Supplement to Kant's Transcendental Idealism

Allison on Transcendental Realism and Transcendental Idealism

Allison (2004) puts this “epistemic” interpretation in the context of a larger interpretation of transcendental idealism as a “meta-philosophical” position. Allison’s idea is that, since Kant seems to regard transcendental idealism and “transcendental realism” as not only exclusive but exhaustive philosophical options, he must mean something very general by transcendental realism. Consequently, Allison argues, transcendental realists include not only the obvious suspects (e.g., Wolff, Locke) but (more surprisingly) also Hume and Berkeley.[69] Transcendental realism, as Allison characterizes it, is not a discrete, statable thesis, but something more like what the later Wittgenstein would call a “picture” to which pre-Kantian philosophy was captive. Transcendental idealism, therefore, is not a discrete, statable thesis either, but consists in freeing us from this “picture”. Transcendental idealism is nothing less than a complete revolution in our conception of what knowledge and philosophy are, an “Umänderungder Denkart” as Kant describes it in the B Preface (Bxvi).

Allison characterizes the transcendental realist “picture” in at least three ways, and it is not obvious that they are equivalent. First, he characterizes transcendental realism as the very general thesis that (what Allison calls) the “epistemic conditions” of space and time exist “in themselves”. I think Allison means instead that transcendental realism is the implicit assumption that the question of whether space and time exist “in themselves” is a coherent one, because he regards “empirical idealism” as itself a form of transcendental realism, and Kant himself defines empirical idealism as the thesis that space and time are mere illusions. The idea, I take it, is that taking seriously the question do our sensible epistemic conditions (space and time) accurately represent how reality is in itself? involves the mistaken assumption that the notion of how reality “is in itself” independently of how we cognize it (i.e., independently of our epistemic conditions) is a coherent one. This is Allison’s second main characterization of transcendental realism: the assumption that there is a way reality is, independently of a perspective on it (Allison 2004: 48). In the main entry, it is noted that many of Allison’s reconstructions of particular Kantian doctrines and arguments presuppose this conception of transcendental idealism.

Thirdly, he characterizes transcendental realism as the implicit commitment to the “theocentric” paradigm of knowledge, the assumption that God knows how object really are in themselves, and that human knowledge is to evaluated by the extent to which it matches up to that standard (Allison 2004: 28). Even atheists can be in the grip of the “theocentric” model of knowledge, for they can still hold that human knowledge is knowledge to the extent that it reveals how objects are from the (in fact unoccupied) “God’s eye point of view”. Transcendental idealism supposedly replaces the “theocentric” paradigm with an “anthropocentric” paradigm of knowledge through recognizing (a) that we have epistemic conditions, (b) that they may not be the only possible or actual epistemic conditions, and (c) realizing that there is no sense to the question of whether “an sich” reality matches those epistemic conditions. On the transcendental idealist conception of knowledge, knowledge consists in objects satisfying our epistemic conditions; our beliefs about the world do not have to live up to some fictional standard “God’s eye point of view” to constitute knowledge.

However, all three characterizations of transcendental idealism face significant problems, both philosophical and historical. First of all, it is simply not true that, according to Kant, transcendental realism and transcendental idealism are exhaustive options (Allison 2004: 23).[70] He does famously claim that “it is really this transcendental realist who afterwards plays the empirical idealist” (A369) by which he means that, having concluded (correctly Kant thinks) that we could never infer from our inner states to the existence of transcendentally external objects in a way that would secure knowledge of those objects, the transcendental realist, who thinks that if there are objects in space and time then they transcendentally external, concludes that we know nothing of them (problematic idealism). But this means (at most) that transcendental realism entails (or naturally leads to) problematic empirical idealism; it does not entail that empirical idealism as such is a form of transcendental realism. Dogmatic idealists (like Berkeley, on Kant’s misreading of him) are transcendental realists in the attenuated sense that they think that if there were objects in space, they would be transcendentally external objects. But Kant by his own lights is a transcendental realist in this sense, for he thinks that things in themselves are transcendentally external (ausser) objects!

Secondly, if transcendental idealism is equivalent to the thesis that there is no standpoint independent perspective on reality, Allison owes us a reconstruction of Kant’s argument for that (incredibly strong) thesis. But Allison never gives this argument. The argument from the discursive nature of our intellects to the claim that objects, considered as they are in themselves (abstracting from the specifically spatiotemporal nature of our intuition), is not such an argument. Kant, after all, takes the Critique to establish the truth of transcendental idealism, not merely to assume it.

Finally, regarding the idea of a “theocentric” paradigm of knowledge, Kant himself repeatedly contrasts our discursive form of cognition with the intuitive intellect that God might possess; Kant holds that God would, but we do not, cognize things as they are in themselves.[71] This does not mean that knowledge for human beings consists in approximating this divine model, but it does entail that there is something to objects that we, as discursive minds, are missing and God is not. Perhaps, then, Allison’s point is that the theocentric model is the assumption that knowledge for human beings consists in approximating this divine model, that for us to know some content is to approximate to the relation that God stands in to that object. If so, he would be right that Kant does not have a theocentric model of knowledge, but then neither do Kant’s empiricist predecessors. Allison anticipates this objection by arguing that Locke is committed to a theocentric model of knowledge, but all that Allison demonstrates is that Locke (like Kant) thinks that there is a kind of knowledge of objects we lack and God has, something almost any theist has to accept. Locke’s own definition of knowledge for human beings, quoted by Allison, does not depend upon his conception of divine knowledge (Allison 2004: 31–32).

Copyright © 2016 by
Nicholas F. Stang <>

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