First published Tue Oct 3, 2006; substantive revision Mon Aug 6, 2018

Kūkai (774–835CE) is one of the intellectual giants of Japan, who ought not to be ignored in any account of the history of Japanese thought. Among the traditional Buddhist thinkers of Japan, and perhaps even of the whole of East Asia, he is one of the most systematic and philosophical. He is most famous for being the founder of Shingon esoteric Buddhism in Japan. But he is also remembered not only for his contributions as a teacher and scholar of religion, but for his accomplishments and innovations in social welfare, public education, lexicography, language, literature and poetry, literary theory, calligraphy, art, painting, wood-carving, sculpture, music, civil engineering, architecture, etc. during a period when Japan was undergoing rapid change. In this essay, we shall restrict our account to his philosophy.

1. Biography

Kūkai grew up during the Nara period (710–784CE) when the Nara Buddhist schools flourished and the country was centralized under the rule of the imperial family. And he was active during the beginning of the Heian period (794–1185CE) when institutionalized Nara Buddhism underwent reform due to the influence of newer ideas coming from China, including Kūkai’s own importations. He comes from an aristocratic family, the Saeki, and as a boy, he was educated by his maternal uncle, a Confucian scholar. At the age of seventeen or eighteen, he entered the state university at the then-capital Nagaoka but was soon disillusioned with its Confucian education. He suddenly dropped out of the university and retired into the natural setting of the mountains, where as legend has it, he devoted himself to various forms of esoteric practices. A few years later at the age of 24, he completed the final version of his first treatise, the Sangô shîki (Indications of the Goals of the Three Teachings) that covers and compares the teachings of Confucianism, Taoism, and Buddhism. Herein one can discern Kūkai’s reasons for turning from Confucianism to Buddhism. In the text, Kūkai relates how as a student he met a Buddhist priest who taught him an esoteric meditative practice called the Kokûzôgumonji no ho (“Âkâśagarbha’s method for seeking hearing and retaining”), which involved the recitation of a mantra a million times and was supposed to endow the practitioner with miraculous powers of memory and understanding.

What Kūkai found in Buddhism was a concrete path towards enlightenment (and liberation from suffering) that involves bodily practice and direct experience rather than mere theoretical speculation. Kūkai however did not involve himself in the official schools of the Nara Buddhist orthodoxy for they emphasized the exegetical study of the scriptures without providing any theoretical grounding for ritual practice. Instead he remained in the remote mountain regions of his native Shikoku as an unofficial and privately ordained mendicant. It appears that between the ages of 24 and 31, he wandered through its various mountains and sacred sites, practicing asceticism. Noticing the many different branches and sûtras (scriptures) of Buddhism, he hoped to find its unifying essence that would also bridge the gap between ritual and experience on the one hand and doctrine and theory on the other hand. It was during this search that he came across the mid-seventh century esoteric Buddhist text of the Dainichi-kyô (Skrt: Mahâvairocana Sûtra; Chn: Ta-ji Ching; “Great Sun scripture”). Intuiting that this text, with its dual emphasis upon esoteric practice and doctrine, would provide the kind of knowledge that he was seeking, Kūkai decided to travel to China to study it.

It was only in 804 at the age of 30 or 31 that Kūkai was thus officially ordained so that he could travel with an official government embassy to China. He travelled to Ch’ang-an, the great cosmopolitan capital of the T’ang (Tang) dynasty, where he resided for thirty months. During this period, he studied Indian Buddhism, Hindu teachings, and Sanskrit with two Indian monks. But more significantly he met Hui-kuo (Huiguo; Jpn: Keika) (746–805), the seventh patriarch of Chen-yen (Zhenyan; Jpn: Shingon; Skrt: Mantrayâna) Buddhism, from whom he received initiation into the two lineages of Chen-yen esoteric Buddhism, one centered around the Vajradhâtu (Diamond realm) mandala based on the Vajraśekhara Sûtra (“Adamantine {or Diamond} Pinnacle scripture”) and the other focussing upon the Garbha (Womb) mandala based on the Mahâvairocana Sûtra. Kūkai’s accomplishment during his stay in China is phenomenal in that not only did he manage to succeed Hui-kuo in becoming the eighth patriarch of esoteric Buddhism, he also managed to study Sanskrit, Chinese poetry and calligraphy, and various other minor arts.

Kūkai returned to Japan in 806 at the age of 33. He arrived in Kyushu with a voluminous amount of sûtras, collections of mandala paintings, treatises and commentaries, books of poetry, and ritual paraphernalia. In Kyushu, he composed the Shorai mokuroku (A Memorial Presenting a List of Newly Imported Sûtras and Other Items) that gives a brief account of his activities in China, describes what distinguishes esoteric Buddhism, and lists the items he had collected and brought back to Japan. However he was not permitted to enter the capital due to political unrest and was obliged to remain in Kyushu for another three years. Only with the retirement of Emperor Heizei (r. 806–809), did the new Emperor Saga order Kūkai in 809 to move to the new capital of Kyoto to reside at Takaosan-ji, the center of the Kyoto Buddhist world, where he remained until 823. Under the patronage of the new emperor, Kūkai became appointed over the years to various administrative positions of several important official temples. This allowed him to perform the first public esoteric ritual for “nation-protection,” followed by other public esoteric ceremonies, including mass initiation rituals and the founding of an annual ritual (the Mishuhô) to be held at court, hence gaining official recognition for the efficacy of esoteric Buddhism and preparing the rise of Buddhism as an ideological force in medieval Japan.

It was during his period at Takaosan-ji that he wrote some of his major treatises of philosophical interest to us, such as Benkenmitsu nikkyôron (Treatise on the Differences Between Esoteric and Exoteric Teachings) around 814, and the so-called Sanbu-sho (“Three Writings”) of Sokushinjôbutsugi (On the Meaning of “Attaining Buddhahood in this Very Embodied Existence”), Shôjijissôgi (On the Meanings of “Sound, Sign, and Reality”), and Unjigi (On the Meaning of the Syllable Hûm) in the 820s. And towards the end of his life he completed in 830 what has been considered to be his magnum opus, the Himitsu mandara jûjûshinron (Treatise on the Ten States of the Mind as a Secret Mandala) in ten volumes, and soon afterward, completed its summary version, the Hizô hôyaku (The Precious Key to the Secret Treasury) in three volumes.

In 816 Kūkai began building a monastic center in Mt. Kôya, and there he died in 835 at the age of 61. In 921, he posthumously received from Emperor Daigo and his court, the honorific title, Kôbô Daishi (“Great Teacher Who Spread the Dharma”).

2. Historical Background of Esoteric Buddhism

Kūkai called his form of Buddhism, Shingon, which means “the word of truth.” This is the Japanese pronunciation of the Chinese chen-yen (zhenyan) and the Sanskrit mantra. The form of Buddhism that he learned in China was an importation from India of Mantrayâna (Mantra vehicle {or: “school”}) Buddhism, more often known as Vajrayâna (Diamond {or: “Lightning Fast”} vehicle). The word mantra signifies a secret teaching inexpressible in ordinary words or linguistic formulations. This form of Buddhism, whose origin dates back to the mid-seventh century India, is more popularly known today in the West as “Tantric Buddhism,” especially in its Tibetan incarnation. It is characterized by its emphasis upon rituals, involving the use of mantras, mandalas, and other means in order to control both body and mind to experience the “ultimate.” Two major texts, associated with this form of Buddhism, made their way into China from India: Mahâvairocana Sûtra (Jpn: Dainichi-kyô) from the mid-seventh century and Vajraśekhara Sûtra (Jpn: Kongôchô-gyô) from the later-seventh century. Mantrayâna made its way east to China during the T’ang dynasty (713–765) around the beginning of the eighth century through the translating and propagating efforts of the Indian priests Śubhâkarasimha (Jpn: Zenmui; 637–735) who brought the Mahâvairocana Sûtra to China; Vajrabodhi (Jpn: Kongôchi; 671–741), the sixth patriarch of Mantrayâna, who brought the Vajraśekhara Sûtra to China; and Amoghavajra (Jpn: Fukû, an abbreviation for Fukûkongô; 705–74), Vajrabodhi’s disciple, who won the support of successive emperors during the T’ang period; and the Chinese priest, I-hsing (Yixing; Jpn: Ichigyô; 683–727) who learned the teachings of Mahâvairocana Sûtra from Śubhâkarasimha and the teachings of Vajraśekhara Sûtra from Varjabodhi. Kūkai’s own teacher Hui-kuo had also received initiation under both lineages of these two major sûtras, and is credited with gathering together their teachings into one system. In the meantime during the eighth century, another branch of Mantrayâna made it north from India to Tibet. But Chen-yen Buddhism in China did not survive the severe persecution of Buddhism in general in 845. Kūkai however had by then already succeeded in transmitting to Japan the esoteric doctrines he had studied in China. For much of the doctrines and practices, which he had imported, became influential amongst the official Nara monasteries. But his form of Buddhism was not just a product of his inheritance and appropriation of the Buddhism he encountered in China. As it involved developments and contributions uniquely his own, we may regard him not only as the transmitter but as the founder of the Japanized version of Mantrayâna known as Shingon.

3. Thought

Kūkai has been regarded as the first comprehensively philosophical thinker in Japanese intellectual history. The influence of Mahâyâna philosophy is noticeable but they are interpreted through the lens of Mantrayâna with its emphasis upon the inseparability of ritual practice from theoretical doctrine. Traditionally, his thought has been divided into the following aspects: 1) the theoretical (kyôsô) which explicates the uniqueness and distinction of esoteric Buddhism (mikkyô) as opposed to exoteric Buddhism (kengyô) and demonstrates its validity and efficaciousness; and 2) the practical (jisô), which prescribes his method of meditation and ritual. Ultimately however the theoretical and the practical are inseparable in Kūkai’s thought. Within the deep profundity and subtleties of his doctrine, one recognizes philosophical elements inherited from Madhyamaka, Yogâcâra, T’ien-t’ai (Tiantai), and Huayen (Huayan) Buddhist thought. But with these are incorporated the elements of devotional piety and magico-esoteric practice even in his theoretical writings. What is especially pronounced and distinct in his thought is the significance of bodily experience and practice. Buddhist truths for Kūkai were not simply meant to be intellectually mused over but to be experienced through bodily practice. One might say then that for Kūkai it is the body that provides the medium whereby theory and practice, doctrine and ritual, thought and experience, are non-dualistic.

A major contribution made by Kūkai for the orthodoxy of Nara Buddhism with his systematization of esoteric doctrines, was to bridge the gap between textual study and ritual practice. Kūkai’s works provided for the first time a theoretical grounding for the incantation of mantras and dhâranīs and other esoteric practices already present in Nara Buddhism. It did this by explicating their relationship to the doctrines expressed in the scriptural texts. While esoteric elements were already present in Nara Buddhism, their very raison d’etre, other than as forms of magic, and their very connection to Buddhist doctrines had been left in the dark. Kūkai’s success may be attributable to his ability to provide a sound and intelligible systematic exposition of the meanings of the esoteric elements of Buddhism and of the interrelationships between text, ritual, and icon. In doing so it succeeded in bridging the gap between esoteric rituals and scriptural doctrines. (Abe 1999, 11) Kūkai had to work out such an exposition in order to establish and legitimize the independence and role of his Shingon Buddhism vis-à-vis the other forms of Buddhism already existent in Nara Japan.

3.1 Works

Of Kūkai’s so-called theoretical works, the philosophically most significant are Benkenmitsu nikkyôron, Himitsu mandara jûjûshinron, Hizô hôyaku, Sokushinjôbutsugi, Shôjijissôgi, and Unjigi. The former three provide comparative analyses exploring what distinguishes Shingon esoteric Buddhism from other forms of religious thought and practice, including the exoteric forms of Buddhism. The latter three are expositions of the Shingon worldview and its concepts, and are grouped together to comprise the so-called Sanbu-sho (“Three Writings”). Benkenmitsu nikkyôron (2 vols.) written in 814/815 sets forth the differences between esoteric and exoteric Buddhism to emphasize the superiority of the former. Starting from this foundation (i.e. of the distinction and superiority of the esoteric standpoint), Kūkai composed the Sanbu-sho, in rapid succession from around 821 to 824. These “Three Writings” provide expositions of what commentators have called the “metaphysics” of Shingon, dealing in detail with the three so-called mysterious aspects of the cosmic truth (Dharma): its “body, speech, and mind.” Sokushinjôbutsugi explicates the concept of sokushinjôbutsu or enlightenment in one’s immediate embodied existence. Shôjijissôgi and Unjigi are unique works of a “metaphysical linguistics.” They examine the interrelationship (which is ultimately non-dualistic) between the phenomenal world, its sounds (or “voices”) as “signs” (or “letters”), and reality itself, the “meaning,” they convey. In doing so, those two works explicate the Shingon concept of hosshin seppô, the Buddha’s preaching of the Dharma via cosmic phenomena. In fact all three of these “Three Writings” deal with the embodied realization of the Dharma. But they do this from the different angles of the microcosm of the human body and the macrocosm of the cosmic body. Embodiment then plays an important role in Kūkai’s Buddhism. As we shall see below, the embodiment of the Dharma as such also involves the incorporation of the mantra and the mandala along with other esoteric features. The work that represents the culmination of Kūkai’s thought, completed at the age of 57 in 830, is his Jûjûshinron (10 vols.) along with its abridged version, Hizô hôyaku (3 vols.). These two works position Shingon esotericism as the culmination of all Buddhist and religious standpoints. They make the grand claim that Shingon provides the most comprehensive view to truth, the Dharma. All other religious views on the other hand are mere approximations of that truth in various degrees and from various perspectives. Each religious standpoint then corresponds to a specific level of development of the human mind, which in ten states leads up to the enlightened mind. The final culminating stage of enlightenment then is what corresponds to Shingon doctrine as the most comprehensive, and hence “most true.” Nevertheless, the pre-Shingon and exoteric teachings each have their rightful place within this scheme so that they are not utterly discounted. In addition to the above-mentioned six major works, there is also Kūkai’s first work — written prior to his trip to China —, the Sangôshîki. This was his first look at Buddhism in comparison with Taoism and Confucianism. In the following however, I shall focus on Kūkai’s thought in the six major works. These are his mature works, and also universally recognized as his most important theoretical works.

3.2 Esoteric (Mikkyô) vs. Exoteric (Kengyô)

In Benkenmitsu nikkyôron, Kūkai sets out to establish the basic differences between the brand of Buddhism he was introducing to Japan, which he regarded as “esoteric teachings” (mikkyô; “secret teaching”) on the one hand, and the forms of Buddhism already officially recognized and practiced in Japan, which he classified as “exoteric teachings” (kengyô; “revealed teaching,” “public teaching”). This distinction between “esoteric” (mitsu) and “exoteric” (ken) Buddhism is not found in his Indian predecessors. But some of his Japanese predecessors had already been using the binary ken-mitsu categories. Kūkai’s contribution was to interpret them in a new way through appropriation of the esoteric texts he had brought back from China. In Kūkai’s thinking, that distinction is crucial. While we shall discuss some of these ideas in the following sections with greater depth, we may here summarize the general distinctions laid out in Benkenmitsu nikkyôron for now as follows: 1) For exoteric Buddhism, the “embodiment of truth” (Skrt: dharmakâya; Jpn: hosshin) is abstract and transcendent and hence does not preach. But for esoteric Buddhism, the phenomenal world from the enlightened perspective — that is, the standpoint of the Buddha — is the preaching activity of the cosmic Buddha Dainichi (Skrt: Mahâvairocana) and as that “embodiment of truth.” Hence while exoteric teachings may be traced to Śakyamuni, the historical Buddha, esoteric teachings come directly from the Buddha Dainichi. 2) For exoteric Buddhism, the absolute truth, i.e., the Dharma, transcends world and language, and thus cannot be explained. But for esoteric Buddhism, that Dharma itself is being perpetually expressed in and as its embodiment in the phenomenal world, in its sounds, movements, and forms, and even in the thoughts of sentient beings. In other words, its embodiment refers not only to the meditation of the Buddha but also to the Buddha’s creative and communicative activities. 3) Exoteric Buddhism lacks, according to Kūkai, a practical methodology for experiencing esoteric truths. While exoteric Buddhism emphasizes the intellectual study and comprehension of the doctrines set forth in the sûtras, esoteric Buddhism provides a bodily hermeneutic whereby esoteric truths hidden in the sûtras as well as in the world at large can be experienced. And: 4) For exoteric Buddhism, it takes three infinitely long epochs of repeated rebirths of training in order for one to attain enlightenment (Buddhahood); but esoteric Buddhism makes it possible for anyone, irrespective of karmic dispositions, to immediately become a buddha in one’s present embodied state.

3.3 The Esoteric View of the Buddha: The Four Embodiments of Truth (the Dharma)

In order to understand the above-mentioned distinctions made by Kūkai, we need to comprehend what exactly the Buddha signifies for Kūkai. This is also important as his esoteric view of the Buddha underlies all of the major points of his philosophy that we shall be discussing further below.

In traditional Mahâyâna Buddhist theory, the Buddha is conceived in terms of three modes or forms of embodiments (trikâya): dharmakâya (Jpn: hosshin), nirmanakâya, and sambhogakâya. While originally the term buddha, meaning “enlightened one,” was reserved for Śakyamuni, the historical founder of Buddhism, it eventually came to designate the ideal for humanity. This ideal became equated with the “truth” (Skrt: Dharma; Jpn: ), taught by the Buddha, of the nature of being. To be a “buddha” is then to be enlightened to that truth, which came to also mean the realization of one’s non-duality with the Dharma. It is in this significance that one way of understanding the Buddha is in terms of the universal “embodiment of the Dharma” (Skrt: dharmakâya; Jpn: hosshin). For traditional Mahâyâna, this hosshin is an abstract principle and hence impersonal and non-preaching. However as implied in the foregoing section, for Kūkai the hosshin is identified with the Buddha Dainichi. That is, in one aspect the hosshin may be understood to be a personal being who preaches the Dharma by concretizing it in the cosmos as his own body. (Of course though to avoid anthropomorphism, the hosshin cannot be reduced to this aspect.) In the traditional three-body doctrine, however, it is the other two forms of embodiment that preach. The Buddha, when regarded as embodying the Dharma in an historical earthly being, such as Śakyamuni, who preaches the Dharma to humans, is called the nirmanakâya (“embodiment of transformation”). And the Buddha as enjoying his fruits of enlightenment by residing in a celestial buddha-realm, while unfolding further truths for advanced bodhisattva beings and acting as a savior to the earthly, is called the sambhogakâya (“embodiment of bliss”). An example of would be Amida residing in his “Pure Land.”

What distinguishes Kūkai’s understanding of the Buddha is that he takes the notion of the “embodiment of the Dharma” literally and radically. Hosshin in Shingon thought is not an abstract truth transcending the mundane world. Rather all phenomena and thing-events of this cosmos, in their very transience, are each themselves embodiments of truth and the cosmos as a whole comprised of these impermanent and interdependent beings is eternally an embodiment of truth, the hosshin. Moreover this concrete cosmic identification between Buddha, truth, and the cosmos of thing-events, was “personal.” That is, hosshin was equated with the Buddha Dainichi. The cosmos as the manifestation of truth, the Dharma, was itself hence equated with the body of the personal Buddha Dainichi. And in turn, Dainichi with his cosmic body is then the embodied personification of the universal Buddha-nature inherent in all beings and the Dharma that is manifest everywhere. Prior to Hui-kuo, this identification of Dainichi with the hosshin in Mantrayâna Buddhism was ambiguous and not thorough. In the Dainichi-kyô, a sun metaphor is used to name its central Buddha, “Dainichi” (Mahâvairocana, transliterated as Makabirushana), meaning “Great Sun,” as the being whose light illuminates and enlightens all beings in a way akin to the sun’s life-giving light. All other deities are seen as manifestations of this light. Dainichi’s identification with the hosshin nevertheless remains ambiguous. While he probably influenced Kūkai in regards to this equation, Hui-kuo himself however left no written explications. Kūkai thus has been regarded as the first to provide a complete and systematic exposition of the nature of the Buddha Dainichi as the hosshin. The sun metaphor of illumination — as the source of both being and of knowledge (enlightenment) — befits the universality of the hosshin perfectly. The illumination of the “Great Sun” (Dainichi) becomes accordingly understood to mean the omnipresencing of the Dharma throughout the cosmos, an omnipresencing in turn equated with the Buddha’s preaching. This “proof” that the hosshin does in fact preach helped Kūkai in distinguishing his esoteric doctrines from those of exoteric Buddhism.

This identification between Dainichi and hosshin held many implications for Kūkai, which became worked out in his various doctrines. For example, the equation of Dainichi’s body-and-mind with the cosmos itself also means the immanent presence of the Buddha within, and as, the body-and-mind of each and every one of us. And so Dainichi’s “enlightened mind” (bodhicitta) becomes synonymous with the Mahâyâna doctrine of “original enlightenment” (hongaku) within all beings. But as the Dharma signifies the interdependent origination, hence, emptiness () of all beings, its embodiment may be said to be an “empty body.” We will examine these ideas in greater detail later.

Kūkai’s Shingon Buddhism postulated four forms of embodiment as the hosshin itself. This notion of the four forms of the hosshin (shishu hosshin) roughly corresponds to, while reworking, the Mahâyâna trikâya doctrine. 1) First there is the hosshin in its absolute sense, called jishô hosshin. This is the embodiment of the Dharma as Dainichi eternally remaining in the state of samadhi but also engaging in a monologue, which reveals its “self-nature” and unfolds the Dharma through its omni-presencing manifestations in the cosmos. 2) Secondly there is the juyû hosshin, which is the hosshin enjoying bliss. But this is characterized in its two aspects: A) “the self-oriented embodiment” (jijuyûshin) describing the hosshin as enjoying its own state of samadhic bliss; and B) “the other-oriented embodiment” (tajuyûshin) describing the hosshin in the form of various celestial buddhas directing the blissful fruits of self-enlightenment for the benefit of others. 3) Thirdly there is the hosshin in its historical and earthly transformation, called henge hosshin as manifest in the enlightened personage of Śakyamuni. This historical Buddha guides ordinary, ignorant, and irreligious people towards the Dharma, but for this sake must improvise skillful (or: expedient) means (Skrt: upâya; Jpn: hôben) appropriate to the time, place, and comprehension of a given audience. 4) And fourthly there is the hosshin in its universal emanation, called tôru hosshin. This is its manifestation in all sorts of bodily forms appropriate to the situation in order to expound the Dharma, often appearing in the same form as the listener in order to share in his suffering. This conception also became generalized by Kūkai to include all phenomenal thing-events — together with their respective environments or “realms” — as “bodies” filling up the entire cosmos. As such every phenomenon plays the role of a “buddha,” teaching some aspect of the Dharma and expressing the Buddha’s enlightened wisdom and compassion, to realize the original enlightenment of all. Interestingly this implies that each one of us are already buddhas expounding some aspect of the Dharma to one another, but which we must then become aware of in order to realize our own Buddhahood.

It is interesting to note that the celestial buddhas and the historical buddha (Śakyamuni) are here included as themselves forms of the hosshin, when in the traditional trikâya doctrine of Mahâyâna, they were distinguished from the hosshin, which in turn was seen as abstract and impersonal. Furthermore, according to this doctrine of the four forms of the hosshin, it is not only the celestial buddhas in the heavens and the historical buddha on earth who preach, but all four forms. From Kūkai’s esoteric standpoint, the hosshin even in its samadhic self-enjoyment is preaching the Dharma in its cosmic monologue — for its very embodiment is the cosmos itself so that its samadhic experiencing of the Dharma permeates everywhere and everywhen. Simply put, Dainichi as the hosshin and as the personification of the Dharma concretely embodied in the cosmos, is directly preaching the Dharma to the world via his omni-presencing being. And while in the broader sense the hosshin is thus preaching via the cosmos, in the narrower sense its preaching is manifest in the teachings of esoteric Buddhism itself. On the other hand the doctrines of what Kūkai classified as exoteric are traced to either what the historical buddha, Śakyamuni, preached or what the celestial buddhas are preaching in the heavenly dimensions. Insofar as they themselves are embodiments of the hosshin, what they preach are indirectly teachings of the hosshin. But their teachings are provisional, relative only to the comprehension of their audience and the circumstance of time and place wherein they are preached. Kūkai claims, however, that through training in Shingon esotericism, one can receive the teachings of the hosshin directly — that is, receive the timeless and absolute, cosmic and holistic, truth of the Dharma in its very embodiment. This was a radical and heterodox claim at the time since the teaching common to all orthodox Buddhist schools was that the sûtras can all be traced back to the preachings of Śakyamuni and this lineage is what legitimated their use of the sûtras. But for Kūkai, the historical Buddha was but one manifestation of the cosmic Buddha, Dainichi, who embodies the truth (Dharma, ) it preaches as the hosshin.

3.4 The Three Aspects of the Embodiment of Truth (Hosshin; Dharmakâya)

In addition to its four forms of embodiment, Kūkai (in his Sokushinjôbutsugi chs. 3, 4, 5) systematically elucidates three aspects as belonging to the hosshin in its cosmic significance: the six universal elements (rokudai) as comprising its own body or somaticity (hontai), the four mandalas (shimandara) as constituting its “marks” or forms of appearance (yôsô), and the three mysteries (sanmitsu) constituting its functions (sayô). In all three aspects, there is involved an interrelationship of non-duality between its macro-cosmic significance and its micro-cosmic significance, that is, between the hosshin qua cosmos as a whole and the practitioner as a being forming a part of, and partaking in, the cosmos. The three aspects interpenetrate to make-up the macrocosmos while in their non-duality with cosmic constituents, they become manifest through successful Shingon practice and in one’s consequent enlightenment.

Kūkai’s elucidation of these three aspects provide both a theoretical and a practical grounding for his own conception of sokushinjôbutsu or “becoming Buddha in this very embodied existence,” by clarifying both its possibility and its method. Japanese commentators have often classified his thought along the following lines: the theory of the six universal elements as providing a metaphysic, the theory of the four mandalas as providing an epistemology, and the theory of the three mysteries as providing a metapraxis. But one must also keep in mind that all three concerns — metaphysical, epistemological, and practical — are intertwined and inseparable in Kūkai’s thinking. Furthermore all three involve the significance of the body so that even in his so-called “epistemology,” embodiment cannot be ignored.

In the immediately following subsections I will briefly discuss each of these aspects before providing a more detailed exposition of them in the following sections.

3.4.1 Somaticity (the six universal elements)

Hosshin in its somaticity is identified with the cosmos as an organic whole wherein thing-events come and go via interdependent origination. The cosmos as such is called hokkai (Skrt: dharmadhâtu; world/realm of the Dharma), and in turn as the hosshin, it is the body or soma (tai) of the Buddha Dainichi. (However it should not be understood as substantial in the western philosophical sense because it is “empty” — more on “emptiness” below.) Hence Kūkai in Shôjijissôgi cites lines from the Avatamsaka Sûtra that “all lands are in the body of the Buddha,” or that “each hair [of the Buddha] contains myriad lands as vast as oceans…” And yet simultaneously the truth, the Dharma, embodied in the entire cosmos is manifest within each of its micro-cosmic parts. This view that the whole permeates its parts — reminding us perhaps of the more recent theories of holonics or the holographic model of the universe — allows Kūkai to show that the hosshin does indeed preach the Dharma throughout the cosmos in its every single aspect.

This great cosmic body of the hosshin embraces all phenomena through the mutual “non-obstruction” of the six universal elements (rokudai muge). (Mutual “non-obstruction” or muge here must be understood to mean what allows for their interrelations and interpenetrations that constitute things. In being non-substantial, they do not obstruct each other. And “universal” or dai here must be understood in its literal sense as “great,” meaning that it does not exclude any phenomena or thing-event in the cosmos at all.) As the cosmos, the hosshin is made up of the six “great” elements (fire, earth, water, air, space, consciousness) which interrelate to constitute thing-events in their interdependent origination. Their interaction thus constitutes the somaticity of an ever-evolving whole. But as dependent origination equals emptiness (Skrt: śûnyatâ; Jpn: ) in Buddhism, this cosmic body is an embodiment of the Dharma qua emptiness. Moreover emptiness also signifies “space,” for the same graph () is used to mean “emptiness” and “space.” Hence the cosmic body in its endless vastness, as space embracing everything, can be seen as providing the space for the emergence of thing-events through the intermingling of the six elements. Thus Dainichi’s body as the cosmic embodiment of the Dharma pervades all beings to make up, through the six elements, each of their own bodies. And yet from another perspective, as the cosmic body is a vast emptiness that makes room for the emergence of beings, each of these beings are in turn empty. For being and emptiness in the Buddhist understanding are two intertwining aspects of the same truth. (We shall discuss the more precise sense of “emptiness” in the following sections.) So the hosshin in its somaticity designates the ontological ground of all beings but also designates their underlying de-ontologizing (or: me-ontologizing; or even better: anontological) emptiness, their non-substantiality.

3.4.2 Form of appearance (the four mandalas)

The hosshin in its cosmic significance appears in the form or figure () of a mandara (Skrt: mandala). That is, its cosmic body appears in a mandalic pattern, as represented in the mandalas used in Shingon ritual. Correspondingly the mind of a sentient being is also supposed to take on the form of a mandala especially as he advances in practice to realize non-duality with the mandalic hosshin. That is, the mind-and-body experience of each sentient being mirrors in its own way the mandalic pattern of the cosmos. As one becomes enlightened, one comes to realize this inter-mirroring. In the envisioning of reality as a mandala, the practitioner, who on the one hand is aiming for Buddhahood, is at the same time also the Buddha existing in the mandalic reality and expressing itself in mandalic form. Whether seen as the form experienced in the mind or as the form of the cosmos, the mandalic figure is the Buddha’s mode of expressing the Dharma. This mandalic appearance of the Buddha is categorized into four types, which we will discuss in a section below.

3.4.3 Function (the three mysteries)

The function of the hosshin is equated with all movements and change that occur in the cosmos. Such cosmic alterations are categorized in three ways in terms of visible form (e.g., loco-motion or change of place, and trans-formation or change in shape), the audible (sound), and the mental (the thinking process). Visible alterations are movements of Dainichi’s body (shin), audible alterations are movements of Dainichi’s speech (ku), and mental alterations are movements of Dainichi’s thoughts (i). Together they are called the “three mysteries” (Skrt: tri-guyha; Chn: san-mi; Jpn: sanmitsu) making up the functions () of the hosshin. Since the body of Dainichi is the cosmos itself, these “three mysteries” of its functions are at work in all thing-events and are ultimately non-dualistic with the corresponding movements of ourselves.

3.5 The Interpenetration of the Six Elements: The Embodiment of Emptiness as an Empty Body

Kūkai (e.g. in his Sokushinjôbutsugi, ch.3) discusses Dainichi as a “body of the six great elements” (rokudaishin, rokudai-taidai), which are the five universal material elements (godai) of earth, water, fire, wind/air, and space, representing the “known,” plus the universal mental element (shindai) of consciousness, representing the “knower.” Ultimately the five material elements make up the body of Dainichi and the sixth element designates the mind of Dainichi. Their dynamic but harmonious interplay constitute the “timeless yoga” or samadhi (Jpn: ) of Dainichi’s body-and-mind. But since Dainichi is equated with the cosmos, all things comprising the whole world are generated and perish through the interplay — “non-obstruction” and “interfusion” — of these elemental constituents. Kūkai then is definitely not an idealist taken in its western philosophical significance, and Shingon thought in this aspect is distinct from the teachings of the “mind-only” (Yuishiki; Skrt: Vijñapti-mâtratâ) school of Buddhism. For the mental and the material, for Kūkai, are two non-dualistic (interpenetrating and mutually non-obstructing) aspects of the same Dharma — as depicted in the two mandalic embodiments, which we shall discuss below. In other words Kūkai does not reduce reality to either mind or matter; his perspective is neither merely idealist nor merely materialist.

The interrelationship amongst the elements signifies their non-substantiality, i.e. the fact that they are not ontologically independent, and in Buddhist parlance this means “emptiness” (śûnyatâ, ). Hence all elements and things they constitute, including the entire cosmos is empty. Dainichi’s body, as the hosshin that embodies the Dharma, is an embodiment of emptiness, analogically understood as a vast empty space — it is in part analogical but also exemplary of emptiness. Rather than obstructing the emergence of things, this emptiness permits it through their interdependent origination, which is the meaning of emptiness. Their materiality is then just as real as their emptiness, and emptiness and matter are non-dualistic. True to the “middle way” of Buddhism, Kūkai treads a path that avoids reifying substantialism on the one hand as well as utter nihilism on the other hand. And in the non-dualistic interrelationships between body and mind, matter and emptiness, known and knower, the Dharma itself, as the truth of non-duality in interdependent origination qua emptiness is revealed in every physical and mental process of the cosmos as the embodiment of the Dharma.

The “horizontal” interpenetration between the elements, i.e., the interdependence and mutual non-obstruction amongst the immanent phenomena of the cosmos, also translates into the “vertical” interpenetration between the whole and its parts, that is, between Dainichi as embodied in the cosmos and all thing-events within. The implications of such cosmic non-duality for the practitioner is immensely significant. In non-duality with the cosmic Buddha, one’s unenlightened self in both mind-and-body is thus an expression of the hosshin, an embodiment of the Dharma. That is, as one’s mental states express the samadhi of Dainichi, so also one’s body along with the bodies of all living and non-living things, in every bodily movement, manifests Dainichi’s body and its movements. Dainichi is preaching the Dharma through all phenomena of the cosmos. But as we ourselves are the bodies through which Dainichi preaches, we are enabled to realize the cosmic samadhi that our bodies-and-minds express. This points to the non-dualistic significance between the two exemplary concepts of Shingon Buddhism: hosshin seppô and sokushinjôbutsu, both of which we shall examine in detail in the following sections.

3.6 Hosshin Seppô: The Buddha’s Cosmic Preaching of the Dharma

As the hosshin, the Buddha Dainichi preaches the Dharma via his omnipresencing, that is, through every sensible media of the cosmos. Kūkai called this, hosshin seppô (literally: “the dharmakâya’s expounding of the Dharma”), and used its concept (e.g. in his Benkenmitsu nikkyôron) as an important criterion for distinguishing esoteric Buddhism from exoteric Buddhism. In his work Shôjijissôgi, this concept of hosshin seppô serves as the starting point. The seppô (“preaching,” “expounding”) therein is equated with the phenomena of the cosmos as comprising shôjijissô, that is, sound, sign, reality, and their meanings. (We will discuss the linguistic or semiological significance of this idea in the following section.) The point is that every thing and every event in the universe, as objects of our six senses, are the Buddha’s preaching of the Dharma. Each phenomenon manifest serves to explain (setsu) the truth, the Dharma. The hosshin in its omnipresencing throughout the cosmos, permeating every aspect of it, is perpetually informing all things of the Dharma. This cosmic omnipresencing of the Dharma via hosshin seppô entails a dynamism of continuous activity that accounts for the movements within the universe — both physical and mental.

Since everything to which Dainichi preaches, is itself his manifestation as an embodied part of the cosmos, the sermon is ultimately a monologue. The expounding of the Dharma is in one sense then really the Buddha’s monologic expression of his own self-enjoyment in samadhic bliss. And yet simultaneously it expresses Dainichi’s compassion for the unawakened (though ultimately they are non-dualistic with the Buddha) so that they may also enjoy the fruits of the Dharma. Through the help of Dainichi’s compassionate con-descension or kaji (more on this in a later section), the practitioner is enabled to inter-resonate with the sermon of the cosmos.

The idea of hosshin seppô also expresses a universalization in Shingon of the Mahâyâna Buddhist notion of expedient (or: skillful) means. The Shingon doctrine of hôben kukyô (“ultimacy of expedient means”) means that any phenomenon or thing-event of the cosmos can serve as a means to enlightenment, entailing a gradation of understanding, hinging on how the event speaks to the person relative to the time, place, and situational context. This also corresponds to the levels of mental states discussed in Kūkai’s Jûjûshinron (which we will examine in a further section below). The key to immediate and complete enlightenment however is to understand the comprehensive (or holistic) sense of the truth being spoken by the cosmos as a whole even if through the medium of a particular thing-event.

Kūkai’s claim was that only through the Buddhism of esoteric teachings can one attain to an experiential recognition of hosshin seppô, i.e. that the cosmos itself is describing the immediate enlightened body-and-mind state of the Buddha. By contrast exoteric truths preached by other forms of Buddhism are meant for a specific audience in a specific place and time, and hence are conditional, relative, and provisional. Moreover exoteric truths are limited by human language, which is inadequate to describe the state of enlightenment and the absoluteness of the Dharma. The esoteric truth revealed in hosshin seppô on the other hand unfolds through a non-human language, that is, a cosmic and esoteric language originating in the hosshin itself. This is the language of the mantra or in Japanese, shingon, literally meaning “the word of truth,” and from which Kūkai’s brand of Buddhism derives its name. Mantra (shingon) is the language of the cosmos involving all mental and physical-sensible phenomena. The esoteric truths expressed in this mantric language of the Buddha/cosmos reveal themselves only in accordance with the reader’s capacity to attune himself to, and read, this cosmic (con)text of the mantric universe.

3.7 Mantra: Cosmic Sound and (Con)Text

The idea of the mantra, inherited from Indian Mantrayâna, occupies a significant position in Kūkai’s philosophy, which he elucidates in each of his Sanbu-sho and systematically and most comprehensively in his Shôjijissôgi. Mantras denote the reality of all dharmas (shohô) — the elemental constituents of reality — as themselves signifying the Dharma preached by the hosshin. (In Buddhism, the term dharma () has many meanings, among which are the significances of truth itself and the elemental constituents of reality. When speaking of truth in its absolute sense as preached by Dainichi or as embodied in the dharmakâya (hosshin), I have been capitalizing Dharma, and when speaking of the elements that constitute reality, I leave dharma uncapitalized.) It represents the primordial speech of the Buddha Dainichi uttering and expositing the Dharma, taken in both its restricted human significance and its broader cosmic significance. That is, Dainichi’s sermon as a mantra in the broad sense means all phenomena in general as vibrations emanating from Dainichi’s eternal samadhi through the interplay of the elements via the three media of body, speech, and mind. All objects of the six senses as based upon those three media of visible and tangible forms, audible sounds, and thoughts, embody mantras as syllables uttered by Dainichi. And in its narrower sense the mantra takes the abbreviated verbal form of syllables written in the esoteric sûtras and uttered in esoteric ritual practice by the practitioner. That is, the mantras uttered by practitioners in ritual practice are to be taken as focused condensations of those cosmic vibrations in a particular sound. They are condensed manifestations of the content of Dainichi’s sermon, namely the truth of enlightenment, the Dharma.

3.7.1 Shôjijissô: sound, sign, reality

In the broader sense of mantra, the whole cosmos is a language or text that must be “read” if one is to receive its meaning (the Dharma). Kūkai expresses this in the term shôjijissô. Shôji means “sound-and-sign.” Shô (or: ), meaning “sound,” is the breath of Dainichi, the vibrations of the five material elements in their mutually non-obstructively colliding interplay that resonate sounds through the air. In the narrower sense, this would be the mantras voiced in ritual. Ji, meaning “sign,” “word,” “letter,” or “character/graph,” is sound in its signifying character as naming or meaning something. As letter, it also provides a material base whereby the sign’s distinction from other signs becomes retained and fixed. For what makes something a sign signifying a specific meaning rather than another is difference (shabetsu). Anything that manifests its distinction from others in virtue of its pattern (mon) — the various combinations of shape, color, and movement among visual objects — then, for Kūkai, is a sign or letter (ji). Marking distinct patterns (mon), such things are “characters” (monji; “pattern-letter”). In the broadest and cosmic sense then, all phenomena of the six senses (i.e., the five physical senses plus the thinking mind) as constituted by the inter-vibrations of the five material elements and via their mutual distinctions (shabetsu), serve as letters of the cosmic (con)text, ultimately signifying the Dharma but in its different aspects. In its narrower significance, however, ji would be the written Sanskrit letters as saturated with that esoteric meaning of the Dharma. Jissô, meaning “reality,” is that which is named, intended, meant, as evoked by sho becoming ji. The ultimate referent or meaning of the world as text is the Dharma in the spontaneous playing of its embodiment, the hosshin. In turn the process of articulation of the Dharma by the hosshin generates everything in the cosmos, including the myriad beings, their various realms, and its various forms of embodiment such as the celestial buddhas and the historical human buddha. It also generates human languages in general which are thus seen as manifestations of this cosmic articulation. The cosmos as such is a text articulating the Dharma within the empty space of the vast limitless and formless body of the hosshin. The cosmos as mantra is hence hosshin seppô.

From the mantric articulation of the Dharma emerge ten realms and their respective languages (of hell dwellers, hungry ghosts, animals, asuras, humans, celestial heaven dwellers, śrâvakas, pratyeka-buddhas, bodhisattvas, and buddhas). Each realm as an articulation of the Dharma, has its own “sounds-and-signs,” i.e., its own language, in accordance with a specific perspective corresponding to the degree of enlightenment and illusion of its inhabitants. But only the language of the highest, the most comprehensive realm, i.e., the realm of the Buddha, is identified with the “true word” (shingon, mantra), designating the Dharma as it is. The nine other languages are by contrast “illusory words” (môgo). And yet they nevertheless do express the Dharma, each from its own relative and limited perspective. In this restricted sense, they are all mantras as well. For they take part in the cosmic text of the hosshin written in the same inter-referential interrelationships obtaining in all thing-events via the interplay of the same universal elements. The difference is that while the other languages are not conscious of their source, the most comprehensive language, the “sounds-and-signs” of the Buddha-realm, entails self-awareness of its mysterious origin.

3.7.2. The cosmic text of the Dainichi-kyô

The text of the Dainichi-kyô itself is taken by Kūkai to be a condensation in scriptural form of that cosmic text of the mantra, comprising of the most comprehensive language of the Buddha-realm. And that same mantric text is then further condensed into each syllabic-root letter of the Sanskrit alphabet itself, which thus serves as a means for meditation. In Kūkai’s scheme (set out in his Dainichikyô kaidai), the true original text of the Dainichi-kyô is the eternal Dharma itself as the cosmic (con)text or mantra and cosmic mandala, existing permanently and comprising the universe and all phenomena. Within the world, an abridged translation appeared that supposedly consisted of 20,000 volumes and was circulated in India but became lost. The version Kūkai brought back from China is a much smaller one, but his claim is that every word, character, stroke or dot, within it in its mantric nature encompasses countless meanings and truths. Thus while the most abbreviated text is implaced within the original cosmic text, the entire content of the cosmic text is itself encapsulated within the characters of its abridgment representing a condensation. This “inter-textuality” exemplifies the Hua-yen (Huayan; Jpn: Kegon) sense of interpenetration whereby the entire whole is contained within each part, but here this Hua-yen idea is translated in mantric terms. This same scheme used in explaining the Dainichi-kyô was used by Kūkai to explain the relationship of the Kongôchôgyô and other esoteric texts to the world as well.

3.7.3 Non-origination (honpushô), emptiness (), and difference (shabetsu)

What exactly is the Dharma, the truth that all languages and all texts point to as their mysterious source? Kūkai explicates its significance qua emptiness in terms of “primal non-origination” (Skrt: âdyanutpâda; Jpn: honpushô). What Kūkai means by “non-origination” is related to his understanding of the emptiness of things and the differential referentiality of signs. By incorporating the Mahâyâna thought of emptiness, Kūkai’s linguistic ontology of the mantra proves to be simultaneously a linguistic “an-ontology” (or: “meontology”) of sorts. Every phenomenon of the cosmos, being empty of substantiality, is what it is through its interdependent origination (Skrt: pratītya-samutpâda; Jpn: engi). Likewise each signifying letter of the cosmic text is what it is not because of its own substantial identity but rather through its difference from other signifying letters. Its identity is constituted not on the basis of a self-same essence but rather in reference to, and difference from, others. Signification then for Kūkai is nothing but differentiation (shabetsu), which is another way of speaking of the non-substantiality, i.e., emptiness, of phenomena. Every thing — rocks, mountains, ants, etc. — is what it is in mutual distinction with everything else. And this differentiation occurs via its implacement into a specific situation or context vis-à-vis other things in an endless chain of mutually referring (and differing) correlative thing-events. In reference to others and without substantial self-presence, each thing-event is hence empty. In this respect, every thing, as signifying letter, is an embodiment of emptiness. And as such a sign or letter manifesting emptiness and differential referentiality, each thing-event is thus a mantra, Dainichi’s “seal of wisdom of differentiation” (shabetsu chiin). The cosmic text constituted of mutually differing signs is then the empty place of empty things, and as such, the ultimate scripture of emptiness. The hosshin as the embodiment of this truth, the Dharma, is thus itself differentiation, emptiness.

The world emerges in the articulation of the Dharma through such mutual differentiations in pattern. From out of the sea of emptiness, through Dainich’s articulation qua mutual interplay of the five material elements, the cosmos is ordered into distinct and discrete things and events, and the hosshin transforms itself into a legible — albeit ambiguous — cosmic (con)text. This linguistic cosmogeny is simultaneously ontological and me-ontological. For each thing as sign in differential reference to the rest of the cosmic text, mirrors the infinity of all the other mutually referring and mutually differing thing-events. In its own emptiness, each thing-letter mirrors the emptiness of the cosmos, i.e., the Dharma. They are traces of the hosshin’s omnipresencing non-substantiality, emptiness as the “primal non-originating” source of these thing-events in their beginningless and endless interrelations. Kūkai takes this linguistic cosmo-genesis in emptiness via the hosshin’s world-play, to be the meaning behind the “playful striding of great emptiness,” mentioned in the Dainichi-kyô (T18:21a) and which he quotes in his Sokushinjôbutsugi. Furthermore this cosmogeny that is an articulation of truth, the writing of the cosmic text, is open-ended and on-going, dynamically being continuously reworked. This accounts for the ambiguity of the cosmic text and every sign within it.

The ambiguity of the mantric nature of the cosmos and of all thing-events is in the fact that they entail simultaneously both hope and difficulty for enlightenment. The language of the hosshin in the form of thing-events may either guide one to enlightenment or deceive one into delusion. For in spite of their emptiness, their interdependent origination, thing-events can be easily reified in light of human desires. When this happens the cosmic text they constitute is misread under the pretext that the world as such is nothing but a system of substantial things, and that any corresponding language is nothing but a system of signs representing those substantial things. Through the reification of their being, their “primal non-originating” emptiness is ignored. And correspondingly one becomes predisposed to cling to them and hence suffer. But this lack of essential origins in each and every phenomenon, the absence of their first cause, simultaneously means that we ourselves, all sentient beings, are endowed with the original enlightenment of the hosshin (hongaku hosshin). Hence there is hope for the realization of this enlightenment for all.

3.7.4 Mantra intonation

Shingon ritual practice attempts to trigger this realization through the mantric pronunciations of the five basic syllables of Sanskrit — A,Va, Ra, Ha, Kha —, emulating the primordial utterance of Dainichi. This is to attune the practitioner to the inter-resonance of the basic elements underlying all phenomena, so that he may hear the “true words” being preached by Dainichi. The mantra’s power is in its incomprehensibility to human understanding. Its significance cannot be explained analytically or understood conceptually; it is instead to be experienced in ritual. Through ritualized experience, these intellectually incomprehensible sounds, in the self-deconstruction of any assumed or projected meaningfulness, paradoxically evoke the emptiness they mean and the emptiness of their meaning, the emptiness of all in their mutual non-obstruction and interdependence. Its incomprehension makes explicit the materiality and dynamic process involved behind the emergence of signs. This undermines any linguistic assumption of the substantiality of things and hence any delusory attachments to them. What is invoked is a paradigm shift from seeing the surface pattern of things to seeing their underlying emptiness. (Abe 1999, 297–98) In addition to mantric intonations, another form of practice was a-ji meditation, wherein the written form of the Sanskrit letter A is treated as an object of meditation. The purpose of such concentrated attention on the material form of a sign is to gain some sort of an experiential comprehension of its esoteric significance, somewhat similar to that of mantra incantation as just discussed. However we must note the special significance of the particular letter A, which we shall discuss below.

3.7.5 The mantric syllable of A

The two most important mantric syllables from Sanskrit — in the Siddham (Jpn: shittan) script system popularized in East Asia — emphasized in Shingon Buddhism, in both sound and graph, are A and Un (m). The former is the seed-syllable of Dainichi as explicated in the Dainichi-kyô and the latter is the seed-syllable of the Kongô-satta (Vajrasattva, a buddha-being believed to have received instruction directly from Mahâvairocana) as explicated in the Kongôchô-gyô, and together seen as non-dualistic in significance. In the following I will discuss the significance of these seed-syllables.

Kūkai in several works (especially in Shôjijissôgi andUnjigi) explicates the syllabic letter A as signifying the above-mentioned “primal non-originating” character of all thing-events, as the “mother” of all syllables, letters, and languages, and the king of all mantras. The sound A is also the primal sound made when the mouth first opens to exhale. And in its written form, A constitutes the first stroke of every other syllable. A is the first syllable of the Sanskrit alphabet as well as of the Sanskrit words for “origin” (âdi) and “unborn” (anutpâda), combined in the Sanskrit word “primal non-origination” (âdyanutpâda). It is also the first letter of the root mantra of Dainichi as depicted in the Taizô Mandara (which we shall discuss below): A Vi Ra Hûm Kham m (Jpn: A Bira Un Ken). Furthermore in Sanskrit, A is used as a negative prefix. All of these manifold meanings are combined in Shingon’s mantric use of A to represent the primal vocalization of Dainichi. Its omnipresence in form and sound symbolizes the Buddha-nature of the hosshin pervading everywhere, while condensing the significance of that all-prevalence within its singular form and sound. But its all-pervasiveness also means the origin of all things in their interdependence, that is, their interdependent origination, hence emptiness. This emptiness of substance is denoted by its use as a negative prefix, i.e., the absence of self-presence in infinite referentiality. As stated above, A signifies the “primal non-originating” character of all being. For in signifying the origin of all in their on-going dependent origination A is thus the “origin of no origin.” What this points to is the endlessness of the chain of conditions behind each thing-event, never reaching an ultimate origin or first cause. But paradoxically this primal absence of any distinguishing origin, this ubiquitous in-difference of all differentiation, is itself the ultimate origin of all thing-events in their mutual differentiations and co-relativity. Or put differently, Dainichi’s mind (along with his body), making no discrimination between this and that, is like a great space (“emptiness”; ) from out of which he transforms himself through self-differentiation into the myriad thing-events and beings. This causeless cause is symbolized in the last letter in Sanskrit, the letter H, the first letter of the mantra m (Jpn: Un). Its meaning thus coincides with the “primal non-origination” denoted by the first letter of the alphabet, A. The syllable A, together with H then embodies the meanings of emptiness, dependent origination, and primal non-origination, all expressing the beginningless and endless dynamic non-substantiality of the entire cosmos and all being, the empty space that is the body of the hosshin, the Dharma of all dharmas.

It should be remembered however that while Kūkai thus links the hosshin’s preaching to the mantric sound and letter of A, this same preaching, symbolized in A, in fact encompasses all movements of the cosmos, involving colors, shapes, silence, bodily movements, etc., not just the explicitly vocal. Dainichi preaches the Dharma via all phenomenal means through the three media, the “three mysteries,” of body, speech, and mind, omnipresencing himself through all objects of the six senses (the five physical senses plus thought). The entire cosmos is hence the language of the Buddha, inseparable from the Buddha’s body that is in fact the embodiment of the Dharma (i.e., hosshin, dharmakâya). We now turn to the mandalic aspect of the embodiment of the Dharma and of Dainichi’s preaching of the Dharma.

3.8 The Mandalic Cosmos/Cosmos as Mandala

3.8.1 Rishin and chishin: Two mandalic embodiments

Viewed in light of the concept of hosshin seppô, the cosmos is a flowering of the Dharma preached by Dainichi, as it spreads outward towards beings receiving it in various degrees in accordance with their level of understanding. The form that this flowering takes is the mandala (Jpn: mandara). The mandala in Shingon Buddhism is a diagram or picture, usually a painting, picturing the doctrines expounded in the two major esoteric scriptures, Dainichikyô and Kongôchôgyô. It depicts visually the form that enlightenment takes as it becomes manifest in the universe. In other words, it is taken to be a visual depiction of the hosshin itself and the flowering of hosshin seppô throughout the cosmos, serving as a map for one’s journey to enlightenment.

This use and understanding of the mandala was another distinction of Shingon Buddhism differentiating it in Kūkai’s mind as esoteric from exoteric Buddhism. The mandala proves to be “a metaphor for a new envisioning of reality, self, and world” (Gardiner 2008, 44), a vehicle for the transformation of vision, whereby one envisions the world as a mandala. Kūkai’s contention was that exoteric teachings move the practitioner towards the central summit of the mandala, step-by-step from its own specific vantage point without taking a comprehensive view of the whole. Esoteric teachings on the other hand take the entirety of the cosmic mandala into one comprehensive view, allowing for the practitioner to leap, as it were, into the center to realize non-duality with the hosshin.

In the esoteric tradition that Kūkai inherited from Hui-kuo, there are two major mandalas that depict the hosshin in two different mandalic forms. Each mandala originally belonged to one of the two esoteric lineages, which became combined in China, and is associated with either of the two sûtras. All Shingon doctrines, traceable to the two sûtras, are supposed to be pictorially depicted in these two mandalas: the Taizô (Skrt: Garbha, “Womb of enlightenment”) and the Kongôkai (Srkt: Vajradhâtu, “Vajra realm,” “Diamond realm” or “Realm of the adamantine thunderbolt”) mandalas. Together they are called ryôbu mandara and represent a comprehensive unity. Each are also associated with one of the two different concepts of ri (pattern, order — referring to emptiness as the reason discerned in patternment) and chi (wisdom, i.e., the wisdom of emptiness). Accordingly the hosshin can be understood in its embodied form as ri-hosshin (or rishin) and as chi-hosshin (or chishin), two aspects which are ultimately non-dualistic (richi funi). The ri-hosshin is depicted in the Taizô mandara that expresses truths expounded in the Dainichi-kyô. And the chi-hosshin is depicted in the Kongôkai mandara that expresses truths expounded in the Kongôchô-gyô. Both depict Dainichi as the central deity, with buddhas and bodhisattvas surrounding him in geometric arrangement.

The Taizô-mandara (full name: Daichitaizôsei mandara; Skrt: Garbhakośadhâtu mandala; “Great compassion womb repository birth mandala”) represents the “female principle” and expresses the material world in its underlying empatternment of ri, which is the Buddha’s view to truth from the summit of enlightenment downward to the mundane world of humans. Ri (Chn: li) often translated into English as “principle,” in fact has the sense of “pattern,” and in the esoteric Buddhist context signifies the pattern found in the interplay of the five material elements that constitute the myriad thing-events and phenomena. As the material elements form the objects of cognition, the mandala depicting the rishin represents the known. In his commentary on the Dainichi-kyô (Dainichi-kyô kaidai), Kūkai equates the nature of Dainichi taken as jishô hosshin with this rishin. He then in turn identifies the rishin as the original enlightenment intrinsic to all sentient beings but hidden in its unmanifest potentiality as what is to be known.

As a descending view from the summit, this Taizô mandala represents the enlightened universe from the perspective of compassion, an expression of the “female” principle. Just as a mother enfolds her child in the care of her womb, the Buddha’s compassion nurtures the original enlightenment in all. With the lotus as chief symbol, the picture represents the manifestation of Dainichi through his cosmic activities. Dainichi occupies the unmoving center with myriad buddhas, bodhisattvas, and other deities layered around it, while Dainichi simultaneously pervades all up to the outermost edges of the diagram. From that center, enlightenment radiates outward in a spiral, passing through the various buddhas and bodhisattvas, descending through various levels of being and mind, outward to the phenomenal world as it becomes more and more concrete, reaching the human world and further into the realms of animals, hell-beings, and hungry ghosts. Thus a wellspring of activity is depicted to be endlessly flowing out of the center. This activity manifests the welling-up of compassion from the Buddha’s wisdom as it moves outwards and downwards. Simultaneously all beings are directed inwards and upwards towards enlightenment depicted in the mandalic center. The two movements are non-dualistic.

The Kongô-kai mandara (Srkt: Vajradhâtu mandala; “Vajra-realm mandala”) represents the “male priciple” and embodies the vajra-wisdom, a wisdom that is adamantine and imperishable and that illuminates and enfolds all beings. This symbolizes the sixth element, the mental element of chi (wisdom), referring to the mental realm of the knower, the subject of cognitive experience. But it also represents the Buddha’s adamantine power of illumination that realizes enlightenment, symbolized by the vajra (an adamantine weapon with many points). In this respect the mind it symbolizes is not only the practitioner’s mind but also the all-comprehensive mind of Dainichi as indestructible potentials of the cosmos, as the Buddha’s “embodiment of wisdom” (chishin).

This Kongô-kai mandala is a rectangle consisting of a combination of nine smaller mandalas, each an originally independent mandala, juxtaposed to depict a double spiraling movement, centrifugal and centripetal: on the one hand outward of the Buddha’s enlightenment towards the phenomenal world, and on the other hand inward of beings on the periphery from the mundane world in spiritual progression towards enlightenment at the center. Of the nine smaller mandalas, the most basic, which are on the lower left corner, are representations of the so-called “four mandalas” (shimandara) that Kūkai classified as the form of appearance of the hosshin. (More on the shimandara in the next section.) All together the nine depict the unending activity of the enlightened mind, moving clockwise from the center, to take on increasingly concrete forms, engaging in skillful means to help the unenlightened, while the unenlightened evolve towards the center. From the Buddha’s perspective, the center is moving outwards; and from the individual practitioner’s perspective, the periphery is being drawn inwards. Enlightened wisdom cannot remain aloof from the realities of unenlightened life. Skillful means thus embodies wisdom in concrete phenomenal activity. In this respect, the mandala emphasizes the non-duality between wisdom (hannya) and skillful means. And it symbolizes the wisdom that knows truth, the Dharma, in all its separate manifestations.

Together these two mandalic forms depict the form of the cosmos as a dynamic process interrelating and uniting the transcendent and the mundane, the enlightened and the ignorant, Buddha and man, macrocosmos and microcosmos, matter and mind, pattern and wisdom. They visually represent two simultaneous overlapping aspects of enlightenment, variously described as emptiness and form, compassion and wisdom, object and subject, the dimension from which the practitioner is guided by the Buddha and the dimension towards which the practitioner evolves. In Kūkai’s reading, these are inseparable aspects of the hosshin, depicted in the two mandalas from different but non-dualistic perspectives. Enlightenment would be the experiential realization of their non-duality: richi funi. In Shingon practice, therefore the Taizô mandala (rishin) is hung on the east wall of the meditation hall; and the Kongôkai mandala (chishin) is hung on the west wall.

3.8.2 The four types of the mandala

In addition to the two mandalic embodiments of the hosshin, Kūkai (in Sokushinjôbutsugi, ch.4) classifies mandalas in general into four types, depicting the different ways whereby the Dharma is manifest: 1. The “great mandala” (Skrt: mahâ-mandala; Jpn: daimandara) symbolizes the cosmic Buddha in its physical extension along with all the stages of being, including the buddhas, bodhisattvas, and deities that are depicted in perfect anthropormophic form surrounding Dainichi at the center and painted in different colors to represent different material elements. 2. The “samaya mandala” (Skrt: samaya-mandala; Jpn: sanmaya mandara) pictures the Buddha-cum-universe through a variety of articles or signs, symbolizing the omnipresencing of Dainichi’s intention (Skrt: samaya; Jpn: sanmaya). They include swords, gems, lotus, vajra, etc., as each signifying a specific improvisation of a skillful mean to enlighten the unenlightened. This also represents the unity-in-diversity of all thing-events as forms of Dainichi’s body. 3. The “Dharma mandala” (Skrt: Dharma-mandala; Jpn: hô mandara) pictures the universe as the sphere of Dainichi’s continuous communication of truth (Dharma), as depicted in the arrangement of mantric seed syllables. And 4. The “karma mandala” (Skrt: karma-mandala; Jpn: katsuma mandara) was originally a three-dimensional mandala in sculpted form — including the physical layout of the temple compound at Mt. Kôya — but which more often became a painted one instead. Showing the activities (karma) of buddhas and bodhisattvas implied in the other three, this mandala depicts the fact that every change in any form within the cosmos is an act of the hosshin and conversely that every act of the hosshin is an occurrence of things and events in the cosmos. The four then depict four different aspects of truth: body (the five material elements), mind (intention, compassion, the sixth element), speech (communication), and action (all movements). Through meditation upon them one comes to view everything as a mandala, the cosmos as a mandalic unfolding of the Dharma. Ultimately the mandala depicts not only the cosmos or the Dharma as object but also one’s own interior self in meditation as one interiorizes it or as one visualizes it within.

3.9 Sokushinjôbutsu: Enlightenment via Embodiment

One of the most distinguishing characteristic of Kūkai’s Buddhist thought is his concept of sokushinjôbutsu, the attainment of enlightenment in this very embodied existence. This idea of sokushinjôbutsu represents the apex of Kūkai’s synthesis of Buddhist theoria and praxis. The doctrine itself is not explicit in the two major esoteric sûtras, the Dainichikyô and the Kongôchôgyô. The idea first appears rather in I-hsing’s commentary on the Dainichikyô (Ta-jih Ching Su; Commentary on the Mahâvairocana Sûtra). Kūkai was the first however to provide the idea with a systematic explication in his Sokushinjôbutsugi, which has been regarded by commentators as the most important of his philosophical expositions. Kūkai’s appropriation and systematic development of the theory takes the form of a unique philosophy of praxis that is simultaneously a philosophy of the body.

The phrase sokushinjôbutsu means literally, “attaining enlightenment in this very body” or “becoming buddha in this very body.” “Body” (shin) — as Kūkai explains in Sokushinjôbutsugi, ch. 6 — here is not merely one’s corporeal body but one’s lived embodied existence of body-and-mind as one whole. In addition “body” here takes on myriad significances when one views sokushinjôbutsu in light of Kūkai’s other concepts such as hosshin seppô and sanmitsu. Sokushin (“this body”), for example, can signify the cosmos of the hokkai as the macrocosmic body of the hosshin with which one’s own embodiment is non-dualistic. It can mean each of the six universal elements or all of them together that comprise the cosmic body and its samadhi. It can also mean the four embodiments of the hosshin. It can mean the bodies of all living things other than one’s self. In correspondence with the “three mysteries” of body, speech, and mind, or mudra, mantra, and mandala, it can mean bodily gestural symbols (in), figures of letters (ji), and expressive demeanor or countenance (). All of these senses of “body” are interrelated and inseparable, mutually mirroring one another.

Shingon has inherited much of the metaphysics of Chinese Mahâyâna thought: e.g., the equation of hosshin and hokkai, traceable to Hua-yen Buddhism; and the equation of the hosshin with the universal Buddha-nature inherent in all beings as their “original enlightenment”, traceable to T’ien-t’ai (Tiantai; Jpn: Tendai) Buddhism. Combining these Mahâyâna equations, in Shingon, the embodiment of the Dharma equals the cosmos as the realm of truth, the Dharma, which in turn means the inherent universal original enlightenment (honnu hongaku) in all beings. But what distinguishes Kūkai’s thought is in his focus upon the body and its concrete practice. The cosmos is the “body of truth” and our own bodies take part in that cosmic body. It is this bodily aspect, as a universal medium or plenum that allows for the concretization of universal enlightenment to be realized through ritualized bodily experience. Both Hua-yen and T’ien-t’ai had similar notions of universal original enlightenment although that idea was quite new to Japan at the time. But what they lacked was any concrete ritual means for realizing that enlightenment aside from basic meditation. Kūkai contended that their teachings were thus lacking in the area of practice. His emphasis upon a bodily ritual praxis that cohered with scriptural doctrine provided them with soteriological — rather than just magico-secular — significance. This helped to bridge the gap between theory and practice, doctrine and ritual, that was previously left unexplained by the orthodox Nara schools of Buddhism. As a consequence of his explication of sokushinjôbutsu, Kūkai thus provided both a coherent explanation of the relationship between theory and practice, and a concrete method for realizing through bodily experience those teachings, a practical method for realizing what Mahâyâna already taught in China as hongaku.

Kūkai’s claim was that this esoteric method of ritual-bodily-meditational practice — involving the three media (or “mysteries”) of body, speech, and mind — will allow one to realize one’s direct embodied participation in the Dharmic samadhi of the hosshin, i.e., “enlightenment in this very embodied existence” (sokushinjôbutsu). The lack of any systematic esoteric ritual practice in exoteric Buddhism — from Kūkai’s perspective, their rituals were unsystematized, haphazard —, fails to lead to immediate enlightenment. Moreover the orthodox teaching of the exoteric schools was that it would take innumerable rebirths of training until one could attain Buddhahood. Kūkai instead claimed that esoteric Buddhism, with its rituals and meditational methods, can lead one, regardless of karmic dispositions, to instant enlightenment “in this very body.” Through yogic and mantric practices involving the body, the practitioner was to eliminate all attachments to the substantiality of self and of things and to their dichotomization — this for the sake of immediately realizing non-duality with the hosshin. In this way the idea of sokushinjôbutsu is put forth as a major distinguishing characteristic of esoteric from exoteric Buddhism, demonstrating the possibility of attaining enlightenment in one’s presently embodied existence in distinction from the long and gradual process over countless aeons of rebirths as taught by the exoteric schools.

For Kūkai this bodily and concrete nature of the realization of original enlightenment, which he so emphasized, is ultimately predicated upon the fact that one’s self and Buddha are non-dualistic, that man in his very embodied existence — that is, in body-and-mind — is already a micro-cosmic mirror of the hosshin. We next turn to this aspect of man’s mirroring of the Buddha, which simultaneously is also the Buddha’s salvific helping of man.

3.10 Kaji: Macro-Micro-Cosmic Co-Respondence

The realization of enlightenment cannot be attained on one’s own. For one is not a substantial, i.e., ontologically independent, being to begin with. As the cosmos itself is a web of interdependently originating thing-events, nothing can stand alone to claim complete self-sufficiency. The same interdependency that obtains horizontally between the constituents of the cosmos also obtains vertically. That is, the whole is what it is in virtue of its parts just as the parts are what they are in partaking of the whole. The realization of enlightenment then as an event, as well as the relative degrees of spiritual development, entails a micro-cosmic and macro-cosmic correlativity. This is expressed in Sokushinjôbutsugi, ch. 5, in Kūkai’s notion of kaji (Skrt: adhisthâna), which has been variously translated as “empowerment” or “grace.” In religious (or devotional) terms, this is explained to involve both the Buddha’s great compassion and the practitioner’s piety, devotion, or faith, which in their correspondence, act together in the attainment of enlightenment. But one must keep in mind that kaji in itself is not necessarilly enlightenment because the empowerment is in proportion to the level of spirituality attained by the practitioner. Through such mutuality, one’s own effort partakes in the omnipresencing of the hosshin, realized in various degrees. This mutuality is expressed in the meanings of the two characters that make up kaji: Ka, literally meaning “adding” or “increasing,” is explained to be the Buddha’s compassion that pours down upon, entering into, the practitioner’s mind (shin) like sunrays on water. And ji, literally meaning “retaining” or “holding,” is explained to refer to the practitioner’s mind that keeps a-hold of, absorbs, the compassion just as water retains and reflects the sunlight. Ka is the gift that Dainichi gives; and ji is our acknowledgment of that gift by cherishing it. Practically speaking this becomes expressed in the bodily ritual training that the practitioner undergoes as he strives to ascend “upwards,” to meet Dainichi’s compassionate descent “downwards.” In the terminology that becomes later popularized with Pure Land Buddhism, this would signify a mutuality and non-duality between self-power (jiriki) and other-power (tariki). The two movements are aspects of a single movement of enlightenment. In other words, one’s own striving is the “grace” of the Buddha helping one towards enlightenment. But this cannot simply be construed to mean one’s reliance upon other-power but entails that one must appropriate that “grace” in self-power. This mutuality of kaji is also expressed in Kūkai’s phrase, nyûga ganyû (“[Buddha] entering into me, and I entering [into Buddha]”).

Kaji is realized as one becomes aware of one’s self and activity as the micro-cosmic manifestation of the macro-cosmic activity and mystery of the cosmos itself. One could then also say that kaji expresses the mutuality and coherence or co-responding that obtains between the two major concepts characterizing esoteric Buddhism for Kūkai: hosshin seppô and sokushinjôbutsu, as two ways of conceiving from different angles the same interrelationality of the cosmos in its mantric and mandalic expressions. That is to say, in the mantric and mandalic nature of this interrelationality, the Buddha’s hosshin seppô on the one hand descends from the summit and spreads-out from the center, and the practitioner’s sokushinjôbutsu on the other hand raises him from below and gravitates him to the center. Their simultaneity means their non-duality as different aspects of the same dynamism of a cosmic emptiness. To realize this, is to affirm one’s own original enlightenment in one’s present body in simultaneous reception of Dainichi’s expounding of the Dharma.

3.11 Sanmitsu: The Three Mysteries

The “true words” (mantra) preached by Dainichi, as we have already seen, are equated with the dynamism of the cosmos itself, which includes our own mental and bodily experiences. The Buddha’s preaching through every phenomenon is classified by Kūkai in terms of the three forms of bodily, verbal, and mental activities, or the three media of mudra (ingei), mantra, and mandala, i.e., Dainichi’s cosmic gestural language, phonic language, and imaging language. Dainichi expresses the self-enjoyment of his enlightenment in these three functions of bodily gestures (mudras), the intoning of sounds (mantras), and visualizing-thinking (mandalas). Since the cosmos is Dainichi’s body-and-mind, his deeds, words, and thoughts (or visualizations) form the configurations, resonances, and patterns of the universe, in these three media of “body, speech, and mind,” called the “three mysteries.” All visible and/or tangible forms and movements constitute the Buddha’s body and its movements, all sounds are his voice, and the mind’s comprehension of this principle is the manifestation of the Dharma in mandalic form expressing the Buddha’s state-of-mind. That is, all objects of the six senses make up the configurations, resonances, and patterns of the cosmos, the cosmic body-and-mind of the Buddha Dainichi, communicating the Dharma. As Kūkai explains in his Unjigi, the three mysteries are in every single phenomenon, passing through all stages of being without discrimination, including stones, plants, trees, animals, humans, gods, demons, and places. Each of these serves as a “linguistic” medium that communicates Dainichi’s sermon in his omnipresencing, a sermon of the Dharma which cannot be expressed or described by means of the mundane human languages.

As these three media are in fact different expressions of the same Dharma, they are not independent of each other. For example, the mantra is an expression of the mandala in sound, and conversely, the mandala conveys in pictures what the mantra intones. Together they convey in visual form and in audible sound, the meaning of the Dharma. Through these three media, sentient beings are thus aroused from their ignorance to realize their own enlightenment.

Implaced within this vibrating cosmos, we are all then taking part in Dainichi’s bodily, verbal, and mental activities as “originally enlightened,” non-dualistic with the Buddha. On the basis of kaji, which we discussed above, the three mysteries of the hosshin and the three corresponding forms of activities of sentient beings inter-permeate. That is, our own bodily, verbal, and mental activities are already expressions of the three mysteries of the hosshin. This inter-permeation is hence “always already,” and yet what is lacking for the most part is our awareness of it that would realize it. That is why Kūkai, following the Dainichikyô, prescribes the ritual practice of bodily acts, verbal acts, and mental acts. Bodily acts involve mudra-formations — these are complex series of gestural movements of the hands and fingers in coordination with mantra-chanting and visualizations —, meditative bodily postures, and the handling of ritual instruments. Verbal acts involve mantra-recitations and other forms of prayer formulas or chants and verses (dhâranīs). And mental acts involve visualizing or focussing upon mandalas or the figures of Sanskrit mantra letters as well as visualizations (kansô, kannen) of deities or buddhas — a realization of self and world in the sense of both transformation and awakening as their fruit. Together with ingei (mudra) and shingon (mantra), the practitioner’s kansô allows the mandalic structure inseparable from the insight attained in such practice — an “image” that in itself is visually unrepresentable and hence irreducible to the visual mandalic icon — to unfold. The three acts are performed simultaneously in a practice wherein the practitioner utters a mantra, forms mudras, and visualizes their form and meditates their meaning and lets his mind abide in samadhi, all at the same time.

The point of Shingon practice is to intentionally accord with, or inter-resonate with, Dainichi’s movements, mirroring the macrocosmic world in one’s own microcosm. Thereby original enlightenment is realized in one’s very own embodied dynamism of bodily, verbal, and mental acts. Shingon ritual meditative practice, as such, involving all three activities is meant to intentionally express the realization of one’s participation in the cosmic mantra language of the hosshin. This practice then provides the means of penetrating Dainichi’s cosmic mantric language so that one may directly comprehend and experientially verify hosshin seppô. By making use of all of the faculties of one’s embodied existence — thinking, feeling, sensing, acting, visualizing, etc. —, one is led via kaji to comprehend the Dharma, not merely conceptually or intellectually but through one’s body-and-mind. In non-duality with the Buddha’s cosmic embodiment, one’s own three human activities (Srkt: trikarma; Jpn: sangô) — bodily, verbal, and mental — immediately become experienced as the Buddha’s own acts, the three cosmic mysteries, as immanent to one’s self. Thereby one is now intentionally participating in the yoga or samadhi of Dainichi, thus realizing one’s own original enlightenment. In this state called “secret” or “mysterious samadhi” (himitsu sanmaji) or “secret meditation” (himitsu zen), with the help of kaji, the integration between man’s “three acts” and Buddha’s “three mysteries” is realized, and Buddha “enters me and I enter” Buddha. As one’s mind thus becomes enlightened and one’s body becomes “adamantine,” one attains Buddhahood. (See Sokushinjôbutsugi, ch.5) In bodily-mental co-respondence with the hosshin’s omnipresencing via the three mysteries, Kūkai claims, the non-duality between self and Buddha is thus realized immediately in one’s embodied existence, thus sokushinjôbutsu.

With successful completion, this practice of the three mysteries, which initially has the aspect of “with form” (usô) — that is, in rituals —, comes to occur naturally, no longer restricted to its ritualized context. That is, the individual’s every action in daily life, without ritual form (musô), comes to intentionally reflect the enlightened body-and-mind of the Buddha and its three mysteries. Every word uttered is thus a mantra, every bodily movement a mudra, and every thought samadhi. It is in this culmination of bodily practice, that all of Kūkai’s major concepts, hosshin seppô, hongaku, sanmitsu, sokushinjôbutsu, nyûga ganyû, converge in the attainment of Buddhahood. While from the Shingon esoteric perspective, this attainment is instant, from another perspective, viewed in light of all other (i.e., exoteric) doctrines, the attainment is gradual and relative. We now turn to this final topic in our discussion of Kūkai, the development of the mind through ten states from the animal to the enlightened.

3.12 Ten States in the Development of the Mind

By 830 Kūkai has shifted his interest from an earlier focus upon the controversy between Madhaymaka and Yogâcâra concerning the emptiness or existence of the dharmas and his critique of their view on language as not conveying truth (the Dharma), to evaluating Buddhist doctrines as a whole, including the other major Buddhist schools. This shift is most likely connected to the dispute on-going during that period between the founder of the Tendai school, Saichô, and the older Nara Buddhist schools. In providing a comprehensive scheme that would explain the place of each religious teaching as well as the place of esoteric Buddhism in relation to the other Buddhist doctrines, Kūkai aimed to demonstrate the significance of his version of Buddhism.

In this scheme, Kūkai is adamant in using the above-discussed concepts to distinguish esoteric from exoteric Buddhism. And yet, given a bird’s eye view, the truth, the Dharma, in Kūkai’s scheme is encompassing enough to include exoteric Buddhism and all other teachings as its unfoldings or manifestations, in relative degrees in accordance with the appropriate circumstance or context and the level of attainment. In order to explain the different levels or states (, literally “dwellings” or “lodgings”) of mind (jûjûshin) that correspond to the various doctrines of other schools and religious sects, Kūkai developed an hierarchical scheme. Shingon Buddhism is placed at the top of the hierarchy as providing the most comprehensive view to the Dharma. Kūkai provides this systematization in what many consider to be his magnum opus, Himitsu mandara jûjûshinron (Treatise on the Secret Mandala of the Ten States of Mind) in ten volumes, composed around 830, five years before his death. It was written in response to an order of Emperor Junna that each Buddhist sect present an introductory treatise of its teachings. When the text proved to be too difficult for the emperor, Kūkai produced an abridged and more accessible treatise on the same theme, Hizô hôyaku (Precious Key to the Secret Treasury) in three volumes. At the core of both works is this classification of the various doctrines whereby each is critically evaluated under the light of the culminating and most comprehensive view of Shingon. A similar sort of system of classifying doctrines, called p’an-chiao (panjiao) or chiao-pan (jiaoban) (Jpn: kyôsô hanjaku or kyô-han) already existed in China, e.g. within the T’ien-t’ai and the Hua-yen traditions. Such a system of classification proved helpful in their attempts to distinguish themselves from, and at the same time, incorporate previous doctrines as expedient means that are relatively true. The Lotus Sûtra had also already expressed the similar idea that various doctrines were meant as expedient means that lead eventually to a fuller truth (expressed within its own text). It is Kūkai’s own invention however to associate the different doctrines evaluated and classified with specific states of mind or stages of spiritual attainment. That is, each state in the development of the mind is correlated with a specific set of doctrines appropriate to it, as its perspective and lived experience of reality, true to a certain extent within its limited purview but not yet the whole truth until the final state is reached. In other words, to move up this hierarchy of levels of mind, is to experience the unfolding of the Dharma as one becomes further awakened until one fully realizes one’s enlightenment in non-duality with the Dharma itself, i.e. the attainment of Buddha-hood. From a mandalic perspective, this unfolding of the Dharma is also indicative of one’s evolution from the periphery towards the center of the mandalic universe. However as each level of mind is a “dwelling” or “lodging” place for the mind, the hierarchy from the lowest to the highest “stages” is sequential only in the exoteric dimension. That is to say that the sequential ordering is not necessary in itself when viewed from the esoteric, i.e., holistic, standpoint. In other words, it is possible to move directly from any state or “dwelling” to the most comprehensive realm.

The teachings evaluated here not only include Buddhist schools but also variations of Brahmanism, Hinduism, and Indian religious practices as well as Chinese non-Buddhist doctrines. And the Buddhist teachings include the major Indian and Chinese doctrines that have made their way to Japan: Ritsu (Chn. Lu-tsung, Vinaya studies), Kusha (based on Abhidharma), Jôjitsu (Skrt. Satyasiddhi, based on Sautrântika), Hossô (Skrt. Yogâcâra, Chn. Fa-hsiang), Sanron (Chn. San-lun based on Indian Madhyamaka), Tendai (Ch. T’ien-t’ai), Kegon (Chn. Hua-yen), and Shingon. Kūkai’s classification system may be briefly summarized in the following schema:

1st to 3rd states: Pre-Buddhist stages: worldly “vehicles” of samsaric entrapment:

1st state: “The mind of the goat foolishly transmigrating in the six destinies (or realms)” (ishô teiyô-shin): The state of desire driven by animal instincts without moral restraint; the stage to which belong common people, hell-beings, hungry-ghosts, beasts, asuras (“titans”), and various deities or celestial beings trapped in their samsaric destinies.

2nd state: “The mind of the child tempered but ignorantly obsessed with moral precepts” (gudô jisai-shin): The state of ethical actions and virtue that promote social order but without any “religious” goal; the stage to which belong Confucianism and the Buddhist precepts (ritsu) for the laity.

3rd state: “The mind of the child composed and fearing nothing” (yodô mui-shin): The state of deity worship and extrinsic magico-religious practice for the sake of overcoming anxiety with the thought of attaining supernatural powers or immortality, or reaching an eternal and blissful heaven; the stage to which belong Taoism and various forms of Hinduism or Brahmanism.

4th to 10th states: Buddhist stages (the fourth to ninth being exoteric Buddhism and the tenth being esoteric Buddhism):

4th to 5th states: Hinâyâna stages: “vehicles” of those who aspire towards self-enlightenment without caring for the enlightenment of others.

4th state: “The mind of one affirming only the elements and negating the self” (yuiun muga-shin): The state of the śrâvaka who analyzes phenomena into the psycho-physical “aggregates” (skandhas) and/or the elements (dharmas), to thus negate any belief in a permanent ego (atman); the stage to which belong the teachings of the historical Buddha and his direct disciples and of the Abhidharma scholastics. While the substantiality of reality is thus deconstructed into its elemental dharmas, the dharmas themselves however become fetters, thus taking from three lives to sixty aeons to achieve liberation.

5th state: “The mind freed from karmic seeds” (batsu gôinju-shin): The state of the pratyeka-buddha, who, masterless on his own, attains insight into the chain of dependent origination to recognize the impermanence, self-less-ness, and non-substantiality of all, thus preventing new karma to arise. But in enjoying a certain level of “enlightenment,” he falls back into the “egoism” of self-complacency, compassionless apathy towards fellow beings, and the narrow vision of other-worldliness. Hence he has not yet reached complete enlightenment. The Sautrântika school belongs to this stage.

6th to 9th states: Mahâyâna stages: “vehicles” of the bodhisattvas, those who seek enlightenment both for self and for others, by overcoming self-other duality and recognizing the interdependency between self-enlightenment and other-enlightenment and between wisdom and compassion.

6th state: “The mind of the Mahâyâna adherent who is concerned with others” (taen daijô-shin): The state of Yogâcâra with its Vijñapti-mâtratâ (Jpn: yuishiki) standpoint that everything is “mind-only,” reached by its analysis of thing-events as phenomena of consciousness originating from a deep un-conscious “storehouse” or “receptacle consciousness” (âlaya-vijñâna). Its point is to detach oneself from the discriminating objectification of phenomena in order to realize the tranquility of “mind-only” from a non-discriminating perspective, which would allow the practice of “great compassion.” And yet this still takes several aeons of practice to achieve and is not the final state.

7th state: “The mind of one who realizes non-origination” (kakushin fushô-shin): The state of Madhyamaka with its śûnyavâda (Jpn: kûgan) standpoint that everything is empty. Here reifying and substantializing conceptions — including both objects and mind — that act as fetters are eliminated through Nâgârjuna’s eight-fold negations which via their dependent origination show their emptiness.

8th state: “The mind of one who realizes harmony with the one path of truth” (nyojitsu ichidô-shin or ichidô muishin): The state of T’ien-t’ai with its standpoint of “oneness of all,” wherein one realizes that one moment contains eternity, a single thought contains all possible worlds, and a sesame seed contains a mountain, i.e. the non-duality between one and many; and between emptiness, dependent origination, and their “middle.”

9th state: “The mind of one who realizes the absence of substance within ultimate truth” (goku mujishô-shin): The state of Hua-yen with its standpoint of the mutual non-obstruction and interpenetration between the patternment (Chn: li; Jpn: ri) of all and the concrete thing-events (Chn: shih; Jpn: ji) on the basis of their emptiness, whereby one and many are non-dualistic. This non-duality is extended to the level of the entire dharmadhâtu.

10th state: Both Tendai and Kegon for Kūkai however lack the crucial element of direct experiential understanding to truly realize what they preach. One must thus proceed further by means of bodily ritual practice provided by the next and final state: Mantrayâna: “The mind of secret sublimity” (himitsu shôgon-shin). This is the state of Shingon, whose esoteric teachings and bodily experiential practice constitute the summit of the development of the mind. At this summit hosshin seppô is revealed and one attains sokushinjôbutsu through the micro-macro-cosmic correlativity of the three mysteries and through kaji.

Rather than rejecting or negating the previous states, this final state fulfills and encompasses their standpoints from what is claimed to be the most comprehensive standpoint, in view of — or rather in non-duality with — the Dharma. In light of the Dharma, the truths taught in those previous states are but relative or provisional truths, expedient means that are helpful only insofar as they lead one towards this final truth but which can also serve as fetters if one becomes attached to them. Each state is referred to as a “palace” (kyû or ), which are all combined in the one grand cosmic palace (hokkaigû or hokkai shinden). This grand palace constitutes the entire cosmos as a mandala, with the tenth and highest state, the innermost secret palace of Dainichi, at the center and summit from which the Dharma emanates into its various manifestations in the lower states, the outer palaces. The closer one is to the center, the stronger one feels the pull of kaji drawing one up towards the central summit. But as stated above, the sequential ordering of the hierarchy is not necessary when the whole is viewed from this most comprehensive standpoint. For the grand cosmic palace penetrates and comprehends all of the specific palaces or dwellings of the mind. Hence one can make a sudden leap from any point in this cosmic mandala towards the center by successfully engaging in the esoteric practice of Shingon Buddhism. It is this mandalic structure that the term mandala in the title of the longer version of this work (Treatise on the Secret Mandala of the Ten States of Mind) signifies. It refers to the blueprint of the cosmic embodiment of the Dharma (hosshin), which in turn structures one’s (ritual) practice in its arrangement and how one accordingly experiences the Dharma.

4. Concluding Remarks

Among the better known philosophers of the Kyoto School, references to Kūkai or Shingon, when compared to Zen or Pure Land Buddhism, are hardly noticeable. It has been suggested that this neglect may have something to do with an intellectual’s prejudice against the “esoteric,” e.g. the significance of ritual with its symbols and images, which are not so easily amenable to rational comprehension and instead conjure up preconceptions of the “occult” and the “magical.” However the philosophical aspects of Shingon Buddhism are often traceable to the same Mahâyâna seeds that sprouted Zen. Once such prejudices are overcome, it would not be so difficult for the contemporary philosopher to find in Kūkai a well-spring of ideas and thoughts which may be of interest today.

We need to acknowledge, however, that Kūkai and Shingon Buddhism in general have not altogether been ignored by contemporary philosophers of Japan. Even within the Kyoto School, its current representative Ueda Shizuteru in a 1993 lecture, Basho to mandara, discusses the significance of mandalas in Shingon Buddhism in relation to the ontological structure of human existence understood in his terms as being-in-the-twofold-world. In his analysis of Kūkai’s mandalas, Ueda approriates contemporary philosophical concepts, such as Nishida’s “place” (basho), Nishitani’s “field” (ba), and Heidegger’s “being-in-the-world” (In-der-Welt-sein), and takes the mandala as indicative of the always assumed semantic space (imi kûkan) belonging to the world (sekai) as the total framework of meanings (imi no waku gumi) wherein we find ourselves. A couple of other graduates of Kyoto University’s philosophy department have entire books on Kūkai. In Kūkai no shisô ni tsuite, Umehara Takeshi discusses Kūkai both as a religious practitioner and as a theorist, who explicates the world’s infinite “treasure” unfolding within the self. And ex-Nishidian turned Marxist, Yanagida Kenjûrô, has a study on Kūkai and his works: Nihon shingon no tetsugaku: Kūkai Hizôhôyaku to Ben’kenmitsu nikyôron.

Among other twentieth century Japanese philosophers, Yuasa Yasuo, known for his theory of the body, often refers to the doctrines and practices of Shingon Buddhism, and has writen entire chapters on Kūkai in Shintairon: Tôyôteki shinshin ron to gendai and The Body: Towards an Eastern Mind-Body Theory. Comparative philosopher of religion, Izutsu Toshihiko, as well, in Ishiki to honshitsu and other works, has found Kūkai’s ideas – especially his cosmological-linguistic theory – inspiring enough to incorporate into his own theory of essence as part of his attempt to build a synthetic “Oriental philosophy” (tôyô tetsugaku). Philosopher of Buddhist thought, Tamaki Kôshirô discusses the significance of Kūkai’s philosophy within the history of Japanese Buddhism in his Nihon bukkyô shisô ron. And philosopher of religion and religious studies scholar Nakazawa Shin’ichi, like Ueda, focuses on Kūkai’s mandalic philosophy in his book, Seppen kyokusenron. He reads Kūkai’s works on Shingon as involving a hydrodynamic mode of thinking that in its flexibility deals with the non-Euclidean currents of nature with its forces of reality, undulating in ripples and forming vortexes. He views the Shingon mandala as approximating, with its circles and lines, what is expressed in today’s fractal geometry, whereby the infinitesimally microcosmic part endlessly and indefinitely iterates the patterns of the whole of nature in its innumerable vortexes and curves.

Kūkai’s ideas engender an holistic view towards nature and the cosmos as encompassing ourselves and in our interrelationships with others. They may be of relevance to the dilemmas we face today in this epoch of globalization, religious wars, technological “enframing” (to use Heidegger’s terminology), and environmental hazards. And in terms of scholarship, as can be seen in some of the above-mentioned Japanese scholars’ works on Kûka, Kūkai offers a wealth of ideas for comparative analyses: e.g. with Derrida on the world as text, with Process thought on “cosmo-holism,” with Merleau-Ponty or Deleuze on the significance of the body and bodily spatiality and interrelationality vis-à-vis the environment, with Nishida or Hegel on dialectics and interrelationality, or with major “mystic” thinkers of other religious traditions such as Ibn Arabi of Islam or Meister Eckhart of Christianity on a dynamic non-duality as opposed to both static monism and subject-object dualism. Kūkai’s thinking provides a wealth of insights, of much value, to offer to philosophers of today.


Primary Sources

  • 1972. Kūkai: Major Works Translated, with an Account of his Life and a Study of his Thought, Yoshito S. Hakeda (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • 1972. “Kūkai’s Sokushin-Jôbutsu-gi (Principle of Attaining Buddhahood with the Present Body),” H. Inagaki (trans.), Asia Minor: A British Journal of Far Eastern Studies, XVII(2): 190–215.
  • 1973. Kôbô daishi Kūkai zenshû vol. I (Himitsu mandara jûjûshinron), Tokyo: Chikuma shobô.
  • 1983. Kôbô daishi Kūkai zenshû Vol. 2, Tokyo: Chikuma shobô.
  • 1984. Kôbô daishi Kūkai zenshû Vol. 4, Tokyo: Chikuma shobô.
  • 1985. Sokushinjôbutsugi, Kanaoka Shûyô (trans. into modern Japanese and commentary), Tokyo: Taiyô shuppan, 1985.
  • 2004. On the Differences between the Exoteric and Esoteric Teachings; The Meaning of Becoming a Buddha in This Very Body; The Meanings of Sound, Sign, and Reaity; The Meanings of the Word Hûm; and The Precious Key to the Secret Treasury. In: Shingon Texts, Rolf W. Giebel (trans.), Berkeley, CA: Bukkyô Dendô Kyôkai and Numata Center for Buddhist Translation and Research.
  • 2010. Kūkai on the Philosophy of Language, Shingen Takagi and Thomas Eijo Dreitlein (trans.), Tokyo: Keio University Press.

Secondary Sources

  • Abe, Ryûichi, 1999, The Weaving of the Mantra: Kūkai and the Construction of Esoteric Buddhist Discourse, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Bogel, Cynthea J., 2009, With a Single Glance: Buddhist Icon and Early Mikkyo Vision, Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Fujii, Jun, 2008, Kūkai no shisôteki tenkai no kenkyû, Tokyo: Toransubyu.
  • Gardiner, David, 2008, “Metaphor and Mandala in Shingon Buddhist Theology,” Sophia: International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, Metaphysical Theology and Ethics, 47(1): 43–55.
  • Hakeda, Yoshito S., 1972, Kūkai: Major Works Translated, with an Account of his Life and a Study of his Thought, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Inagaki, H., 1972, “Kūkai’s Sokushin-Jôbutsu-gi (Principle of Attaining Buddhahood with the Present Body),” Asia Minor: A British Journal of Far Eastern Studies, XVII(2): 190–215.
  • Ingram, Paul O., 1990, “Nature’s Jeweled Net: Kūkai’s Ecological Buddhism,” The Pacific World: Journal of the Institute of Buddhist Studies (New Series), 6: 50–64.
  • –––, 1993, “The Jeweled Net of Nature,” Process Studies, 22(3): 134–144.
  • Izutsu, Toshihiko, 2001, Ishiki to honshitsu, Tokyo: Iwanami shoten.
  • Kanaoka, Shûyô, Seigô Matsuoka, Tetsuo Yamaori, Tadashi Shimizu, Jôsaku Maeda, 1984, Kūkai to mikkyô uchû, Tokyo: Kôsan tosho.
  • Kasulis, Thomas, 1988, “On Knowing the Mystery: Kūkai and Thomas Aquinas,” Buddhist-Christian Studies, 8: 37–45.
  • –––, 1988, “Truth Words: The Basis of Kūkai’s Theory of Interpretation,” in Donald S. Lopez Jr. (ed.), Buddhist Hermeneutics, Honolulu: University of Hawaii.
  • –––, 1990, “Kūkai (774–835): Philosophizing in the Archaic,” in Frank Reynolds and David Tracy (ed.), Myth and Philosophy, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 1995, “Reality as Embodiment: An Analysis of Kūkai’s Sokushinjôbutsu and Hosshin Seppô,” in Jane Marie Law (ed.), Religious Reflections on the Human Body, Bloomington: Indiana University Press: 166–185.
  • –––, 2000, “Kūkai,” in Concise Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London: Routledge.
  • Kitagawa, Joseph, 1976, “Kūkai as Master and Savior,” in Frank E. Reynolds and Donald Capps (ed.), The Biographical Process: Studies in the History and Psychology of Religion, The Hague: Mouton & Co.: 319–41.
  • Kiyota, Minoru, 1978, Shingon Buddhism: Theory and Practice, Tokyo: Buddhist Books International.
  • Matsunaga, Yûkei, 1985, Kūkai: Mugen o ikiru, Tokyo: Shûeisha.
  • Miyasaka, Yûshô, 1979, Mikkyô shisô no shinri, Kyoto: Jinbun shoin.
  • –––, 2003, Kūkai: shôgai to shisô, Tokyo: Chikuma shobô.
  • Miyasaka, Yûshô, Takeshi Umehara, Shûyû Kanaoka, ed., 1976, Kūkai no jinsei to shisô, Tokyo: Shunjûsha.
  • Nakazawa, Shin’ichi, 1988, Seppen kyokusenron, Tokyo: Chûôkôronshinsha.
  • Okamura, Keishin, 1978, Mikkyô no riron to jissen, Tokyo: Shunjûsha, 1978.
  • –––, 1985, “Kūkai’s Philosophy as a Mandala,” The Eastern Buddhist (New Series), XVIII(2): 19–34.
  • Parkes, Graham, 2013, “Kūkai and Dôgen as Exemplars of Ecological Engagement,” Journal of Japanese Philosophy, 1: 85–110.
  • Shaner, David Edward, 1985, The Bodymind Experience in Japanese Buddhism: A Phenomenological Perspective of Kūkai and Dôgen, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Shiba, Ryotaro, 2003, Kūkai the Universal: Scenes from his Life, Akiko Takemoto (trans.), New York: ICG Muse, Inc.
  • Snodgrass, Adrian, 1984–86, “The Shingon Buddhist Doctrine of Interpenetration,” Religious Traditions: A Journal in the Study of Religion, 7–9: 53–81.
  • Tamaki, Kôshirô, 1974, Nihon bukkyô shisô ron, Kyoto: Heirakuji shoten.
  • Ueda, Shizuteru, 2002, “Basho to mandara” in Ueda Shizuteru shû dai kyû maki: Kokû/sekai, Tokyo: Iwanami shoten: 295–322.
  • Umehara, Takeshi, 1980, Kūkai no shisô ni tsuite, Tokyo: Kôdansha.
  • Yamasaki, Taiko, n.d., Shingon: Japanese Esoteric Buddhism, Richard & Cynthia Peterson (trans.), Yasuyo Morimoto & David Kidd (ed.), Fresno: Shingon Buddhist International Institute.
  • Yanagida, Kenjûrô, 2008, Nihon shingon no tetsugaku: Kūkai Hizôhôyaku to Ben’kenmitsu nikyôron, Tokyo: Daihôrinkaku.
  • Yuasa, Yasuo, 1987, The Body: Toward an Eastern Mind-Body Theory, Shigenori Nagatomo (trans.), Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Yuasa, Yasuo, 1990, Shintairon: Tôyôteki shinsin ron to gendai, Tokyo: Kôdansha.
  • Wada, Shûjô and Shingen Takagi, ed., 1982, Kūkai, Tokyo: Yoshikawa Kobunkan.
  • Watt, Paul B., 1999, “Kūkai” in Buddhist Spirituality: Later China, Korea, Japan, and the Modern World, Takeuchi Yoshinori (ed.), New York: Crossroad Pub.
  • Winfield, Pamela D., 2013, Icons and Iconoclasm in Japanese Buddhism: Kūkai and Dôgen on the Art of Enlightenment, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Various authors, 1984, Kôbôdaishi to gendai, Kyoto: Chikuma shobô.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2018 by
John Krummel <Krummel@hws.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free