Analytic Philosophy in Latin America

First published Mon Oct 8, 2018

Analytic philosophy was introduced in Latin America in the mid-twentieth century. Its development has been heterogeneous in the different countries of the region, but has reached today a considerable degree of maturity and originality. There is now a strong community working within the analytic tradition in Latin America.

1. Some Geographical and Theoretical Boundaries

Analytic philosophy was introduced in Latin America in the mid-twentieth century, though it did not spread easily throughout the region. This entry gives an historical overview of analytic philosophy produced in Latin America, and not about Latin America; it encompasses philosophical developments concerning the most diverse and universal problems that are at the heart of Western philosophy. Given the vast number of individuals, institutions, journals and issues that coexist in this geographical area of the analytic tradition, we must begin by specifying some of the boundaries of this work.

First, the entry focuses on the ideas of philosophers who have developed their research and teaching practice for most of their lives in a Latin American country (instead of taking the country of origin as a criterion). One feature of Latin American intellectuals is that many have had to emigrate to other countries within or outside of the region, in many cases due to political reasons, in other cases for economic reasons, and in a few cases for personal reasons. For reasons of space those philosophers with Latin American roots who developed their philosophical work outside this area will be excluded.[1]

Second, this entry will not discuss the contemporary history of the topic, as it is still evolving. As mentioned above, analytic philosophy was introduced in the mid-twentieth century, initially in Argentina and Mexico, then to a lesser extent in Brazil. The first analytic philosophers in the region carried out extensive didactic work that has left generations of professional philosophers working within the tradition. As the research is ongoing, it is impossible to mention all the people currently working within this tradition in Latin America. See the Other Internet Resources for links to relevant Associations.

Finally, it is important to delineate what will be considered within the scope of analytic philosophy for the present work. Our consideration of analytic philosophy is not limited to work involving conceptual analysis. Indeed, as Ezcurdia (2015) maintains, not all philosophers who consider themselves analytic adopt this method, and those who do disagree about the way in which it should be understood. Rabossi (1975) defends the idea that analytic philosophy can be identified by considering certain family resemblances. He suggests the following family traits: a positive attitude toward scientific knowledge; a cautious attitude toward metaphysics; a conception of philosophy as a conceptual task, which takes conceptual analysis as a method; a close relationship between language and philosophy; a concern with seeking argumentative answers to philosophical problems; search for conceptual clarity. In the case of analytic philosophy in Latin America, we must add two other family traits to the above list; these traits distinguish the ways in which philosophy is practiced in Latin America from how it is practiced in other parts of the world. First, since analytic philosophy was introduced when other philosophical traditions were dominant, philosophical reflections in the analytic tradition frequently go hand in hand with metaphilosophical issues (e.g. the nature of philosophy, its role in society, its specific way of teaching, the relationships amongst various philosophical traditions, etc.). Second, since the introduction of analytic philosophy in Latin American countries was related to a quest to change conservative intellectual institutions, social and political structures, and their forms of management, the critical and constructive spirit of analytic philosophy led many of its practitioners in Latin America to engage politically in a variety of ways in their home countries.

Even this expanded list of family traits is not sufficient to characterize analytic philosophy in Latin America. Many non-analytic philosophers exhibit these same traits. Glock (2008) suggests that the right way to understand analytic philosophy is to add a historical dimension to these traits and understand analytic philosophy as an intellectual tradition. In a similar vein, Gracia (2010) argues that sociological considerations play an important role in distinguishing analytic philosophy from other methods of philosophy:

What we have then is a family structure not based on a genetic but on an intellectual lineage, an intellectual pedigree, which in turn is based on practices that have been passed and amended within a family context. In fact, we continue to organize in families and tribes and there are exclusions and fiefdoms. Mankind is primarily composed of communities, and philosophy does not differ from other human endeavors. This explains why cultural, political and ethnically considerations, play a role in human projects, including the academic ones. (Gracia 2010: 29)

The analytic tradition not only has a history, but is made up of several generations of people who are linked in particular ways (e.g. advisor-student and colleague-colleague relationships). These people participate in shared activities in which they recognize each other as members of the same community, discuss and research similar topics using a similar approach, and operate with a shared theoretical background. This does not mean that analytic philosophers from Latin America do not share links to the wider community of European and Anglo-Saxon analytic philosophers. On the contrary, many of them have been educated outside of Latin America, engage in work that goes beyond the Latin American context and forge important ties with Anglo-Saxon and European academic communities.

This entry presents the community of analytic philosophers that exists today in Latin America, describing the way in which this philosophical tradition has developed in the region. Section 2 offers an historical approach to the subject, while section 3 provides examples of the most original lines of research developed in Latin America within the analytic tradition.

2. History of Analytic Philosophy in Latin America

Philosophy in Latin America, as with all other cultural enterprises, has been closely related to European culture since colonial times.[2] It is against a background of Thomist, Marxist, positivist, phenomenological, existentialist and idealistic philosophy that the works of authors like Frege, Russell, Quine, Carnap, Wittgenstein, Strawson and others were introduced. Analytic philosophy developed heterogeneously across Latin America. The analytic tradition appears in Argentina and Mexico in the mid-twentieth century, and to a lesser extent in Brazil, Peru, Colombia and Uruguay in the same period. The development in Argentina and Mexico was much faster, and analytic philosophy had matured in the two countries by the 1980s. Strong institutions there, created by early analytic philosophers (e.g., the Instituto de Investigaciones filosóficas at the Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México (IIF-UNAM) and the Sociedad Argentina de Análisis Filosófico (SADAF)), played an important role. The development of analytic philosophy was more limited in other countries where there were only isolated figures who, in many cases, left no students.

2.1 Argentina

Analytic philosophy appeared in Argentina in the mid-twentieth century in two very different areas: (1) philosophy of math and science and (2) philosophy of law.

A number of mathematicians and physicists interested in the foundations of mathematics and the natural sciences introduced the logical developments of the early twentieth century and the ideas of the logical positivists of the Vienna Circle. Mario Bunge, who in 1944 founded Minerva, the first philosophy journal in the country, played an important role. Bunge was also the author of the first analytic book written in Latin America, Causality: The Place of the Causal Principle in Modern Science, published by Harvard in 1959, which was subsequently translated into Spanish. The next year he published Antología Semántica, the first Spanish translations of Russell, Carnap, Hempel, Tarski, Quine and Goodman. However, Bunge moved to Canada shortly afterwards and left no students in Argentina. Contemporaneous with Bunge, Julio Rey Pastor and Gregorio Klimovsky introduced issues in logic and the foundations of mathematics at the Faculty of Exact Sciences of the University of Buenos Aires. Though he published few papers, Gregorio Klimovsky fostered the development of analytic philosophy in Argentina. His deep knowledge and enthusiasm for the foundations of mathematics, methodology of natural sciences, the foundations of psychoanalysis and the history of science left a deep impression on his students. Klimovsky taught logic and philosophy of science at the University of Buenos Aires from 1957 to 1966, introducing contemporary logic and analytic authors to philosophy students, some of whom became the first generation of Argentine analytic philosophers.

Philosophy of language was introduced as a discipline in Argentina by Thomas Moro Simpson who published Formas lógicas, realidad y significado in 1964, a book of Latin American analytic literature, influential not only in Argentina and Mexico (where he traveled in 1967 to teach on these topics), but also in other Latin American countries. Simpson also published Semántica Filosófica in 1973, a book which includes translations of some of the most foundational works in analytic philosophy—such as Russell’s “On Denoting” and Frege’s “Sense and Reference”—in addition to discussions related to quantification, existence and belief attribution.[3] His students, Raúl Orayen and Alberto Moretti, worked specifically on logic, the philosophy of logic and philosophy of language. Moretti specialized in Frege and also studied Davidson’s philosophy of language and Tarski’s theory of truth. Some of his most significant contributions have recently been compiled in Interpretar y referir. Ejercicios de análisis filosófico (2008). Orayen worked in Argentina until the 1970s when he emigrated to Mexico, where he joined the IIF-UNAM. There he fostered several generations of analytic philosophers and made his most substantive contributions including one of his most significant works, Lógica, significado y ontología. His research[4] focused on the philosophy of logic and language, including the work of Russell, Frege, Quine, Kripke, and others.[5]

Felix Schuster focused his work on the philosophy of social sciences. His book, Explicación y predicción: La validez del conocimiento en ciencias sociales, published in 1982, is a classic that has been reprinted numerous times. In this work he was concerned with the methodology and validity of sociology, history, economics, anthropology, psychology and psychoanalysis, as well as the structure and predictive possibilities of the various theories.[6]

A number of lawyers and experts in the foundations of law introduced formal developments as well as analytic tools developed within ordinary language philosophy to study of the language of law. Regarding analytic tools, it is necessary to mention Carlos Cossio and Ambrosio Gioja from the Faculty of Law at the University of Buenos Aires. While neither of them is strictly speaking an analytic philosopher (both were trained within the phenomenological tradition) they introduced their students to new analytic readings in their seminars. Gioja introduced classical analytic texts in legal philosophy and ethics to young students participating in a reading group with him. Some of these young philosophers of law went on to become founders of the analytic tradition in the country.[7] Many philosophers were interested in the analysis of ordinary language, especially Genaro Carrió[8] and Eduardo Rabossi. Rabossi wrote on many issues. His most influential piece in ethics was the book La justificación moral del castigo (1976), and he also published Análisis filosófico, lenguaje y metafísica (1975), a book which introduced basic ideas from the analytic tradition for the first time in Spanish. Posthumously, one of the most important works of his career was published, En el comienzo Dios creó el canon (2008; see below in §3.3).[9]

Among the first analytic philosophers trained in law school, there was also a line of thought that departs from ordinary language and seeks to apply formal tools to studying the language of law. Especially noteworthy in this area is Alchourrón and Bulygin’s Normative Systems (1971), on the logic of norms and normative propositions. This work presents legal systems as deductive systems and aims to study the logical asymmetries between the processes of promulgation and the abolition of laws.[10] Alchourrón was concerned with changes in the legal systems produced by the promulgation and abolition of laws, seeking to produce a formal system that would give substance to the legal bodies; the parallel with systems of belief induced him to focus on belief change, producing the first formal paper on the dynamics of belief (Alchourrón et al. 1985); the theory, known as AGM (by the initials of the last names of its creators: Carlos Alchourrón, Peter Gärdenfors and David Makinson), have had a major impact worldwide.

Carlos Nino is one of the youngest members of the Law School tradition, and he played an influential role in both practical philosophy and the institutional history of Argentina. He made important theoretical contributions in ethics, philosophy of law and constitutional theory, among others in Etica y derechos humanos.[11] Nino is also remembered for his political commitment to the recovery of democracy in Argentina in the 1980s. He was an assessor of President Alfonsín, and one of the designers (together with Eduardo Rabossi) of Alfonsín’s human rights policy, a policy which included, among other measures, historical judgment of the leaders of the military government in 1985, allowing the imprisonment of the leaders of state terrorism in Argentina. Nino died very young in 1993.[12]

While all the patriarchs of analytic philosophy in Argentina were formed by, began working, and convened at the University of Buenos Aires, the institutional history of the country forced them early on to leave the university and take refuge in an institution created to strengthen the development of analytic philosophy in the region. Indeed, in 1966 the coup d’état drove many intellectuals to abandon the public university, forcing them to leave their jobs and intellectual development. Shortly after, various philosophers begin to gather outside official circles in order to continue their philosophical work, founding SADAF in 1972.[13] Many women philosophers also participated in this enterprise such as Cecilia Hidalgo, Cristina Gonzalez, Diana Maffia, Gladys Palau and Nora Stigol. The founding of this institution converged philosophers from the two lines mentioned above, creating thereafter a unified community of analytic philosophers in the country. In addition to maintaining the spirit and practice of analytic philosophy during the years in which it was excluded from the public sphere (1966–1983), SADAF and its members carried out three major tasks: (1) continuing the training of young generations within the analytic tradition; (2) strengthening connections with analytic communities from other countries, especially with the analytic community in the IIF-UNAM Mexico and the Centro de lógica, epistemología e história da ciência (henceforth: CLE) in Brazil; and (3) creating, in 1981, the first analytic journal in Spanish in Argentina and the second in Latin America: Análisis Filosófico.

As mentioned above, the rapid development of analytic philosophy in Argentina had two causes: its early institutionalization, and the teaching legacy of many of its founders who produced new generations of analytic philosophers whose works traveled beyond the borders of their country of origin.[14]

Thomas Simpson was the intellectual mentor of generations of philosophers of language, most significantly Alberto Moretti, who in turn formed a new and powerful generation of analytic philosophers.[15] Eduardo Rabossi covered wider issues of philosophy and had students who focused on bioethics, Wittgenstein and 20th century philosophy, although most of his students focused on philosophy of mind.[16] Carlos Alchourrón and Eugenio Bulygin left many students working on the logic of norms, such as Hugo Zuleta and Ricardo Caracciolo[17] and Alchourrón also had students focused in philosophical logic.[18] And, despite his early death, Carlos Nino also had many students.[19]

By the mid-80s, analytic philosophy was also developed beyond Buenos Aires, at the National University of Cordoba focusing on three areas: philosophy of language, under the direction of Carolina Scotto; logic, under the direction of Horacio Faas; and philosophy of science, under the direction of Victor Rodriguez.

2.2 Mexico

In the first half of the twentieth century, several Mexican philosophers, themselves not analytic philosophers strictly speaking, introduced a series of formal tools, texts, and themes of analytic philosophy in the country. The first book of philosophy and history of science in Spanish was published by Juan David García Bacca in 1936. More analytic works followed as a book on logical positivism and the Vienna Circle was published in 1941 by Antonio Caso, and Ayer and Carnap’s works were translated by his student, Nicolás Molina Flores, who was also the first Mexican to argue in favor of logical empiricism. Eduardo García Maynez, a philosopher of law, introduced the tools of mathematical logic in his work. In 1953 he published Los principios de la ontología formal del derecho y su expresión simbólica, one of the first philosophical works expressed in formal symbols in Mexico.[20] There are, however, two notable differences from how analytic philosophy developed in Argentina. García Maynez only made superficial use of logical tools[21] and left no students[22] so his works had no echo in later developments in Mexico and had no impact outside of the country. However, he achieved an important institutional legacy as he and others advocated for the creation of the Centro de Estudios Filosóficos, which later became the IIF-UNAM. While García Maynez was its head, the Centro incorporated full time researchers and created the journal Dianoia in 1955. During this period philosophical discussions and publications in Spanish were encouraged.

In addition to García Maynez, José Gaos, a Spanish philosopher who emigrated to Mexico because of the Spanish civil war, was also influential in the development of analytic philosophy in Mexico. Many important works in phenomenology, including Heidegger’s Sein und Zeit, were translated into Spanish by Gaos, himself a phenomenologist. It is in the group meetings organized by Gaos where we find the three figures who drove Mexican analytic philosophy since the 1960s: Alejandro Rossi, Luis Villoro and Fernando Salmerón. Classical analytic readings, such as works by Russell, Wittgenstein, and Moore, were introduced during those seminars. Henceforth, in Mexico, analytic philosophy appears in dialogue and conflict with phenomenology (Salmerón 2003). This transition from phenomenology to analytic philosophy in the IIF-UNAM is consolidated between 1966 and 1977, years in which Salmerón was its director. In 1967 the first strictly analytic journal in Spanish is founded: Crítica: Revista hispanoamericana de filosofía. Mexico always welcomed political emigrants and had a policy of inviting other Latin American colleagues who helped strengthen ties among researchers in the region. In those years several Argentine analytic philosophers (e.g. Rabossi, Alchourrón, and Simpson) were invited to teach in Mexico.[23]

The first article in Spanish about analytic philosophy of language—more specifically, about the private language argument—was published by Alejandro Rossi, who is of Italian and Venezuelan roots but developed his research in Mexico. This work and others were later reprinted in Lenguaje y Significado (1969), a book consisting of five papers, which clearly reflects the shift from phenomenology to analytic philosophy, taking Wittgenstein as its juncture. The book’s first paper is on Husserl’s Logical Investigations, and the last three papers deal specifically with Strawson and Russell’s disagreement about definite descriptions, the problem of empty descriptions, and the relationship between proper names and definite descriptions. Besides his philosophical work within the analytic tradition and his enormous work to strengthen the Instituto, Rossi wrote several essays of a more literary character, compiled later in Manual del distraído (1978).[24]

Analytic epistemology was introduced in Mexico by Luis Villoro, the author of a foundational Spanish book Saber, creer, conocer published in 1982. In this book, Villoro reviews many of the themes developed in twentieth century epistemology, such as the distinction between knowledge and belief, its connection with truth, the distinction between different types of knowledge (know-that and know-how), and ethical considerations in a theory of knowledge (e.g. that of tolerance of the others’ unshared beliefs and the rules of veracity, rationality and autonomy of reason governing our knowledge). In addition, Villoro’s book is foundational in the Latin American context because he tried to systematize a technical vocabulary in Spanish on these topics for the first time. The question of translation is central, as will be discussed in §3.3. In English, the dominant language of analytic philosophy, there is a single verb—“to know”— whereas in Spanish (as in German, French, and other languages) there are two verbs: “saber” and “conocer”; therefore the question of the relationship between the various types of knowledge identified by philosophers of ordinary language, such as Ryle, and its translation into Spanish is not an insignificant philosophical issue. In addition to these invaluable contributions to the theory of knowledge, Villoro also made outstanding progress on issues related to Mexico’s political history and political philosophy, as well as discussions on the possibility of founding an American philosophy, an issue at the core of the Hyperion group (1948–1952).[25]

Practical philosophy, including ethics and philosophy of education, was introduced by Fernando Salmerón. His first clearly analytic book is La filosofía y las actitudes morales (1971). This book includes three essays written between 1966 and 1969 where Salmerón seeks to: 1) highlight the argumentative and critical nature of the philosophical activity; 2) connect this vital undertaking (the adoption of philosophy as a profession) with a broader sense of philosophy understood as a worldview; and 3) stress issues such as the practical commitment of philosophers, the connection between these practices and other social practices, the role of philosophical research and teaching in the society in which it is immersed, the relationship with scientific knowledge, etc. He also published with Eduardo Rabossi a series of translations of classical works in practical analytic philosophy, such as those of Moore, Strawson, Hare, Stevenson, Searle, Harman, etc. Among his most outstanding works are Ensayos filosóficos (1988) and Enseñanza y filosofía (1991). One of his deepest concerns seems to have been to place philosophy—understood as a critical and argumentative practice—in a central site for the political and intellectual development of a society. Also noteworthy is his institutional work, the dissemination of analytic philosophy in Latin America, and foreign presentations of analytic contributions made by Latin American philosophers.[26]

The abovementioned founders of the analytic tradition in Mexico were followed by another group of philosophers who were worked on logic and philosophy of science. The next generation, which includes Roberto Caso Bercht, Hugo Padilla, and Wonfilio Trejo, completely abandoned phenomenology and could be considered the first generation of “pure” analytic philosophers. Analytic issues and authors were expanded throughout the country by Trejo who taught at other universities beyond the UNAM. Significant contributions in philosophy of language were made by Hugo Margáin and in philosophy of law by Ulises Schmill and Javier Esquivel.

During the last two decades of the twentieth century, philosophical production of the IIF-UNAM greatly increased.[27] Among the philosophers who contributed are: Margarita Valdés who works on applied ethics, philosophy of language and mind, epistemology, and more recently on the history of analytic philosophy and philosophy in general in Latin America; Paulette Dieterlen who works on political philosophy, specifically on poverty and distributive justice and Olbeth Hansberg working in philosophy of mind, especially on emotions, perception, consciousness and Davidsonian philosophy. Mark Platts, of British origin, moved to Mexico where he published Ways of Meaning in 1979 (second edition in 1997) and Moral Realities: An Essay in Philosophical Psychology (1991), where he explores the concept of desire and develops an anti-Humean theory of moral motivation. He influenced several IIF-UNAM members, including Lourdes Valdivia, Olbeth Hansberg, Salma Saab, Guillermo Hurtado and Maite Ezcurdia. Carlos Pereda (originally from Uruguay) works mainly on ethics, epistemology, and political theory, but also on speech acts and linguistic communication. Since then, younger generations of philosophers have diversified and deepened the analytic program.[28]

Unlike what happened in Argentina, Mexico, like Brazil, had consistent state policies that encouraged young scholars to pursue graduate studies abroad with the commitment to return to work in their own country. Thus, many philosophers have gotten their PhDs abroad, and their doctoral advisors work outside of Mexico, usually in the United Kingdom or the United States. That is why the Mexican philosophical communities are held together by institutions such as the IIF-UNAM, unlike in Argentina where the student-advisor relation is essential to the consolidation of philosophical communities.

2.3 Brazil

In Brazil we find several early and isolated glimpses of the analytic tradition. Francisco Cavalcante Pontes de Miranda published O Método de Análise Sócio-Psicológica in 1925 and, in 1937, O Problema Fundamental do Conhecimento, which was influenced by Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, Ramsey and the Vienna Circle. Vicente Ferreira da Silva published a book on the fundamentals of mathematical logic in 1940. It is remarkable that W.V.O. Quine stayed for some time in São Paulo, where he published in Portuguese O sentido da nova lógica (1944). Though his work influenced the next generation of philosophers, he did not leave any students in the region. In contrast, the French analytic philosopher Gilles-Gaston Granger, who taught at the University of São Paulo from 1947 to 1953 and returned to Brazil many times afterwards, had a more lasting influence on the likes of Newton da Costa and José Arthur Giannotti, who worked at the intersection of phenomenology and Marxism under Wittgenstein’s influence. Within this first generation of Brazilian analytic philosophers, it is perhaps Newton Da Costa—the creator of paraconsistent logic—who achieved most prominence outside of Brazil.[29]

Aside from the logical tradition, the rest of Brazilian analytic philosophy emerges not as a sequel of positivism, but as a philosophical innovation. The first publications in the area appeared in the 70s. In Brazil, unlike in Mexico and Argentina, early analytic works did not come from the phenomenological tradition, but from scholars in the history of philosophy. Indeed, there are two major figures in this story, who worked on the history of philosophy but had analytic students: João Paulo Monteiro (a scholar of Hume, interested in questions of epistemology, skepticism, and philosophy of science) and Oswaldo Porchat (a scholar of Aristotle, focused on skepticism but also interested in logic, philosophy of language, and sciences). In 1976, Porchat founded the Centro de lógica, epistemología e história da ciência (CLE) at the University of Campinas, São Paulo, and the following year he began to edit the journal Manuscrito, edited by M. Wrigley and later by M. Ruffino.[30]

There is a large group of analytic philosophers in the area of Rio de Janeiro, including Oswaldo Chateaubriand, who works in philosophy of logic, metaphysics, and philosophy of language, and contributed to topics such as logical form, syntax, grammar, logical truth, theory of descriptions, theories of truth, modalities and counterfactuals.[31] Other analytic philosophers working in Rio include Danilo Marcondes Filho (philosophy of language, epistemology, skepticism), Wilson Mendonça (philosophy of mind, ethics, and metaethics) and Maria Clara Dias (ethics, philosophy of action and mind).

In addition, a large group of philosophers of science work at the Federal University of Santa Catarina (Florianópolis) organized around the Núcleo de Epistemologia e Lógica (NEL) which edits the journal Principia. Every two years they organize an international symposium on topics of philosophy of science, epistemology, logic, and metaphysics. The group includes Newton da Costa, Décio Krause, Luiz Henrique de A. Dutra, and two Argentine emigrants, Alberto Cupani and Gustavo Caponi.

Unlike Argentina and Mexico, where much of the activity is concentrated in the two capital cities, Brazil has a vast landscape where we can find in different universities many philosophers within the analytic tradition, although they work connected to each other by ANPOF’s “Grupos de Trabalho”.[32]

It is not until 2008 that the Brazilian Society for Analytic Philosophy (SBFA) was founded.[33]

2.4 Other Countries

In Colombia, as in other countries in the region, the first works in analytic philosophy were produced in the second half of the twentieth century. There are two journals— Ideas y valores[34] and Cuadernos de Filosofía y Letras—in which analytic (and non-analytic) works are published. Rubén Sierra Mejia, in the second half of the 1960s, introduced in Bogotá courses and translations of some classical works within the analytic tradition, and published his articles in a book, Apreciación de la Filosofía Analítica (1987). At the University of Valle (Cali), Adolfo León Lobos introduced argumentation theory and ordinary language philosophy. In the 1980s there was much activity in ordinary language philosophy.[35] Juan José Botero is known for his work focused on the common origins of the phenomenological and the analytic traditions, examining the correspondence between Husserl and Frege and publishing works on consciousness, propositional attitudes, sense and reference. There are many other contemporary Colombian philosophers who are making significant contributions within the analytic tradition.[36]

In Peru, analytic philosophy was introduced by Francisco Miró Quesada. In 1946 he published the first book in the area: Lógica. He wrote many works on logic, deontic logic, philosophy of mathematics, and also on the social and political reality of his country.[37] In the 1970s he founded, with Alberto Cordero, a program on philosophy of science.[38] In the 1960s Augusto Salazar Bondy translated Moore and Wittgenstein and wrote a series of essays on evaluative language, which was eventually published as a book in 1971 in Chile.[39]

Beyond these isolated figures who left no students, only in the twenty-first century do we find two small groups in Peru working on analytic issues. At the Pontifical Catholic University of Peru, Pablo Quintanilla leads an interdisciplinary group dedicated to the study of the philosophy of language and mind and its evolution (Grupo Mente y Lenguaje). At the National University of San Carlos a small group led by Oscar Garcia Zárate who founded the Centro de estudios de filosofía analítica (CESFIA) in 2006. CESFIA publishes the journal Analítica (though the Centro seems to function in some isolation from the rest of the Latin American analytic philosophers).

In Uruguay, Carlos Vaz Ferreira introduced some ideas and texts from the analytic tradition in the first half of the twentieth century, but died very young in 1956 without leaving students. By the late 1950s Ezra Heymann introduced Frege and Austin, and taught logic in Montevideo before moving to Venezuela. The most internationally recognized Uruguayan philosopher was Mario Otero, who was educated in the United States and exiled to the IIF-UNAM in the 1970’s. He eventually returned to Uruguay with the return of democracy in the 1980s and worked at the University of the Republic in the history of logic and philosophy of science. His student, Lucía Leiwowicz, continues working on these issues. Also exiled in the 1970s, never to return to Uruguay, were Javier Sasso and Eduardo Piacenza who went to Venezuela and Carlos Pereda who went to the IIF-UNAM. Currently, the most prominent philosopher in Uruguay is Carlos Enrique Caorsi who works in philosophy of language with an emphasis on Davidson’s philosophy.

Chile shows a certain isolation. Until the coup d’état in 1973, developments were limited to formal logic by Juan Rivano, Gerold Stahl, and Rolando Chuaqui. Roberto Torretti, who was exiled to Puerto Rico, stands out. He made an early impact with a well-regarded book on Kant published in 1967. These historical studies led to more systematic studies in the field of philosophy of science and history of geometry, published in the 1990s. Alfonso Gómez Lobo took the opposite path as he first published Siete escritos sobre lógica y semántica in 1972 before leaving analytic philosophy to engage with ancient philosophy when he was exiled to the United States. In the 1990s there were only a couple of figures working on philosophy of mind and language in Chile.[40] In the twenty-first century the analytic tradition grows, mostly due to the many philosophers who returned to their country after studies abroad.[41] The Sociedad Chilena de Filosofía Analítica was founded around 2008.

In Venezuela, Juan David García Bacca, though not an analytic philosopher himself, introduced authors from the analytic tradition in the 1960s. Juan Nuño published Sentido de la filosofía contemporánea in 1965, which included logic and other analytic issues, and dealt with proper names and nativism in a book of formal logic published in 1973. Adolfo García Díaz, of Mexican origin, worked in the 1960s in Venezuela on issues of logic, metaphysics, and history of philosophy. In the 1970s, Venezuela, as did Mexico, welcomed political exiles such as Ernesto Batistella, Javier Sasso, and Eduardo Piacenza from Uruguay. There were also more Venezuelans working within the analytic tradition at this time, including Rafael Burgos (Wittgenstein and ontology) and Pedro Lluberes (ontology and philosophy of science). And in the 1980s, Victor Krebs worked on Wittgenstein’s philosophy and Vicenzo Lo Monaco on Davidson’s philosophy and interpretation theory, semantics of proper names, and ontological commitments.

In Costa Rica, Claudio Gutierrez publishes papers in the area of computer science, logic, epistemology, philosophy of language and philosophy of mind. Luis Camacho Naranjo makes contributions in logic and philosophy of science. Max Freund, a student of the two, works on cognitive competences and computability and runs a graduate program on cognitive science.

In Guatemala, Hector-Neri Castañeda (who later emigrated to the United States) published several papers on consciousness and normative logic in the late 1950s and on the private language argument in the early 1960s. From his workplace in the United States (Indiana University) he collaborated with PhD students from Costa Rica, Guatemala, and Mexico. Similarly, other Latin American philosophers emigrated to the United States; a paradigmatic case is Ernesto Sosa, a Cuban-born philosopher who studied and worked all his life in the United States who constantly sought to establish links with philosophy in Spanish, especially the analytic philosophers of Mexico and Argentina.

The growth of analytic philosophy in Latin America led to the foundation in 2007 of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica (ALFAn) which brings together individuals and institutions working in the analytic tradition in the region.

3. Some Examples of Original Developments in Latin America’s Analytic Philosophy

In this section I will mention examples of original work developed by philosophers who have done most of their professional work in Latin America within the analytic tradition. (For reasons of space, it is impossible to be exhaustive).

The areas in which major original contributions have occurred are logic, especially what might be called “philosophical logic”, such as paraconsistent logic, belief dynamics and deontic logic, and practical philosophy, due to the role analytic philosophy played in strengthening democracy in the region. Also important are the contributions made on metaphilosophical issues arising from reflecting on what “importing” philosophy implies. However, there are important contributions in all philosophical disciplines since Latin American analytic philosophers have addressed most of the universal problems posed by western philosophy.

3.1 Theoretical Philosophy

In the case of theoretical philosophy, most research in Latin America was not originated by local thoughts or interests, but by the influence of philosophers abroad, i.e., by the importation of philosophical theories and standpoints. In the majority of cases the philosophical ideas proposed are not in dialogue exclusively with other members of the Latin American community, but with the broader international community. There are, however, some exceptions in the field of philosophical logic and philosophy of logic where important traditions were born: paraconsistent logic and the logic of belief revision.

Paraconsistent logic is one of the autochthonous philosophical products of Latin America. The idea behind these developments is simple and philosophically motivated: a logic is paraconsistent if the principle of non-contradiction is not valid in general; syntactically speaking, “a logic is paraconsistent if it can be the basic logic of inconsistent but non-trivial theories” (Da Costa & Bueno 2010: 221). As mentioned in the previous section, the father of these logics is Newton da Costa who originated what has been called the “Brazilian school of paraconsistency”.[42]

The other leading figure in logic who birthed a research tradition was Carlos Alchourrón. Besides his contribution in deontic logic[43], Alchourrón was also one of the first logicians to develop a logical system for belief dynamics (AGM). The key notions of this theory are revision (when we introduce a new piece of information into the current epistemic state and readjust the background information in such a way that the new result is consistent), and contraction (when a piece of information is eliminated from an epistemic state) (Arló-Costa and Fermé 2010: 483). Developments produced by Alchourrón and collaborators (until his early death in 1996) included issues related to non-monotonic logic and developments in artificial intelligence.[44]

A lesser known philosophical issue that originated and developed in Latin America is Orayen’s Paradox, baptized as such by Alchourrón (1987). Orayen’s paradox is a problem that Raul Orayen identified and originally presented at a symposium on Quine, in Granada in 1986 (Orayen 1992). It arises when the following propositions are asserted simultaneously:

  1. TQ’s (quantificational theory) semantics is built with the help of T (Zermelo-Fraenkel type set theory), and in particular, with the restriction that only sets provided by T can be used as domains of interpretation.
  2. T can be formalized within TQ (i.e., can be expressed by a first order theory).

One cannot simultaneously accept these two statements, because if we look at (1), the set theory cannot be formalized in the sense of (2). Orayen not only presented this paradox, but also offered two possible solutions. The first appeals to semantics based on the adoption of natural language predicates to interpret formal predicates, i.e. it proposes a new way of interpreting the symbols of quantificational language with a language that is already interpreted. The second solution is inspired by the hierarchies developed in Russell’s theory of types. Orayen’s Paradox produced many responses, among others by W.V.O. Quine, Hilary Putnam, and William Hart[45], as well as famous logicians of the Latin American community, such as Atocha Aliseda, Agustin Rayo, Eduardo Barrio, Max Freund, Mario Gómez-Torrente, Sandra Lazzer, Adolfo Garcia de la Sienra and Axel Barceló. The main proposals around this paradox are included in Moretti and Hurtado (2003) and García de la Sienra (2008).

Both general and special philosophy of science, as well as the history and sociology of science, have been extensively studied in Lain America. The intense activity in philosophy of science is reflected in the regional institutions that have served as an impetus for its development. In Argentina, the Jornadas de epistemología e historia de la ciencia has been organized every year since 1989 by a local group led by Victor Rodriguez, Marisa Velasco and Jose Ahumada. In Chile, the Jornadas Rolando Chuaqui Kettlunen has been organized every year since 1999 in tribute to the distinguished mathematician, philosopher of science and Chilean thinker, Professor Rolando Chuaqui Kettlun, perhaps the most important leader in developing formal sciences in the country during the twentieth century. Among the organizers are Andrés Bobenrieth, Rolando Rebolledo, José Tomás Alvarado, Guido Vallejos, Claudia Muñoz and Wilfredo Quezada. There is also an organization of regional scope, the Asociación de Filosofía e Historia de la ciencia del Cono Sur (AFHIC), which was founded in 2000 in order to promote ties among regional specialists and organize meetings every two years in different member countries.[46] See the entry on philosophy of science in Latin America for a detailed revision of the main contributions to the field.

The theory of knowledge is a popular discipline in Brazil, which is not surprising since the origins of analytic philosophy in this country is associated with two figures— Porchat and Monteiro—who worked on skepticism and the foundation of science, followed by Plinio Junqueira-Smith and Paulo Faria. The main developments in the field, not only in Brazil but also in the rest of Latin America, can be found in the entry on skepticism in Latin America and Cresto 2010. Analytic metaphysics, on the contrary, has had little development in the region, with only a few exceptions.[47]

Philosophy of language and mind have had extensive development in the region. Philosophical reflection on language, which is at the heart of analytic philosophy, is exhaustively spread throughout Latin America. The first analytic publications in Latin America, by Alejandro Rossi and Thomas Simpson, were devoted to this area, and they generated in their respective countries a strong tradition in philosophy of language. As in the rest of the world, many philosophers originally concerned with issues in philosophy of language turned to philosophy of mind in the 1980s. Thus, both philosophy of language and mind have had a very homogeneous development throughout Latin America.[48] In these topics the influence of foreign philosophy is apparent, but though the problems and arguments addressed were not born in Latin America, original contributions from Latin American philosophers can be found. Most of the research in the field assumes a naturalistic approach, connecting recent developments in linguistics, cognitive sciences and neurosciences to deal with philosophical issues about language and mind including theories of reference, contexualism, psychological and phenomenal concepts, the mind-body problem, understanding others, and theory of action.[49] The emotions, not always addressed in mainstream philosophy of mind, have also been an object of philosophical reflection in the region.[50]

Concerning the classical developments in analytic philosophy of language, Frege’s legacy has been deeply studied in the region.[51]

3.2 Practical Philosophy

Many traditional questions of moral and political philosophy as well as that of philosophy of law have been addressed by Latin American philosophers.[52] However, the social and political peculiarities of the region have produced specific issues which will be the topic of this section.

Political instability prevailed in Lain America for most part of the twentieth century. Almost all the countries in the region have suffered coup d’ états, electoral fraud, cancellation of constitutional rights, political persecutions; in sum, democracy has been a chimera. In most countries the political situation has changed in the last thirty years, and to some extent this was due to moral, political and law philosophers who produced an extensive discussion of the foundation of democracy, human rights, and other related issues. From the economic point of view, Latin America was, and still is, a region where most of the population live below the poverty line, the gap between the rich and poor is very large, health and education are sometimes “luxury” items that many people cannot access; in sum, economic inequalities, and therefore educational, cultural and health inequalities, abound.

Applied ethics, especially bioethics, has seen ample and original philosophical developments in Latin America. The political, economic, and social situation of the region has led to focused reflections on issues like abortion[53] and medical practice and research on vulnerable subjects (Rivera López 2010: 365). The public commitment to ongoing debates that matter to their local societies is an important feature of the analytic philosophical tradition in the region. The philosophical reflections on abortion are a paradigmatic case to consider. In most Latin American countries, unlike Europe and the US, abortion is not legal almost without exception, and many women have died or been imprisoned due to this fact. Mexico has been a pioneer in the decriminalization of abortion, but it was not until 2007—and only in Mexico City, and not in the rest of the country—that abortion was legalized. The Mexican philosophical community was involved in the process that led to this change.

Margarita Valdés (1997, 2001b) has been a pioneer in this field as her contributions aim to produce political impact (i.e., change existing laws), seeking to undermine the dogmatic thinking of the vast majority of the population and legislators and emphasizing specific issues such as child and adolescent pregnancy, pregnancy resulting from rape, etc.[54] Valdés (2001a) presents the main arguments for and against the legalization of abortion, and distinguishes three notions of a “person” in the arguments: the biological notion, the idea of a “potential” person, and the metaphysical and moral notion of person. She finally shows that the more conservative arguments cannot be held, because they either appeal to a notion of a person which is not relevant to the moral question, or claim—falsely—that the moral person is present at the very moment of conception.

Gustavo Ortiz-Millán (2009), also in Mexico, makes a systematic and comprehensive study of the issue of abortion where he considers the main ethical arguments for and against abortion, the reproductive rights of women, the conflict with the rights of the fetus, the rule of law in his country and the statistics related to the topics under discussion, in addition to considering the pro-life conservative proposal of adoption, paternity rights, and politics and pervading religious arguments.

In Argentina, Florencia Luna, Eduardo Rivera López and Arleen Salles have developed several lines of research in bioethics. Initially, some books with Spanish translations of leading papers in the field[55] have been published, aiming to introduce into Spanish-speaking societies important issues such as problems raised by genetic knowledge and genetic manipulation, euthanasia, abortion, reproductive rights, the principle of autonomy and the patient-physician relationship, justice and the right to health, experimentation on human subjects, organ transplants, etc. But soon these philosophers developed their own work in the field, shifting from translating the work of others to producing their own original works[56]. Luna (2006) focuses her research on vulnerable subjects, i.e. “people living in deprivation, oppression, and powerlessness—conditions that are all too common for many Latin Americans” (Luna 2006: 1). Vulnerable subjects pose urgent questions to a moral philosopher given paternalistic attitudes based on wide-spread illiteracy, denial of women’s reproductive rights, extremely restrictive legal circumstances with respect to abortion, and lack of sexual education and contraception information. Difficulties found in biomedical research with vulnerable subjects involve a lack of respect for research subjects, e.g. when researchers hide relevant information from the subjects, fail to request their informed consent, or take their case history without consent. Luna also addresses the question of post-trial obligations with experimental subjects, patents, and the intellectual property of biomedical findings.[57] Rivera López (2011) deals with classical ethical questions such as euthanasia, the challenges posed by new technologies such as assisted reproduction, organ transplants and genetic manipulation, but also addresses questions of distributive justice on health resources and services, medical technologies, the moral problem of selling organs for transplant, among other issues.

The unstable political situation in Latin America during the twentieth century characterized by repeated breaches of constitutional order led generations of philosophers to deal with issues related to the foundations of law and human rights, including the general theory of ethics and human rights, the theory of democracy, the theory of punishment, and the general theory of legal norms. Garzón Valdés (1998: 27) argues that one can genuinely speak of an Argentinian philosophy of law, and not just a philosophy of law made in Argentina, by virtue of its originality and impact. A central figure in philosophy of law was Carlos Nino, not only because of the importance of his work outside of Latin America, but also for the great political and theoretical impact his work had in the region, including leaving a long list of students who have strongly contributed to the development of these issues[58]. One of the most significant political event contributing to the recovery of democracy was the 1985 trial of the military government that ruled Argentina from 1976 to 1983.

The human rights policy carried out by President Alfonsín was based on theoretical discussions held in SADAF, led by Carlos Nino in the early 1980s. The moral and legal considerations on which these policies were based are developed in Nino 1996 (posthumous). This book includes a historical background in which Nino reviews prior solutions to the systematic and governmental violation of human rights after a change of government (such as the Nuremberg trial, Eichmann’s trial, the lack of answers to previous human rights violations during democratic transitions in Europe in the 1970s, and in Eastern Europe in the 1980s and 1990s,) as well as the situation in Asia, Africa, South America, and Argentina, including the historical context of the political and legal decisions made by President Alfonsín. In the second part of the book, Nino analyzes the political, moral and legal problems posed by the decision to prosecute human rights violators. Some of the main problems are: how to justify the retroactive application of criminal justice, the diffusion of responsibility (since for a massive violation of human rights, many people in different positions in the chain of command must be involved), under which laws the accused should be judged, in which jurisdiction they should be judged, who is legally responsible for a violation of human rights (the person who gave the order or the one who executed it) and whether the international community should intervene, among many other questions.

3.3 Metaphilosophy

It is natural that analytic philosophy, a tradition with roots outside Latin America, generated a philosophical revolution when it arrived in the region. It is no wonder, then, that many Latin American analytic philosophers have devoted their efforts to thinking about metaphilosophical issues such as the methods and nature of philosophy, the social role of philosophy, teaching methodologies, etc. The founders of analytic philosophy in the region addressed these issues; Rossi, Salmerón, Villoro, Miró Quesada, and Salazar Bondy sought for a scientific philosophy, first drawing on phenomenology and later on analytic philosophy and logic as tools. Three recent discussions in this area are fundamental.

There has been significant contributions regarding the nature and practice of philosophy when a tradition is introduced and institutionalized in a given region, several public and private institutions founded to guide philosophical practice, and professionalism developed. Salmerón (1971) holds that philosophy in Latin America should maintain philosophical normality and professionalization, connect with science, and avoid metaphysical speculation and literary style. Later he argues that there are two aspects of philosophy: a critical one linked with science, and another one concerned with the conception of the world, e.g. philosophy of education and ethics. He seeks to reconcile these two aspects of philosophy (Salmerón 1991).

Meanwhile, Hurtado (2007) distinguishes between theoretical metaphilosophy and practical metaphilosophy (i.e. philosophical reflection on the conditions and problems posed by the concrete practice of philosophy in a given place and time) and argues that the latter depends on theoretical metaphilosophy (i.e. the general conception of philosophy).

Rabossi’s posthumous book is a paradigmatic example of metaphilosophical thinking in the region. Rabossi (2008) presents a very original hypothesis about why philosophical practice has its current characteristics based on a careful historical analysis of the institutionalization of philosophy resulting from the split between philosophy and other theoretical disciplines in idealist German thought in the nineteenth century. The three provocative “conjectures” he develops in the book are: (1) Philosophy, i.e., what we conceive, practice and value as philosophy nowadays, is a young discipline only two hundred years old; (2) The long life usually attributed to philosophy is the result of a historical narrative also conceived two hundred years ago; and (3) Philosophy is an anomalous discipline (Rabossi 2008: 13). The history he reconstructs regarding the split between philosophy and theology in the nineteenth century allows him to present the “philosophical canon” explicit or implicit in philosophical practices, a decalogue of maxims guiding all philosophical research across philosophical traditions. In the book, he also engages in academic geopolitical issues, including the tension between a growing globalization of philosophy and the consolidation of “national philosophies” (such as French Philosophy, Latin American Philosophy, etc.), and the relationship between the central and peripheral producers of philosophy.[59]

A second issue that has been widely discussed is the teaching of philosophy, both at the university and the secondary school level. The issue of teaching philosophy is entrenched with the conception of philosophizing itself. For centuries, since colonial times, Latin America was merely a receptor of philosophy produced in other regions. In the second half of the twentieth century, however, the debate around the idea of an authentic Latin American philosophy was clearly settled[60], and both these political and academic movements, together with analytic philosophy (which usually focuses on problems and arguments rather than on figures and theories), helped question the traditional academic practices in the region. The claim defended by many analytic philosophers in the region was that teaching philosophy should promote original philosophical thinking rather than merely reproducing the philosophical developments of others. For instance, Gaos (1956) insisted on changing the university curricula of philosophy, seeking to transform educational institutions in order to create philosophers able to produce their own philosophies. Another powerful idea, proposed by Rabossi and his research group, was to take seriously Kant’s claim that philosophy cannot be taught but philosophizing can, and to develop a series of teaching strategies in order to instill in philosophy students the relevant “know-how” proper to philosophical practice (Rabossi 1987; González and Stigol 1993). Teaching philosophy is no longer considered merely a way of transmitting information to students about historical figures and theories (to give them propositional knowledge about philosophy); instead, under a “critical model” of teaching philosophy (opposed to the traditional “dogmatic” model), teaching is seen as a way of promoting philosophical thinking.[61]

Finally, the last notable metaphilosophical question regards the language of philosophy. The fact that most analytic works are published in English and the current globalization of the profession push Latin American analytic philosophers to produce philosophy in English (despite the fact that they work in countries whose native language is Spanish or Portuguese). This has generated much controversy concerning whether or not to leave the native language while doing philosophy. Some opening lines of the controversy are presented in an issue of the journal Crítica (vol 54, no.133) with contributions by Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, Marco Ruffino, Diana Pérez, and Guillermo Hurtado. In 2014, a discussion on the subject was held at the Cervantes Institute of Harvard University[62]. On the one side, Rodriguez-Pereyra, Ruffino and Toribio argue that English should be considered the new Latin in the sense that English should be widely adopted as the proper language to write philosophy in given pragmatic professional reasons and ideal reasons of having a common language to communicate within the analytic community. On the other hand, Pérez, Hurtado, and Gracia, among others, defend the idea that practicality is not the only relevant factor to consider when deciding which language is chosen for communication as there are also political, cultural, linguistic, contextual, and experiential reasons to take into account. Moreover, the shared experience has been that choosing what language to communicate one’s ideas in is not a neutral process because (1) there are issues concerning translation that are important to philosophy and using a plurality of languages often helps the author improve her ideas; and (2) language is not only a means to communicate ideas which are already established in our minds, but a vehicle which contributes to the shaping of our ideas.

4. Conclusions

The development of analytic philosophy in Latin America since its introduction over the past sixty years has been impressive not only in the originality of many of the contributions, but also in the international impact that philosophers who live and work in the region have achieved. Thus, Latin America today is not only an importer of analytic philosophy, but also a producer of analytic philosophy. More and more resources are becoming available in the region, which foretells a prolific future for the analytic tradition in Latin America. Globalization and technological resources that allow faster communication have contributed to this development. The more stable democratic political regimes of the past thirty years have also promoted research, freedom of expression, and critical thought in the region.

Moreover, globalization and increased resources of the area have enabled Latin American philosophers to be more closely connected to each other, which favors the development of a Latin American philosophical community.[63] Indeed, there are lines of inquiry arising from the political, social, and cultural needs of the region that have enabled the development of original philosophical production in the past. These developments will surely establish themselves and multiply in the years to come.


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I am grateful to Fernando Broncano, Maite Ezcurdia, Paulo Faría, Guillermo Hurtado, Alberto Moretti, and Eduardo Lopez Rivera for the data provided and their valuable comments on a previous version of this paper.

Copyright © 2018 by
Diana Ines Perez <>

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