 3) the phenomenalist can distinguish between veridical perception and dreaming. The key point is that the phenomenalist must analyze veridical perception in terms of the internal unity and coherence among experiences, rather than their matching some mind-independent object. For instance, in line with the interpretation sketched above, the phenomenalist can read Kant as claiming that self-consciousness requires that enough of one’s experiences cohere to constitute a unified experience.

25. Van Cleve (1999) refers to the “act-object (“ing”-“ed”) ambiguity of words like “representation” (which is also possessed by words like Vorstellung in German)” (1999: 7). However, I’m not sure my linguistic intuitions (about either German or English) agree with Van Cleve’s here.

26. Sellars (1968: ch.2, 1976). See also Cummins (1968) and Aquila (1979, 1983: ch. 4). Descartes discusses the formal and objective reality of ideas in Meditation three.

27. Passages that support the grounding of the existence of objects in experience include A245/B276, B279, A490–1/B518–9, A520/B492-A521/B493, A494/B522. Aquila (1983) develops a detailed textual case that appearances exist in being experienced. For a non-phenomenalist reading of these passages see Allison (2004: 40 and 41).

28. This interpretation of experience bears some resemblance to that given in Cohen (1871), without Cohen’s Neo-Kantian reading of the thing in itself as the unapproachable limit of scientific knowledge.

29. Conjunction is usually defined for sentences, but it can be easily generalized to all representations that have correctness conditions: if A and B are representations in some mode m, the representation A&B is the representation in mode m (if there is one) that is correct just in case A is correct and B is correct.

30. Allais may have in mind the fact that perceptions are themselves appearances, and thus exist in virtue of the very universal experience they ground. If so, her objection is a form of the “problem of affection” discussed in section 3.4.3, and treated more fully in Stang (2015).

31. It is not universally granted that Kant accepts the Affection claim; Vaihinger (1892) lists Fichte, Beck, Maimon, and Hermann Cohen, among others, as “Kantianer” who denied noumenal affection. In the third chapter of his 1924, Erich Adickes assembles an impressive array of textual evidence that Kant did accept Affection. See especially A190/B235, A387, A494/B522, Ak. 4:289, 4:314, 4:318, 4:451 and 8:215.

32. Van Cleve points out that p and It is unknowable whether p are logically consistent but asserting both might constitute a pragmatic self-contradiction (1999: 135). But, as Hogan (2009a: 61n3) points out, Kant also claims that it is “indubitably certain” (A48) that things in themselves are not in space and time. Ameriks (2003: 29–30) argues that Existence and Affection constitute a pre-theoretic belief that Kant never has reason to deny (although he does successively give up his pre-theoretic belief that these beings are spatial, etc.), to which Hogan correctly counters that Non-spatiality is surely not such a pre-theoretic assumption (2009a: 50–51) and that, even if Affection is a pre-theoretic belief that is never defeated by the critical epistemology, it is undermined by the discovery that none of the objects we experience are things in themselves (2009b: 503).

33. Langton (1998) defends such an interpretation, on which we lack knowledge specifically of the intrinsic properties of things in themselves.

34. Cf. B166–7, A88/B120, A254/B309. In the remainder of this passage, Kant refers to the practical use of the thought of categories without intuitions; this is a reference to the crucial role that things in themselves play in his theory of freedom. See Critique of Practical Reason, Ak. 5:43, 54–55.

35. It is sometimes misleadingly referred to as the problem of double affection. Double affection is the doctrine that accepts both horns of Jacobi’s problem, famously defended by Adickes (1924, 1929). Jacobi’s problem only arises on the first horn: empirical affection. Van Cleve (1999: 165–6) rejects the doctrine of empirical affection for this very reason. Stang (2015) attempts to solve the problem. For more on the doctrine of double affection see Drexler (1904), Adickes (1929), Kemp Smith (1962, especially Appendix C), Weldon (1958), Vaihinger (1892: vol. 2, 35–55, esp. 53–55), and Gram (1975).

36. I do not want to suggest that everyone read the Critique this way until the twentieth century. Already in the nineteenth century, the Neo-Kantian movement developed a non-phenomenalist interpretation of Kant, but that lies outside the scope of this survey. See especially Cohen (1871/1885, 1907); as well as Köhnke (1986), Patton (2005), and Richardson (2003).

37. I have in mind mainly Bird (1962), Prauss (1974), Allison (1973, 1976, 1983, 2004). Cf. Collins (1999), Dryer (1966: ch. 11); Matthews (1969). Earlier “dual aspect” readings include Paton (1936: vol. 1, 61), and Beck (1960).

38. See also A35/B51, B69, B306, A360. The Dual Aspect view is more or less directly stated by Kant in the Opus Postumum (Ak. 22:43–44). However, since some scholars think that Kant revised fundamental aspects of his Critical theory in that later work (the idea of a “post-Critical” Kant), this is not as decisive evidence as it would otherwise be.

39. There is thus a natural connection between the epistemological interpretation of transcendental idealism and Putnam-style “internal realism”, a point noted by Allison (2004: 454 note 17). The relation between transcendental idealism and contemporary anti-realism is explored in Allais (2003) and Van Cleve (1999: ch. 12).

40. For Kant’s conception of an “intuitive intellect”, see the Critique of Judgment, Ak. 5:406. He discusses the related (though not necessarily identical) notion of a non-sensible intuition at A249, A256/B311–2, B307, and A286/B342.

41. Strawson (1966: 20–21) interprets discursivity more minimally as the claim that we have singular representations of objects which we subsume under general concepts; Strawson thinks Kant went wrong in assuming that this “logical” dualism must be explained by a “dualism” of mental faculties: a receptive faculty of intuitions, and a spontaneous faculty of concepts. Allison (2004: 12–13) responds to Strawson on these points.

42. We have different epistemic conditions for different kinds of objects, e.g. space is an epistemic condition for outer objects, but not for inner intuitions. So the definition should really be: E is an epistemic conditions of objects on kind K iff necessarily in cognizing objects of kind K we represent them using E. However, in the body of the text I suppress this complication.

43. “The pure concepts of the understanding are free from this limitation and extend to objects of intuition in general, whether the later be similar to our own or not, as long as it is sensible and not intellectual” (B148).

44. Allison also reconstructs Kant’s argument for the non-spatiality of things in themselves in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” (Allison 2004: 128–132), specifically, how Kant can respond to the famous “neglected alternative” problem. However, that argument is independent of Allison’s larger interpretation of transcendental idealism, so I do not discuss it here; a “two object” interpreter could, in principle, embrace that other argument.

45. For the triviality objection see Guyer (1987: 336); Langton (1998: 8–12); Aquila (1983: 90); Van Cleve (1999: 4). For Allison’s own reply to the triviality charge, see his (2004: 18–19). Allison’s response is that the non-cognizability of things in themselves follows from a distinction, but the distinction is not trivial. This is confused, however. Distinctions do not have consequences; claims that distinctions do or not obtain have consequences. And, arguably, the statement that the appearance/thing in itself distinction obtains is a matter of definition (on Allison’s reading). In the body of the text I have attempted to reply on Allison’s behalf to the triviality objection.

46. See also Robinson (1994) and Guyer (1987: 337–338). Van Cleve (1999: 148–149) presents the argument in greater detail and Allison responds in 2004: 42–45. As I understand Allison’s response to Van Cleve it is the same point as above: we should not assume that there is a way objects independently of an epistemic perspective on t hem.

47. E.g., Kant’s claim that our noumenal character causes our empirical character (A546/B574, A551/B579, A556/B584, A557/B585), and in Groundwork III that “the world of understanding contains the ground of the world of sense” (Ak. 4:453).

48. Langton’s explanation of how Humility is compatible with

(Affection) Things in themselves causally affect us.

requires her to slightly amend the “translation” rules from above, though, because otherwise Affection would entail that “affecting us” is an intrinsic property of substances, which she would deny. Langton’s reconstruction of Kant’s argument for Humility rests on the premise that the causal powers of substances by which they affect us do not supervene on their intrinsic properties. Consequently, affect us is not an intrinsic property of substances. Nonetheless, Langton can reinterpret Affection as:

(Affection*) Substances causally affect us in virtue of their powers, which do not supervene on their intrinsic properties.

consistent with the spirit of her interpretation.

49. This requires a slight tweak in her definition of things in themselves and appearances:

(Things in themselves*) Things in themselves are substances with intrinsic properties, and extrinsic properties that supervene on intrinsic properties.

(Appearances*) Appearances are non-supervenient extrinsic properties of substances.

However, this is consistent with Langton’s overall reading because we can now say: our ignorance of things in themselves is ignorance of their intrinsic properties and the extrinsic properties that supervene on them. Since causal powers (on Langton’s reading) are non-supervenient extrinsic properties, we retain the result that things in themselves do not affect us.

50. In other words, the “pure” concept of substance, or the “unschematized” category of substance, is the concept of a being in which other beings inhere, but itself inheres in nothing further. See A147/B186, A242/B300, Refl. 5295 (Ak. 18:145).

51. Langton quotes Kant’s marginal comments on Baumgarten: “A real subject is a substance. An accident can be a logical subject” (Ak. 18:67).

52. Langton does cite Kant’s claim at A525/B553 that matter is not “an absolute subject”. But Kant there contrasts being “an absolute subject” with being “a sensible abiding picture” which is “nothing but intuition”. Kant’s point appears to be the familiar one (constantly reiterated in the “Antinomies” section) that matter exists at least partly in virtue of being experienced and does not have an existence “grounded in itself” (A491–494/B519–52). This does not require him to assert that bodies are predicated of in things in themselves. Langton appears to concede this point (Langton 2011: 60) about A525/B553, but this is potentially more damaging to her case than she admits.

53. Kant does sometimes refer to things in themselves as the “substratum” of appearances, but he more often uses grounding and causal terminology.

54. Against the hypothesis of identity, one might point to the Kant’s explicit denial that “the supersensible substratum of matter is divided according to its monads in the same way as I divide matter itself” (On a discovery, Ak. 8:209n). But this only entails that the mereological structure of things in themselves does not mirror that of appearances (matter); it does not follow that there is no one-to-one correspondence between the latter and the former. Cf. Ameriks (1982: 10); Adams (1997:); and Van Cleve (1999: 149–156).

55. A whole that is not a part of any greater whole and whose parts stand in real connection.

56. This is one possible interpretation of Kant’s solution to the First Antinomy: the totality of objects in time and space (the empirical world) is not “given” as an object. See A497–507/B525–535.

57. Beiser (2002: 22) argues that the “one world or two?” debate is sterile. Allison (2004: 459 note 19) argues that his own “methodological” interpretation of Kant’s idealism is not committed to a the Identity view; I discuss this point below.

58. Allison (2004: 459, note 19); see also Allison 1987: 168. Other writers who have questioned the cogency of the “one object or multiple objects?” debate include Beiser, who calls the debate “sterile” (2002: 22), and Walker (2010), who thinks that the question of “how many worlds?” has no answer because it is based on the metaphor of a “world” of objects. Adams (1997) appears to accept that the question is meaningful, but argues that Kant must be agnostic on whether appearances in general are numerically identical to things in themselves.

59. Against the contentfulness of these identity claims, it might be argued that in his discussion of “Identity and difference” in the “Amphiboly” section, Kant distinguishes two principles of identity: the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, which is said to apply to noumena, and the principle of spatiotemporal individuation (two qualitatively identical things can be in different locations simultaneously), which applies to phenomena (A263–4/B319–20). Neither principle applies across categories; neither principle applies to putative identities between appearances and things in themselves. However, it is not clear whether these principles are supposed to supply the content of identity claims, or merely the conditions that warrant such claims. Thus, it is unclear whether this means that such identity claims are devoid of content or that we merely lack warrant for them.

60. That the “identity/non-identity” dispute is not really crucial to Langton’s interpretation is suggested by the very terms in which she formulates her view:

the labels “phenomena” and “noumena” seem to label different entities, but really they label different classes of properties of the same set of entities. (Langton 1998:13)

But assuming (as I think we must) that classes of properties are entities then “phenomena” and “noumena” are labels for different entities—namely, different classes of properties! Langton, of course, means that the difference between phenomena (appearances) and noumena (things in themselves) is not as sharp as it is on the phenomenalist view: phenomena are merely properties of noumena. Thus, while they are numerically distinct, there is not much metaphysical “room” between them. This is important, because, even though this is technically a non-identity or “two object” view, it has a much easier time with the traditional problems that afflict phenomenalist readings: how to square Humility about things in themselves with the assumption that they exist and are non-spatial? What really separates Langton from phenomenalist readings is not the question of whether phenomena and noumena are numerically identical but how much the traditional problems for phenomenalism apply to her view.

61. Notably, Adickes (1924). Some readers might balk at the inclusion of Adickes among the Identity readers; see, however, Adickes (1924: 20, 27). This point is also made by Robinson (1994: 416 note 22). Also, Westphal (1968).

62. Allison may also have in mind the idea that identity statements themselves can only be evaluated relative to a standpoint; it is unclear from his brief remarks whether this is his intent. Cf. Van Cleve (1999: 150) where he criticizes the idea that identity could be standpoint-relative in this way.

63. Adams (1997) argues for a related point: that there are no grounds that would warrant Kant in asserting either Identity or non-Identity in non-moral contexts, so he is not committed to either. Adams does not go as far as denying that the question makes sense in non-moral contexts.

64. For more on intellectual intuition in the Critique see Bxl, B145, B150, A 252/B 308–9, and A 256/B 311–12.A279/B335, B308 and Kant’s marginal notes in his own copy (E CXXX and CXXXI at A248; Ak. 23:36; E CXXXVII at A253, Ak. 23:49). The locus classicus for intellectual intuition and the closely notion of intuitive intellect [intuitiver Verstand] is the Critique of Judgment, §76–77 (Ak. 5:401–410). For critical commentary see Gram (1981), Westphal (2000), and Förster (2012: 140–143).

65. With one qualification: Berkeley, of course, does believe that God is “transcendentally external” (in Kant’s sense) but would deny, I take it, that God is an object for us, for we do not have an idea of God. We do have a notion of God, according to Berkeley, but Berkeley’s doctrine of non-sensory notions lies far outside the scope of this article.

66. I find it independently implausible that at 4:289 by “objects outside us” Kant means things in themselves. Kant often distinguishes between two forms of idealism: dogmatic idealism (which denies the existence of outer objects) and problematic idealism (which is agnostic about the existence of outer objects). Immediately after the definition of idealism at 4:289 Kant reminds us that we cannot know things in themselves. So if he mean “objects outside us” to refer to things in themselves, he would just have committed himself to problematic idealism, but Kant consistently argues that transcendental idealism is the only way to avoid problematic idealism. The issue of idealism, for Kant, is an issue about objects in space.

67. This point is, I think, missed by the discussion of B70–1 in Allison 2004: 25.

68. Beiser (2002: 98–99) anticipates this objection and replies, on Kant’s behalf, that even if Berkeley intended to establish the reality of objects in space, Kant could plausibly argue that he is committed to their being mere illusions. But Kant’s claim is that Berkeley’s idealism is the denial that objects exist in space. It is not germane for Kant to argue that Berkeley’s idealism entails, given Kantian premises about what constitutes the difference between truth and illusion, that objects are illusory.

69. In the second Critique Kant does identify Hume as a transcendental realist (Ak. 5:53); Beiser (2002), however, argues that this is because Kant knew Hume only from the first Enquiry and was thus unaware of the phenomenalist elements in the Treatise.

70. The only evidence Allison gives for this claim are some texts (quoted earlier) in which Kant calls transcendental realism the ‘common prejudice’ and a passage from his notes for the What real progress? essay in which Kant claims that all philosophy before the Critique was essentially the same (Ak. 20: 287, 377).

71. Cf. B71 and a long passage in the Pölitz lectures on theology (Ak. 28: 1053–4) where Kant expresses agnosticism about whether, after death, our separated souls might be able to cognize things in themselves.

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