The term ‘pantheism’ is a modern one, possibly first appearing in the writing of the Irish freethinker John Toland (1705) and constructed from the Greek roots pan (all) and theos (God). But if not the name, the ideas themselves are very ancient, and any survey of the history of philosophy will uncover numerous pantheist or pantheistically inclined thinkers; although it should also be noted that in many cases all that history has preserved for us are second-hand reportings of attributed doctrines, any reconstruction of which is too conjectural to provide much by way of philosophical illumination.
At its most general, pantheism may be understood either (a) positively, as the view that God is identical with the cosmos (i.e., the view that there exists nothing which is outside of God), or (b) negatively, as the rejection of any view that considers God as distinct from the universe.
However, given the complex and contested nature of the concepts involved, there is insufficient consensus among philosophers to permit the construction of any more detailed definition not open to serious objection from some quarter or other. Moreover, the label is a controversial one, where strong desires either to appropriate or to reject it often serve only to obscure the actual issues, and it would be a sad irony if pantheism revealed itself to be most like a traditional religion in its sectarian disputes over just what counts as ‘true pantheism.’ Therefore pantheism should not be thought of as a single codifiable position. Rather it should be understood as a diverse family of distinct doctrines; many of whom would be surprised—and, indeed, disconcerted—to find themselves regarded as members of a single household. Further, since the concept has porous and disputed boundaries there is no clear consensus on just who qualifies, no definitive roll-call of past pantheists. Given this situation the range of things that may be usefully said about all pantheisms is perhaps limited, but nonetheless a variety of concepts may be clarified, the nature of contentious issues explored, and the range of possible options more precisely mapped out.
- 1. Pantheism in religion, literature, and philosophy
- 2. Arguments for / drives towards pantheism
- 3. The logic of identity
- 4. Nature of the identity relation itself
- 5. The unity of the cosmos
- 6. The nature of the cosmos
- 7. The divinity of the cosmos
- 8. Evoking religious emotion
- 9. A place in the universe at large
- 10. The infinity / eternity / necessity of the universe
- 11. Ineffable
- 12. Personal
- 13. Value
- 14. Pantheism and the Problem of Evil
- 15. Pantheism and the distribution of value
- 16. Pantheism and ethics
- 17. Pantheism and religion
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1. Pantheism in religion, literature, and philosophy
There are several different ways to think about pantheism. (1) Many of the world’s religious traditions and spiritual writings are marked by pantheistic ideas and feelings. This is particularly so for example, in Hinduism of the Advaita Vedanta school, in some varieties of Kabbalistic Judaism, in Celtic spirituality, and in Sufi mysticism. (2) Another vital source of pantheistic ideas is to be found in literature, for example, in such writers as Goethe, Coleridge, Wordsworth, Emerson, Walt Whitman, D.H. Lawrence, and Robinson Jeffers. Although it should be added that, far from being limited to high culture, pantheistic themes are familiar, too, in popular media, for example in such films as Star Wars, Avatar, and The Lion King. (3) Thirdly, as it is in this article, pantheism may be considered philosophically; that is, a critical examination may be made of its central ideas with respect to their meaning, their coherence, and the case to be made for or against their acceptance.
2. Arguments for / drives towards pantheism
A good way to understand any view is to appreciate the kind of drives that may push someone towards it. What arguments may be given for pantheism? Although there are a great many different individual lines of reasoning that might be offered, generally they may be placed under two heads; arguments ‘from below’, which start from a posteriori religious experience, and arguments ‘from above’, which start from a priori philosophical abstraction.
Following the first type of argument, pantheistic belief arises when the things of this world excite a particular sort of religious reaction in us. We feel, perhaps, a deep reverence for and sense of identity with the world in which we find ourselves. Epistemically it seems to us that God is not distant but can be encountered directly in what we experience around us. We see God in everything. The initial focus of attention here may be either our physical environment (the land on which we live, our natural environment) or else our social environment (our community, our tribe, our nation or, generally, the people we meet with) but further reflection may lead to its more universal expansion.
In the second kind of argument, reasoning starts from a relatively abstract concept whose application is taken as assured, but further reflection leads to the conclusion that its scope must be extended to include the whole of reality. Most typically, the concept in question is that of ‘God’, or ‘perfect being’, in which case pantheism appears as the logical terminus or completion of theism. The following paragraphs illustrate four examples of such reasoning.
(1) Traditional theism asserts the omnipresence of God and, while it strongly wishes to maintain that this is not equivalent to pantheism, the difference between saying that God is present everywhere in everything and saying that God is everything is far from easy to explain. If omnipresence means, not simply that God is cognisant of or active in all places, but literally that he exists everywhere, then it is hard to see how any finite being can be said to have existence external to God. Indeed, for Isaac Newton and Samuel Clarke divine omnipresence was one and the same thing as space, which they understood as ‘the sensorium of God.’ (Oakes 2006)
(2) The traditional theistic position that God’s creation of the universe is continuous can easily be developed in pantheistic directions. The view that the world could not exist—even for a second—without God, makes it wholly dependent on God and, hence, not really an autonomous entity (Oakes 1983). Moreover, to further develop this argument, if God creates every temporal stage of every object in the universe, this undermines the causal power of individual things and leads to occasionalism, which in turn encourages pantheism; for in so far as independent agency is a clear mark of independent being, the occasionalist doctrine that all genuine agency is divine—that it all comes from a single place—tends to undermine the distinction of things from God. Both Malebranche and Jonathan Edwards have found themselves charged with pantheism on these grounds, and it was for this reason that Leibniz, in attempting to refute the pantheistic monism of Spinoza, felt it most important to assert the autonomous agency of finite beings.
(3) Alternatively it might be argued that God’s omniscience is indistinguishable from reality itself. For if there obtains a complete mapping between God’s knowledge and the world that God knows, what basis can be found for distinguishing between them, there being not even the possibility of a mismatch? Moreover, were we to separate the two, since knowledge tracks reality—we know something because it is the case and not vice versa—then God would become problematically dependent upon the world (Mander 2000).
(4) Arguments of this general type may also proceed from starting points more philosophical than theological. For example, Spinoza, the most famous of all modern pantheists starts from the necessary existence of something he calls ‘substance.’ By this he means that which exists wholly in its own right, that whose existence does not depend upon anything else. The notion of ‘the Absolute’, or wholly unconditioned reality, as it figures in the philosophies of Schelling, Hegel, and the British Idealists may be considered a related development of the same philosophical starting point. In both cases the reasoning runs that this necessary being must be all-inclusive and, hence, divine.
3. The logic of identity
The pantheist asserts an identity between God and nature, but it needs to be asked in just what sense we are to understand the term ‘identity’? To begin with it is necessary to raise two ambiguities in the logic of identity.
(1) Dialectical identity. It is important to note that many pantheists will not accept the classical logic of identity in which pairs are straightforwardly either identical or different. They may adopt rather the logic of relative identity, or identity-in-difference, by which it is possible to maintain that God and the cosmos are simultaneously both identical and different, or to put the matter in more theological language, that God is simultaneously both transcendent and immanent. For example, Eriugena holds that the universe may be subdivided into four categories: things which create but are not created, things which create and are created, things which are created but do not create, and things which neither create nor are created. He argues that all four reduce to God, and hence “that God is in all things, i.e. that he subsists as their essence. For He alone by Himself truly has being, and He alone is everything which is truly said to be in things endowed with being” (Periphyseon, 97). But nonetheless, for Eriugena, the uncreated retains its distinct status separate from the created, not least in that the former may be understood while the later transcends all understanding. In consequence, he insists that God is not the genus of which creatures are the species. Similarly, the Sufi philosopher, ibn ‘Arabi identifies God and the universe, suggesting in a striking metaphor that the universe is the food of God and God the food of the universe; as deity swallows up the cosmos so the cosmos swallows up deity. (Bezels of Wisdom, 237; Husaini 1970, 180) But Ibn ‘Arabi in no sense regards such claims as preventing him from insisting also on the fundamental gulf between the unknowable essence of God and his manifest being. We must distinguish between the nature of God and the nature of things, between that which exists by itself (God) and that which exist by another (the universe), but since the nature of God just is Being itself, no parallel distinction may be drawn between the being of God and the being of things. Nothing real exists besides God who discloses himself in and through the universe (Chittick 1989, ch.5). Again, Nicholas of Cusa’s celebrated doctrine of the ‘coincidence of opposites’—which he memorably illustrated by pointing to way in which, upon infinite expansion, a circle must coincide with a straight line—allows him to say both that God and the creation are the same thing and that there exists a fundamental distinction between the realm of absolute being and the realm of limited or contracted being (Moran 1990). Even Spinoza goes to great lengths to show that the two attributes of thought and extension by which we pick out the one substance as ‘God’ or ‘nature’ are nonetheless at the same time irreducibly different. They may be co-referring but they are not synonymous; indeed, they are utterly incommensurable. Such a dialectical conception of unity, in which there can be no identity without difference, is a strong element in Hegel’s thought, and also one aspect of what Hartshorne meant by dipolar theism; the opposites of immanence and transcendence are included among those which he thinks God brings together in his being.
(2) Partial Identity. Even accepting a classical conception of identity and difference, there remain issues to settle. If we think of pantheism negatively as a rejection of the view that God is distinct from the cosmos, we would face four possible schemes by which we might represent their mereological relation: we might understand God as proper part of nature, we might take nature as a proper part of God, we might regard the two domains as partially overlapping, or else we might hold that they are strictly identical.
Reflecting upon the ambiguities of the previous two paragraphs, it might be argued that only where we find strict classical identity do we have pantheism. For if the universe is not wholly divine we have mere immanentism, while if God includes but is not exhausted by the universe then we have rather panentheism. Now, certainly it may be allowed there are metaphysical schemes for which the range of overlap between divinity and the cosmos is so small that they fail to capture the spirit of pantheism. (For example, a world-view in which God were understood as the vital spark which animates an otherwise dead and motionless cosmos, or a world-view in which the cosmos were merely one small fraction of the being of God would indeed seem far from the spirit of pantheism.) However, to limit the term’s application to just those schemes advancing strict classical identity would be far too restrictive.
Such ‘strict identity’ is virtually impossible to define due to the extreme difficulty of stipulating what would count as an acceptable and what as an unacceptable sense, part, aspect, or element of difference. For example, Aquinas distinguishes between the doctrine that God is the form of all things (‘formal pantheism’) and the doctrine that God is the matter of all things (‘material pantheism’) (Moran 1989, 86). Does either of these count as pantheism ‘proper’, or must both obtain at the same time? Again, while some pantheists conceive of deity in mereological terms as the collection of things which make up the universe, many others have found this approach inadequate, maintaining that in some important sense ‘the whole is greater than the sum of its parts.’ The finite things that we encounter around us and are happy enough to describe as parts of nature we feel less happy to think of as parts of God. Such theorists may also reject the charge that their way of thinking is panentheistic, maintaining that the proper lesson to draw is not one of the transcendence of the holistic view but rather one concerning the degree of unreality or abstraction involved in any distributed view. In short, does any admission of difference between the world as common-sense experiences it and the divine cosmos as pantheism understands it amount to a concession either that there are aspects of experience which fall outside deity or aspects of deity which fall outside experience? If so, then the class of ‘true pantheists’ threatens to become null. In the end, rather than attempt to draw sharp but artificial and contentious lines it seems more fruitful to maintain that the boundaries of demarcation between immanence, pantheism, and panentheism are vague and porous.
This approach has the further advantage of keeping together historically cognate thinkers. If the essence of pantheism lies in strict classical identity, the issue of who is or is not a pantheist comes down to the somewhat arcane dispute whether there could be any conceivable aspect or side of reality which was not natural, and/or whether there could be any conceivable aspect or side of reality which was not divine, but these are abstruse points that can only take us away from the fundamental pantheistic intuition of the overlap of God and nature, the intuition that that in grasping the reality before us we grasp God himself, not something separate or intermediary.
4. Nature of the identity relation itself
To say that God is identical with the world as a whole is not self-explanatory and, although often the matter is left disconcertingly vague, examination of the literature reveals a variety of different understandings of the identity relation being asserted here.
(1) Substance identity. For Spinoza the claim that God is the same as the cosmos is spelled out as the thesis that there exists one and only one particular substance which he refers to as ‘God or nature’; the individual thing referred to as ‘God’ is one and the same object as the complex unit referred to as ‘nature’ or ‘the cosmos.’ On such a scheme the finite things of the world are thought of as something like parts of the one great substance, although the terminology of parts is somewhat problematic. Parts are relatively autonomous from the whole and from each other, and Spinoza’s preferred terminology of modes, which are to be understood as more like properties, is chosen to rectify this. A further problem with the terminology of parts is that many pantheists have wanted to claim that God or nature is not just the whole or totality of things, but is somehow the inner essence or heart of each individual thing. This may be expressed in the idea that somehow the whole is present in each of its parts, a suggestion whose meaning has often been left metaphorical or obscure. Giordano Bruno, for example employs the two illustrations of a voice heard in its entirety from all sides of the room, and that of a large mirror which reflects one image of one thing but which, if it is broken into a thousand pieces, each of the pieces still reflects the whole image (Bruno 1584, 50, 129). A thesis of the complete interpenetration or interrelation of everything, the claim being made here is related to that defended by Leibniz (who was not a pantheist) that each monad is a mirror to the entire universe.
In Western philosophy Spinoza’s formulation of the pantheistic position has become so influential as to almost completely define the position, but while practically all pantheists are monists (of some sort), not all are substance monists, and there do exist alternative ways of expressing identity besides a head-count of the number of particular entities.
(2) Being itself. There is a long theological tradition in which God is regarded as being itself, rather than as one being among others, and insofar as it treats God as something to be found inseparable from and at the very root of all that is, such a conception may be used to express pantheism. While a conceptual distinction may be drawn between ‘the totality of beings’ and ‘being itself,’ it is clear that neither of these could have any reality except in and through the other. The identification of God with being itself is a common Christian view, from Augustine to Tillich, but it is not exclusive to Christian thought. For example, Ibn ‘Arabi, in developing the Koranic notion of tawhīd (God’s unity), asserts that there can be no real being other than God; that God permeates through all beings and is essentially all things. Especially among his followers this was developed into a monistic ontology of wahdat al-wujūd (the unity of being).
(3) Identity of origin. A third way to express the identity of God and nature is by reference to the thought that all things come from God, rendering them both identical with each other and with the one source from which they came. It is important in this connection to discuss the difference between such notions as emanation, expression, or instantiation and the more specifically theistic conception of creation ex nihilo, for given the plausibility of supposing that what ‘flows forth’ or ‘radiates out’ from a source is only latent within that stem, traditional theists have often insisted on creation ex nihilo precisely to drive a wedge between creator and created and thereby rule out pantheism. But although it would be tempting to contrast creation ex nihio as theistic and emanation as pantheistic, such thoughts are probably too simple. Plotinus’ universe comprises in a hierarchy of emanations from what he terms, the ‘One’; but as neither anything in the cosmos nor the sum of all things in the cosmos, as an ideal construction from which all expressions fall short, Plotinus’ God is really too transcendent for his doctrine to count as pantheism proper. Eriugena, by contrast, has an emanation-theory that is more genuinely pantheist but, given his apophatic conception of God as marked by both being and non-being, he regards this position as wholly compatible with the doctrine of creation ex nihilo. To Eriugena, God is precisely the nothing from which all things were made. Spinoza approaches the question of origin from a rather different angle. Arguing that God is the immanent cause of all things, he draws an important distinction between natura naturans and natura naturata; between the universe considered in active mode as cause and the very same universe considered in passive mode as effect (Ethics 1p29s). This is an important doctrine not least for the way in which it links with necessity. Modelled more on the way in which the theorems of geometry derive from its axioms than on the sense in which a work of art results from the free or spontaneous activity of its artist, pantheistic creation of this second type courts a determinism that threatens to rule out free will. And that has been a very common objection to pantheism.
(4) Teleological Identity. Religious world views in which it is the ultimate destiny or purpose of the cosmos to achieve oneness with or to fully express deity provide a fourth model for understanding pantheistic claims of identity. The true identity of the universe is that which is revealed at the end of all things. For example, on the Absolute Idealist scheme, history culminates in the complete realization of God or Absolute spirit in the world and so, as Schelling put it, in the last days “God will indeed be all in all, and pantheism will be true” (Schelling 1810, 484). A rather different example of this type of thinking is that of Samuel Alexander who thinks that the universe evolves in a steadily progressive manner and will finally ‘attain deity’, where deity is thought of as an unknown but superior quality that will ‘emerge’ from the complex whole in rather the same way as, at a lower level, consciousness ‘emerges’ from complex organisations of organic matter. By way of objection to such teleological conception of identity it might be challenged that something can only become merged with God, or become God, if it is now different from God. But against this it could be replied that, if the notion of teleology be taken seriously, a thing more truly is what it is destined to become than what it currently seems to be, for everything about it is to be explained in terms of its telos or goal. It may also be responded that anything which can be converted into God cannot be finally different from God. Hence Alexander, for example, is clear that since all potentiality must be grounded in some actuality there is also a sense in which the universe is already implicitly God: “God as actually possessing deity does not exist but is an ideal, is always becoming; but God as the whole universe tending towards deity does exist” (Alexander 1921, 428).
5. The unity of the cosmos
At least as usually understood the two terms ‘nature’ and ‘God’ have different and contrasting meanings. If they are identified, it follows that one or both words are being used in a different way than usual; that nature is more like God than commonly thought and/or that God is more like nature than commonly thought. With respect to the cosmos this may be seen in the stress pantheists typically put on the unity of the cosmos.
A distinction may be drawn between distributive pantheism, the view that each thing in the cosmos is divine, and collective pantheism, the view that the cosmos as a whole is divine (Oppy, 1994). And if polytheism in general is coherent there is no reason in principle why we should exclude the possibility of a distributive pantheism. But as in pursuit of explanatory unity and coherence belief in many Gods tends historically to give way to belief in single deity, while it would be technically possible to identify the universe with a collection of deities, in practice monism tends to win out, and it has been characteristic of pantheists to stress heavily the unity of nature. Thus pantheism typically asserts a two-fold identity: as well as the unity of God and nature, it urges the unity of all things with each other.
It may be asked whether a statement of the world’s unity is a precondition for asserting its identity with God, or a consequence of asserting it? Is the intuition that the cosmos constitutes a single integrated whole a contributory factor in thinking it divine, or (reflecting the traditional idea that God is unique and simple or without parts) is the intuition that it is divine the reason for regarding it as such a unity?
The kind of unity which the pantheist thinks to find in nature can vary from a very strong metaphysical oneness, like that of Parmenides, which excludes all diversity or difference, to a much looser systematic complex of distinct but inter-related elements, but the four species of unity most commonly defended are: (1) the unity of all that falls within the spatio-temporal continuum under a common set of physical laws, (2) the reductive unity of a single material out of which all objects are made and within which no non-arbitrary divisions can be made, (3) the unity of a living organism, or (4) the more psychological unity of a spirit, mind or person.
6. The nature of the cosmos
Besides commitment to the view that the cosmos as a whole is divine, pantheists as a general class hold no specific theory about the nature of that cosmos. There are three main traditions.
(1) Physicalism. Many pantheists argue that physical conceptions are adequate to explain the entire cosmos. This is an ancient form of pantheism, found for example in the Stoics, for whom only bodies can be said to exist. Soul they understood as nothing more than a specific form of pneuma, or breath, the active power to be found throughout nature. This is also a form of pantheism popular today—often termed, scientific or naturalistic pantheism. Such worldviews make no ontological commitments beyond those sanctioned by empirical science.
(2) Idealism. During the nineteenth century, when pantheism was at its most popular, the dominant form was idealist. According to Absolute Idealism, as defended by such figures as Fichte, Schelling, Hegel, and many of the British Idealists, all that exists is a single spiritual entity, of which the physical world must be understood as a partial manifestation. The search for that which may be asserted without condition or qualification leads to the conclusion that all variety is the expression of an underlying unity, and that nothing can be real in the absence of mind or spirit. On some versions of this sort of doctrine the physical world starts to look more like an appearance of the ultimate spiritual (or possibly unknown) reality beneath. Hegel himself rejects this sort of doctrine —which he terms acosmism—and while it certainly amounts to a view that there exists nothing besides God, in view of its basic denial of the reality of the world we all experience it hardly seems like a kind of pantheism.
(3) Dual-aspect theory. The pantheism of Spinoza is of neither these types. For Spinoza, there is one thing which expresses itself, or which may be understood, in two different ways, either as thinking substance or as extended substance. The principle difficulty of any such position is to further specify that ambiguous relationship, whilst simultaneously avoiding the twin but opposed pitfalls of reductionism and dualism.
Pantheists holds that whatever exists falls within God. This places them in disagreement with any theory of the supernatural. But such opposition must not be misunderstood, for to say that there is no supernatural realm is not in itself to delineate the range of what is natural. This is important, for while many contemporary pantheists have been epistemologically conservative, there is no reason in principle why the pantheist should oppose the idea of that which is epistemically transcendent to us, no reason (that is) why he should seek to limit the compass of the universe to the known universe. For example, Spinoza held, not only that the realms of thought and extension must stretch indefinitely beyond our finite grasp, but that, as well as in the two known realms of thought and extension, the one substance must exist also in an infinity of other dimensions completely beyond our power to conceive.
7. The divinity of the cosmos
One of the strongest and most commonly raised objections to pantheism is that it is simply inappropriate to call the universe ‘God’. Thus Schopenhauer complains that “Pantheism is only a euphemism for atheism,” for “to call the world God is not to explain it; it is only to enrich our language with a superfluous synonym for the word world” (Schopenhauer 1851, I:114, II:99). It has been described as nothing more than ‘materialism grown sentimental,’ (Illingworth 1898, 69) while more recently Richard Dawkins in The God Delusion complains that “Pantheism is sexed-up Atheism” (Dawkins 2007, 40). It is clear that the more naturalistically the cosmos is conceived the stronger that objection must seem, but to estimate more carefully its validity the following six sections take in turn a number of characteristics which the cosmos possesses or might possess and which could be thought to make it divine. We may proceed from the least to the most contested, noting that not all pantheists will agree on all marks.
8. Evoking religious emotion
Most straightforwardly it has been maintained that the One is holy because we feel a particular set of religious emotions towards it (Levine 1994, ch.2.2). For Rudolf Otto (1917), whatever is holy or ‘numinous’ is so characterised on the basis of our non-rational, non-sensory experience of it rather than its own objective features and, taking its departure from Otto’s work, one approach has been to argue that the feelings of awe which people feel towards God can be, and often are, applied to the universe itself. Whether it is really possible, or appropriate, to entertain such feelings towards the cosmos as a whole will be discussed below, but the chief point to make here concerns the extreme subjectivism of this response; it’s coming to rest upon feelings which, while sincere enough, indicate nothing whatsoever about the universe itself. On this view, all that distinguishes a pantheist from an atheist is feeling; a certain emotional reaction or connection that we feel to the universe. It would become akin, say, to the difference between one who loves art and another who is relatively indifferent to it. Prima facie, however, this approach puts the cart before the horse; rather than say that the One is divine because we feel a set of religious emotions towards it, it seems more appropriate to suppose that we feel those emotions towards it because we think it is divine.
9. A place in the universe at large
Religion gives meaning to human lives by assigning them a certain definite place within a grander scheme or narrative. It gives its adherents a sense of their part in a coherent universe. It tells us that the universe is not a random conjunction of brute facts, but a whole in which we have our proper location. The pantheist may regard the cosmos as divine for very similar reasons. To think of oneself as part of a vast interconnected scheme may give one a sense of being ‘at home in the universe.’ Here ecological thinking may come to the fore; like the individual creatures in a complex ecosystem, small but vital contributors to a larger whole, we too may be thought to have our place in the connected whole that is Nature.
10. The infinity / eternity / necessity of the universe
Historically the majority of pantheists have regarded the universe as Infinite, metaphysically perfect, necessarily existent, and eternal (or some subset thereof) and—taking these attributes as the characteristic marks of divinity—that has formed one very important reason for thinking that the universe itself is in fact God.
In more recent times, however, there have arisen naturalistic or scientific forms of pantheism which reject or are neutral about these characteristics and, while they remove one important set of reasons for thinking the cosmos divine, so long as others remain, the amputation in itself seems insufficient reason to refuse the label ‘pantheist’ to such views. Any methodology which limits itself to empirical science will presumably find it hard to attribute anything like infinitude or necessary existence to the cosmos, while approaches which do find a role for such features will need to be careful that they understand them in an appropriate fashion. (For example, it is doubtful that mere infinite extent, or infinite divisibility, in space and time would be sufficient to merit that the universe be called divine.) But with these caveats aside the pantheist is not without arguments for believing that the universe as a whole displays marks of metaphysical perfection.
The earliest arguments for such a view are to be found in the pre-Socratic philosopher Anaximander who held that the universe emerges from what he termed ‘to apeiron,’ a complex notion which may be rendered as the infinite, the boundless or the indefinite. Anaximander’s thought seems to have been that the ground by which all qualitative characteristics are explained must itself lack any determination. Insofar as we can construct his reasons, he argued that some such boundless potentiality was need to ensure the continual coming to be and passing away in the world that characterises the passing of time. As something thus immortal and indestructible, Anaximander concluded that the infinite was also divine (Aristotle, Physics, 203b).
It is notable that much of the same reasoning that theists employ in the Kalaam cosmological argument for the existence of God may be used for the universe itself. If we inquire into the origin of the universe, it may be suggested (1) that it simply began without reason, (2) that it was somehow self-creating, or (3) that its origin requires a prior cause which in turn calls for an infinite causal chain. Each of these answers has sufficient problems such that one might well prefer to argue instead, (4) that the universe in fact exists necessarily.
But perhaps the most commonly used argument among pantheists has been the ontological argument. As employed by classical theism this line of argument has been much criticised, but the forms in which it has been put forward by pantheists (such as Spinoza and Hegel) are interestingly different. On their way of thinking, the more perfect an idea becomes the less room there remains for any gap between it and its instantiation, but no idea becomes perfect simply by defining itself to be so. This can be shown only by a full development of its content amounting to nothing less than a complete philosophical system (Harrelson 2009).
A fourth feature commonly taken to mark the divinity of God is his ineffability. If he is so much greater than anything else, anything we say of him would limit or falsify him, so we can speak at best in negatives, or simply conclude that he is an ineffable mystery. It would be hard to think of a line of reasoning less congenial to the rationalist spirit that has characterised many pantheists, for example scientific pantheism.
At the same time it must be allowed that there is a strong apophatic streak in much pantheism. In contrast to his teacher, Thales, who thought it possible to specify the ground of all things as water, for Anaximander the one source from which cosmos comes forth (to apeiron) is construed precisely in terms of its resistance to any determinate characterisation, while both Eriugena and Ibn ‘Arabi stress that although the God of which we can speak is identical with the cosmos, there remains another sense in which we cannot speak of God at all. The essence of God considered in himself, the universal ground of being cannot itself be captured by any of the limited categories which flow out from it. Even Spinoza suggests that the highest stages of knowledge consist in a form of intuitive insight, which transcends mere reasoning or conceptual knowledge in that it enables us to grasp the essence of individual things. Part of what he calls ‘the intellectual love of God’, such scientia intuitiva is itself assigned a salvific role in Spinoza’s thought; it is the path to human blessedness.
Einstein was a pantheist but rejected any notion of a personal God
(Einstein 2010, 325). And like Einstein, for many pantheists rejection
of a personal deity is the definitive mark or most important element
of their position (Levine 1994; Harrison 2004). However, the matter
calls for more considered attention.
It is important to distinguish between the specific question of whether God is literally a ‘person’ and the more general question whether God is ‘person-like’; the issue of whether notions such as intellect, thought, consciousness, intent, etc. have any application to the divine, even if analogical or metaphorical. It should also be recognised both that the notion of personhood is itself deeply problematic, and that a not inconsiderable number of traditional theists would only with considerable qualification be prepared to allow that God is personal.
These points made, while it is true that traditional theism has regularly opposed pantheism on the grounds that it tends to be impersonal, and true also that many pantheists would deny that God is personal, it is nonetheless the case that many other pantheists have thought mind-like attribution of some form or other to the cosmos absolutely central to their position.
It is clear that pantheistic systems which start from the theistic God which they then find to be all-inclusive, or Absolute Idealist systems which derive all reality from a spiritual principle, will find it easier to attribute something like personhood to the cosmos than will those which are more naturalistically motivated. But it is important to realise that not even the latter are wholly resistant to personhood.
For example, it has been argued (Baltzly 2003) that the Stoics believed in a personal deity. Just as they construed human beings as physical creatures animated by a physical soul, so too they regarded God as the mind of the world—with the cosmos as his body. Like a vast biological individual, to them God was a conscious rational being, exercising providence over life and to whom we might approach in prayer.
Spinoza’s God is an “infinite intellect”, (Ethics 2p11c) all knowing, (2p3) and capable of loving both himself—and us, insofar as we are part of his perfection (5p35c). And if the mark of a personal being is that it is one towards which we can entertain personal attitudes, then we should note too that Spinoza recommends amor intellectualist dei (the intellectual love of God) as the supreme good for man (5p33). However, the matter is complex. Spinoza’s God does not have free will (1p32c1), he does not have purposes or intentions (1appendix), and Spinoza insists that “neither intellect nor will pertain to the nature of God” (1p17s1). Moreover, while we may love God, we need to remember that God is really not the kind of being who could ever love us back. “He who loves God cannot strive that God should love him in return,” says Spinoza (5p19).
Another notable pantheist to insist that the supreme being is personal was Gustav Fechner, who develops a form of panpsychism according to which all organised matter must be thought of as possessing its own inner life or soul. The more complex and developed its structure, the more sophisticated its spiritual life; from the lowest soul-life of plants, through our own mental life, which is just the inner side of our bodies, through the soul-life of the planets and stars up to the most developed spirit of all, God, the consciousness which corresponds to the most complex organism there is, the cosmos itself. More recently, a very similar view has been put forward by Timothy Sprigge who maintains that that the only conceivable form of reality consists in streams of experience, such as we know ourselves to be, all of which must be thought of as included together within a single all-embracing experience; which we may call God or the Absolute. Sprigge, however, is more cautious than Fechner insofar as he declines to identify any physical systems other than those of animals (including human beings) that can confidently be said to possess their own inner conscious life (Sprigge 2006, ch.9). Against the idea that God is some type of all-embracing spirit or person it is often complained that this would undermine the autonomous personhood of finite individuals; for can one person be part of another? Fechner suggests as a model for understanding this the way in which our different sense modalities (sight, smell, touch, etc), each inaccessible to each other, combine together into one unified consciousness (Fechner 1946, 144). While to extend such a model beyond the merely receptive to the active aspects of personhood, we might think of the way in which the agency of an organisation is exercised through the agency of its individual members. Here several pantheists have been influenced by Christian ideas of the indwelling spirit of God at work within the body of the Church.
Sixthly (and perhaps most importantly of all) it is widely thought that the most important thing about God—thing that most makes us call him ‘God’—is his perfection or goodness. God is a being ‘worthy of worship.’ Can the pantheist say this of the cosmos as a whole? A variety of positions are possible. (1) Any pantheistic world-view arrived at by extending the reach of the traditional theistic God will find it relatively easy to assert the same value to the cosmos that it attributed to God, but there are other possibilities as well. (2) Insofar as the pantheist assertion of unity may be understood as an assertion of complete and coherent integration, and disvalue held to lie in conflict, disharmony or incompleteness, then it may be possible to argue that the culmination of metaphysical unity constitutes also the culmination of value. For example, the Absolute Idealist Bernard Bosanquet states, “We cannot describe perfection; that is, we cannot enumerate its components and state their form and connection in detail. But we can define its character as the harmony of all being. And good is perfection in its character of satisfactoriness; that which is considered as the end of conations and the fruition of desires” (Bosanquet 1913,194). (3) More naturalistically, it might be suggested than pantheism tells us that nature is our proper home and, as such, our proper good. Everything has its place in a wider system which both supports it and to which it contributes. As natural creatures our most fulfilling life is found in and at one with nature. (4) Lastly, it should be noted that many scientific pantheists argue that nature has no intrinsic value whatsoever. It is merely something that we happen to love and venerate in the highest degree.
14. Pantheism and the Problem of Evil
Historically one of the strongest and most persistent objections to pantheism is that, because of its all-encompassing nature, it seems inhospitable to the differentiations of value that characterise life. In what might be thought of as a pantheistic version of the problem of evil, it is challenged that if God includes everything and God is perfect or good, then everything which exists ought to be perfect or good; a conclusion which seems wholly counter to our common experience that much in the world is very far from being so. Or to put the argument slightly differently, if whatever we do or however things turn out must be deemed the action of God, how can our pantheistic belief demand of us any specific duty? The only alternative conclusion, if we wish to hold on to the difference between what is good and what is bad, would seem to be equally unattractive claim that a universe containing both values, in itself possesses neither; the pantheistic deity in its own being lies beyond good and evil.
To point out that classical theism faces its own difficulties over evil and God’s providence, while it may level the playing field, does nothing in itself to help solve the puzzle, and pantheists themselves have suggested a variety of explanations or theodicies. (1) The most popular model for dealing with evil is found in the philosophy of Spinoza who regards both error and evil as distortions that result from the fragmentary view of finite creatures; phenomena real enough to the finite beings who experience them but which would disappear in the widest and final vision of God. In this he was, of course, developing the Stoic sense that if we could see the world as God does, as the perfectly harmonious embodiment of the logos, we would recognise how its apparent defects in fact contribute to the goodness of the whole. (2) It may be responded also that the objection that pantheism councils moral indifference is based on a modal confusion, comparable to that made by the proponent of logical determinism. If pantheism amounts to a doctrine of providence, it is true that what actually happens will be for the best, but it certainly does not follow from that that whatever else might have happened would have been for the best, and it possible that part at least of the perfection of the cosmos comes about through our own individual moral choices.
15. Pantheism and the distribution of value
Although not all pantheists ascribe intrinsic value to the cosmos as a whole, insofar as they do, that might be thought give rise to something of a puzzle. For if God is valuable and God is identical to the universe then we might seem committed to the somewhat implausible thought that everything in the universe is equally valuable; a leveling off which gave rise to Coleridge’s complaint that ‘everything God’ and ‘no God’ are in effect identical positions (Coleridge 1839, 224). The pantheist need not be committed to this view, however, for the fact that a certain feature or element is present in everything by no means entails that it is equally present in everything. Although the universe as a whole may be divine, there is no need to regard each bit of it as uniformly divine; no need (for example) to feel quite the same about the loss of biological species as we do about the disappearance of human cultures and languages. Historically, there have been two main ways in which pantheists have regarded the distribution of value in the universe.
(1) Emphasis on nature. Most typically pantheism is characterized by deep love and reverence for the natural world insofar as it exists independently of human culture or civilization. The pantheist finds God more in the waterfall or the rainforest than in the car park or the gasworks. From the romantic period onwards this is a very strong drive in both literary and popular pantheism, with urban and technological life regarded as at best a kind of self-interested anthropocentric distortion of true value and at worst even a kind of loss or separation from divinity.
If uncultivated nature is divine then the pantheist may legitimately conclude that it should be treated with respect, even as sacred. Such is the import of Aldo Leopold’s ‘land ethic’ (1949) or the ‘deep ecology’ of Arne Næss, (1973) and many modern pantheists have developed close connections with environmentalism. But neither the import nor the justification of such ideas are straightforward. It might be suggested that as no one person ought to put their own interests before another, neither ought any species to put itself ahead of another, nor the sentient ahead of the insentient, nor the living ahead of the non-living. But with each further step this argument becomes harder to press, due to the extreme difficulty of identifying—and weighing—such potentially conflicting interests. For example, unless the pantheist is some sort of panpsychist, he will not regard natural objects such as rivers or mountains as possessing sentience, purpose or interests of its own; which means that treating them with respect cannot be modelled on what it means to treat people or animals with respect.
(2) Emphasis on humanity. A second and very different model for understanding the relationship between divinity and value maintains that God is most revealed in human culture and history. For the Stoics, Reason or logos—the essence of the world—though it underlies all things, is more strongly manifest in some (such as human life) than in others, while the virtues of stoic detachment and self-sufficiency preclude our true good being held hostage to the state of anything external to ourselves, such as nature. This pair of attitudes is summed up in Cicero’s notorious assertion that all things were made for either Gods or men (Holland 1997, Baltzly 2003). But probably the best illustration of this more anthropocentric way of thinking about value is the Hegelian system, in which Geist —the spirit whose manifestation is the universe—articulates itself in a developmental sequence of increasingly adequate expressions (which may or may not also be temporal) up from the most basic abstractions of merely physical nature, through the organic realm, up to its apex in the concrete details of social and cultural life. The beauties of nature are valued as an approximation to those of art, and the development of ethical life (Sittlichkeit) is literally “the march of God in the world” (Hegel 1821, 247).
16. Pantheism and ethics
If, as we have suggested, there is room for value in pantheism then there is room for ethics. But does pantheism prescribe any specific ethics? There are two respects in which pantheism might be thought to have significant ethical implications.
Firstly, for pantheism, there is no higher power, no external authority to tell us what to do. Insofar as it rejects any sense of a transcendent external lawgiver or—to put the matter more positively—insofar as it regards deity as the distributed possession of all, pantheism may be represented as endorsing the Kantian doctrine of the autonomy of ethical judgement. But the implications of this are open. It can lead to either democratic communitarian ethics or to individualism. Paradoxically, it might equally well result in a species of conservative conformity to whatever is deemed to be the ‘natural state’ of the world every bit as stifling to the human spirit as conformity to whatever is deemed to be ‘the will of God.’
Secondly, it may be argued that pantheism is able to give a particularly strong ground for an ethic of altruism or compassion. To Schopenhauer (with whom this argument is particularly associated) only genuinely altruistic or compassionate actions have moral worth, but only pleasure and pain are capable of motivating the will, from which he concludes that genuinely moral action is possible only if the pleasure and pain of others can stir us to action as directly and immediately as can our own pleasure and pain. It is not enough that we sympathetically imagine ourselves in their shoes, he argues; we must literally feel the pleasure and pain of others as our own, an attitude that will be rationally grounded only in a monistic metaphysics in which the distinction between ego and not ego becomes a trivial or illusory distinction between two manifestations of the same underlying unity. (Schopenhauer 1839). Schopenhauer includes nonhuman animals in this argument. To the charge that what is defended here remains but a species of egoism—metaphysically enlarged, but still morally worthless—it may be replied that self-concern is to be deprecated only insofar as it is something that exists in contrast with concern for others (a contrast which no longer finds any purchase in this scheme).
17. Pantheism and religion
Religion is a form of life, not a philosophical theory. Thus theism is not itself a religion, although it lies at the core of many religions, and neither is pantheism itself a religion, although a core of pantheistic belief has unquestionably grounded the religion of many people.
No doubt many pantheists self-consciously and deliberately reject theism, while many theists strongly reject pantheism. But to conclude from this that pantheism should be understood as essentially opposed to theism would seem precipitous (like concluding mutual incompatibility from the fact that many Christians oppose socialism and many socialists oppose Christianity). Without being drawn into doctrinal questions well outside the purview of this essay, two points may be made. Many philosophers who have put forward pantheist beliefs have thought there was no need for anyone who accepted them to abandon traditional religion (for example, Spinoza, Hegel, or Edward Caird—who argues that “the religious consciousness is not the consciousness of another object than that which is present in finite experience and science, but simply a higher way of knowing the same object,” (1892, 464) but whom nonetheless considered himself Christian.) From the other side, many committed theologians have advanced positions with deeply pantheistic implications (e.g. the ‘Christian Pantheism’ of Teilhard de Chardin or the ‘Ethical Pantheism’ of Albert Schweitzer.)
It is sometimes objected that pantheism cannot really be religious on the grounds that it can make no sense to direct at the cosmos the religious attitudes and emotions—worship, love, gratitude—which are more normally directed towards a person (Levine 1994, 315). (This is, of course, to assume that the pantheistic God is not personal; a claim which, as we have seen, many pantheists would reject.) Worship is commonly an expression of dependence on a personal creator God, but, even if we don’t approve of their doing so, people worship many other things, such as money, fashion, the State, or idols, without necessarily assuming that these have residing within them some conscious spirit or other. Love is more usually felt towards people, but Wordsworth described himself as a ‘lover of nature’ (Tintern Abbey) while Byron thought it possible to love his country but not his countrymen (Byron 1854, 25). We typically thank a person, but it is possible also to feel gratitude which transcends any feeling to particular individuals to an institution (such as a college, community, or even State) which has nurtured you. In each case there remains room for doubt whether these attitudes are really equivalent to the sort of emotions more typically associated with religion, but equally it is hard to see on what legitimate grounds emotions might excluded from consideration as ‘not properly religious.’
In most religions prayer is not simply the expression of worship, love, and gratitude, but an act in which we petition the deity for intercession. We can petition the theistic God, but can we petition the universe itself? Most pantheists have thought not, but where the cosmos is conceived as personal, or at least moral, room may exist to develop such ideas. Construing the entire universe as a conscious being, Fechner argues that it makes perfect sense to petition it; the only difference being that normal requests must be expressed since the object to which they are directed lies outside of us, but in the case of God this is unnecessary since we exist already within him (Fechner 1946, 242–6). Even if not personal, so long as it could be said that the universe exhibits a moral narrative structure there is no reason to insist that that structure be independent of the moral needs or requests of creatures within it (Mander 2007).
A common mark of religion is its soteriological character, its recognition that the human condition is somehow unsatisfactory or ‘fallen’ and its offer to overcome this state through a process of human transformation, be the result of that renovation enduring happiness or some more elevated state of blessedness or nirvana. Can pantheism respond to this? Can it offer the believer hope for a better life?
If all that is hoped for is the well-being that comes from a more ethical mode of existence, then pantheism is perfectly able to offer this, supporting a value system which eschews selfishness in favour of a wider concern. For example the American poet Robinson Jeffers suggests that “there is peace, freedom, I might say a kind of salvation, in turnings one’s affections outwards towards this one God, rather than inwards on one’s self, or on humanity” (Jeffers 2009, 365) But some other pantheists have sought to offer something further. Pantheist systems with a teleological structure (such as those discussed in Section Four above) readily lend themselves to soteriology on a grand scale; for example, while to Spinoza the highest state of human happiness consists in the intellectual love of God (a state not dissimilar to the Beatific Vision), Hegel outlines a developmental scheme whose climax consists in the full and explicit self-manifestation of God.
In many traditional religions salvation has been linked to immortality. Against this, it has been common among pantheists to argue that what is distinctive about pantheism is precisely its disavowal of any hope for personal immortality. However, some have argued that a measure of endurance may be found in so far as we recognize our real identity with, either the eternal universe (for example, Schopenhauer 1851, 267–82) or, perhaps more specifically with the ongoing life of our community (for example, John Caird 1880). A small number of pantheistic thinkers have attempted to develop more genuinely personal senses of immortality. For example, Spinoza controversially claims that “The human mind cannot be absolutely destroyed with the body, but something of it remains which is eternal” (Ethics e5p23). Josiah Royce, in his early Absolute Idealist phase, attempted to argue that if our finite will, which in this life is never quite satisfied, is itself but a part of a greater infinite will that is eternally satisfied, then that can only mean that we must find our share of that satisfaction “in a life that is not this present mortal life” (Royce 1906, 147).
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- Levine, Michael, “Pantheism”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2012/entries/pantheism/>. [This was the previous entry on pantheism in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy—see the version history.]
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