Precedent and Analogy in Legal Reasoning

First published Tue Jun 20, 2006

Arguments from precedent and analogy are two central forms of reasoning found in many legal systems, especially ‘Common Law’ systems such as those in England and the United States. Precedent involves an earlier decision being followed in a later case because both cases are the same. Analogy involves an earlier decision being followed in a later case because the later case is similar to the earlier one. The main philosophical problems raised by precedent and analogy are these: (1) when are two cases the ‘same’ for the purposes of precedent? (2) when are two cases ‘similar’ for the purposes of analogy? and (3) in both situations, why should the decision in the earlier case affect the decision in the later case?

The study of precedent and analogy is of interest for a number of reasons:

  1. some theorists claim that precedent involves a form of reasoning different to reasoning using rules;
  2. although arguments from precedent are extremely common in many institutional and quasi-institutional settings, not merely the law, there is no consensus on the rational basis for their force, nor indeed on whether such arguments have any rational force;
  3. some theorists argue that the use of analogies in law is not a form of ‘reasoning’ at all; and finally,
  4. even if there is an intelligible form of analogical reasoning, it is unclear why the similarity between two situations provides a reason for treating them both in the same manner.

The law presents a useful context for considering these issues because its use of precedent and analogy is well articulated and explicit. This entry is organised into the following sections:

1. Precedent and analogy in legal reasoning

Arguments from precedent and analogy are characteristic of legal reasoning. Legal reasoning differs in a number of ways from the sort of reasoning employed by individuals in their everyday lives. It frequently uses arguments that individuals do not employ, or that individuals employ in different ways. Precedent is a good example of this. In individual reasoning we do not normally regard the fact that we decided one way in the past as raising some presumption that we should decide the same way in the future. Of course there can be special circumstances that have this effect—someone may have relied on what we did before, or may have had their expectations raised that we would do so again—but absent these special considerations we do not regard ourselves as being committed in the future to make the same decision. It is always open to us to reconsider a decision and change our minds if we no longer think our original judgement was correct.

Law of course is not alone in attributing a special significance to precedent. Many institutional and quasi-institutional practices place weight on what they have done previously in determining what they should do now. Individuals, by contrast, will often disregard what they did on an earlier occasion. If they do make reference to the past, this will normally be due to their belief that what they did in the past was the right thing to do, or at least is a good guide to what is the right thing to do now. Normally, then, individuals will merely be using their past decisions in the belief that they are a reliable short-cut to working out what is the right thing to do. If they harbour doubts as to the correctness of the earlier decision then they will reopen the matter and consider it afresh on the merits. In institutional settings, on the other hand, decision-makers will often refer to what has been decided in the past as constraining what should be done now, regardless of whether they think the original decision was correct.

Equally, institutional decision-makers often regard earlier decisions as being relevant even when the decision at hand is different from the original ones, by citing them as analogies. They will argue that since an earlier decision was made on some matter, it would be inconsistent now to decide the present case differently. Individuals, by contrast, will often simply attend to the merits of the particular question before them and try to get the decision right. If it is pointed out that their current decision seems to be inconsistent with how they treated an earlier question, this may prompt them to reconsider, but is not in itself a reason to change their decision. At the end of the day they may conclude that their earlier decision was a mistake, or they may even embrace the apparent inconsistency, believing that both the earlier and the later decisions are correct even though they are not sure how they can be reconciled.

Legal reasoning, then, gives a weight to what has been decided in the past that is usually absent from personal decision-making. We care about whether we made the right decisions in the past, but we seek to make the right decisions now, unconstrained by our earlier views.

2. Precedent

Arguments from precedent are a prominent feature of legal reasoning. But what exactly is a ‘precedent’? A precedent is the decision of a court (or other adjudicative body) that has a special legal significance. That significance lies in the court's decision being regarded as having practical, and not merely theoretical, authority over the content of the law. A decision has theoretical authority if the circumstances in which it was made (the identity of the decision-makers, those involved in arguing the case, the availability of evidence or time) provide good reasons for believing the decision to be correct in law. If there are good reasons to believe that an earlier case was correctly decided, and if the facts in a later case are the same as those in the earlier case, then there are good reasons for believing that the same decision would be correct in the later case. In some legal systems earlier decisions are, officially, treated in just this way: cases are cited to courts, but courts may only justify their decisions by reference to other legal materials such as legislation. As a consequence the decision in an earlier case is not in itself regarded as a justification for reaching a decision in a later case.[1]

By contrast, precedents have practical authority because they are regarded as partly constituting the law. Simplifying somewhat, the law is what the court stated it to be because the court stated it to be such. Putting the matter in these terms is over-simplified, however, because (a) it may be that what the court did, rather than what it said, that alters the law, and (b) there are normally a number of limitations on the capacity of a decision to constitute the law (depending upon the content of the decision and the status of the body making them). An important consequence of precedents' practical authority is this: since courts are bound to apply the law, and since earlier decisions have practical authority over the content of the law (i.e., over what is the law), later courts are bound to follow the decisions of earlier cases. This is commonly known as the doctrine of precedent, or stare decisis (i.e., standing by things decided).

It should be noted that the modern Common Law endorses a particularly strong version of stare decisis, one that requires later courts to follow earlier decisions even if those cases were wrongly decided according to the pre-existing law. It is often assumed by Common Lawyers that a doctrine of stare decisis necessarily requires that later courts be bound by such erroneous decisions. This follows from the following line of thought. If later courts were not bound to follow erroneous decisions, then they would only be ‘bound’ by earlier, correct judgments. But an earlier correct judgment simply reaches the conclusion that the law already supported when it was delivered. So to direct courts to follow cases that were not erroneous would simply be to direct them to do what they are legally bound to do anyway (i.e., apply the law), thereby rendering the doctrine of precedent redundant. The flaw in this argument lies in the assumption that in every case there must be a single legally correct outcome, with other outcomes being wrong. This overlooks the possibility of cases in which the merits of the dispute are legally indeterminate, so that there is more than one possible outcome that would not be wrong. To say that a case is ‘legally indeterminate’ covers a range of situations, such as the merits of the opposing arguments being, in law, equal, or where the conflicting considerations cannot be rationally ranked against each other. In cases such as these the decision alters the law without making any error. The Common Law, then, might have limited its doctrine of stare decisis by holding that later courts were not bound by earlier decisions that were wrongly decided.[2] Instead it developed a different practice—that of ‘overruling’, whereby some courts were given a limited power to deprive earlier decisions of their binding status on the basis that they were wrongly decided. So the Common Law's version of the doctrine of precedent does not inevitably flow from the fact that precedents have practical authority. Nonetheless the idea of being bound to follow even erroneous decisions is a common feature of many institutions decision-making, and will be the focus of this entry.

The precise operation of stare decisis varies from one legal system to another. It is common for courts lower in a judicial hierarchy to be strictly bound by the decisions of higher courts, so that Federal Court judges in the United States are bound by decisions of the Federal Court of Appeals for their circuit, and the English Court of Appeal is bound by decisions of the House of Lords. The lower court is ‘strictly’ bound because it has no power to overrule the higher court's decision. Equally, most appeal courts are bound by their own earlier decisions, though they are generally entitled in certain circumstances to overrule those decisions. There is enormous variation in the circumstances that are necessary for a court to overrule one of its own decisions: at a minimum it must regard the earlier decision as wrongly decided, but generally more is required than this, e.g. that the decision is ‘clearly’ or ‘plainly’ wrong.[3]. Finally, courts are generally not bound by the decisions of lower courts: the House of Lords for example is not bound to follow decisions of the Court of Appeal and is free to overrule such decisions if it takes a different view of how the case should have been decided.

The most important limitation on the application of precedent is that the decision in an earlier case is only binding in later cases where the facts in the later case are the ‘same’ as those in the earlier case. It is agreed on all sides that if two cases are the same then the precedent applies, whereas if they are different it does not. What makes two cases the same, however, is a matter of considerable debate, and goes to the root of the question of the nature of precedent in legal reasoning. In saying that two cases are the same, it cannot be that they are identical. It is obvious that no two situations are identical in every respect: they must differ at least in having occurred at different times and/or different places. In practice the differences between any two cases will be much more significant than this, and yet they may—legally speaking—still be the same. For this reason, theorists often speak of two cases being the same in ‘all relevant respects’. Which of course simply raises the question of what makes two cases ‘relevantly’ the same.

This problem is easier to understand if a number of distinct aspects of legal cases are taken into account. Most cases do not create precedents: they turn on a dispute about the facts—who did what, when, and to whom. In these cases the job of the court is to decide on the evidence before it whose version of the facts to endorse. The parties in such cases agree about the law that applies to their dispute, they simply disagree about what actually happened. In other cases there can be a dispute over the applicable law—one side claiming that on the facts the appropriate law supports a decision in their favour and the other side disputing this account of the law and arguing that on those facts the law supports a decision in favour of them. (It goes without saying that there are also cases with disputes over both the facts and the law.) Precedents are those cases which require the courts to resolve a dispute over the law.

A precedent is the decision on the law in a case before a court or some similar legal decision-maker such as a tribunal. Paradigmatically in Common Law legal systems a judicial decision is given in a judgment which has five aspects to it:

  1. a recitation of the facts of the case, i.e., an account of what happened[4];
  2. an identification of the legal issue—the disputed question of law—which the court is being asked to resolve;
  3. the reasoning over the appropriate resolution of that issue;
  4. the ruling resolving the issue put before the court, e.g. that in these circumstances the defendant has breached a contract, or does not owe the plaintiff a duty of care, or holds the property on trust for a third party, or made a decision contrary to natural justice; and
  5. the result or outcome of the case, i.e., which party succeeded in the action; which follows from (d).

(For a more detailed discussion, see MacCormick 1987, 170ff.) To take an example, the court may be faced with a case in which the trustee of property held on behalf of the plaintiff has wrongfully transferred that property to the defendant. The plaintiff sues the defendant to recover the property which was transferred in breach of trust. The plaintiff argues that since (i) the defendant has received trust property (ii) in breach of trust and (iii) has not paid for the property, she should restore the property to the trust. The defendant argues, on the other hand, that since (iv) the trustee had a good title to the property, (v) the power to transfer it and (vi) the defendant acted in good faith, unaware of the breach of trust, she is entitled to retain it. The court will assess the situation and may rule that factors (i)–(iii) do give the plaintiff a good action, i.e., that a recipient of trust property transferred in breach of trust who has not paid for the property must restore it. In its reasoning the court will explain why the fact that the defendant received the property as a gift means that it should be restored to the trust, despite the trustee having the legal power to transfer the title.

The identification of the subset of factors (i)–(iii) that constitute the ruling is not always a straightforward task: this has to be determined from construing the judgment as a whole in the context of the area of law with which it deals. In particular it can be difficult to ascertain the appropriate level of abstraction of the descriptions of factors (i)–(iii). A person is made ill by drinking an opaque bottle of ginger beer containing a decomposing snail.[5] The manufacturer of the bottle is held to be liable to the person made ill, despite the absence of any contract between her and the manufacturer. What is the key characterisation of the vehicle of harm on these facts? The bottle of ginger beer is a beverage, but it is also a consumable, an article for human use and something capable of causing injury if negligently produced. (See further Stone 1985, 125). Generally the judgment needs to be read as a whole to determine the appropriate level: in particular the court's reasoning will tend to support one level of generality over another. In some cases, however, the level of generality will not be clear and it will not be possible to give a very precise account of the ruling. In other cases the category may be incompletely characterised: there will be examples of items falling within the category but no general characterisation of it (see Levenbook 2000, 201–11).

This point brings out an important aspect of the study of precedent. Lawyers are mostly preoccupied with two issues: (1) the question of how to determine what a precedent is authority for, e.g. how to characterise the ruling in the case (beverage? consumable? article?), or how to deal with cases where there is no single majority judgment in favour of the result, or how to treat cases which give two alternative bases for the decision; and (2) the question of when a court will be willing to overrule its own prior decisions. The most interesting philosophical questions, however, concern how precedents operate when, as is often the case, there is no doubt about what the precedent is authority for, and the later court is not free (or is unwilling) to overrule the earlier decision.

There are three ways in which it has been argued that precedents should be understood:[6] (1) as laying down rules, (2) as the application of underlying principles, and (3) as a decision on the balance of reasons.

2.1 Precedents as laying down rules

On the first approach precedents operate by laying down rules which later courts are then bound to apply to the facts before them. (For versions of this view, see Raz 1979; MacCormick 1978 (especially 82–6, 213–28) and 1987; Alexander 1989; and Schauer 1989, 469–71 and 1991, 174–87.[7]) In holding that (i)–(iii) were the crucial facts for the resolution of the case, the court is creating a rule that whenever trust property is transferred in breach of trust to a volunteer (i.e., one who does not pay for the property), the volunteer must restore the property to the beneficiary. The case decides a particular dispute, but the court creates a rule to deal with that type of dispute and applies it to the case at hand. On this view, then, precedents are akin to statutes in that they lay down rules which apply to later cases whose facts satisfy the conditions for application.

In favour of this interpretation of precedent is the distinction drawn in legal practice between what is known as the ‘ratio decidendi’ of a case and ‘obiter dicta’. The ratio of a case represents the ‘holding’ or ‘ruling’, i.e., the proposition of law for which the case is authority—it is the aspect of the case which is binding on later courts. Obiter dicta, by contrast, represent other statements and views expressed in the judgment which are not binding on later courts. On this view of precedent, the rule laid down in the earlier case is represented by the ratio.

There are a range of criticisms of the rule-making account of precedent which argue that it does not fit legal practice very well (see e.g. Moore 1987, 185–7). Two issues stand out: (i) the form in which judgments are presented, and (ii) the practice of distinguishing.

2.1.1 The form of judgments

Although the idea of the ratio decidendi is a staple of legal practice, it is notable that it is a construct from a precedent rather than an explicit feature of most legal judgments. Judgments are highly discursive texts and very rarely identify their own rationes. What is more, even if a court chooses to explicitly formulate the ratio of its decision, this precise formulation is not itself regarded as binding on later courts. (See Perry 1987, 235–7; Schauer 1989, 455; Simpson 1973, 372; Moore 1987, 185–6; Stone 1985, 123–9.)

It is often said that this creates a marked contrast with statutes, where a canonical formulation of the legal rule being laid down is provided. Given the flexibility open to later courts to determine the ratio of the earlier decision, it is misleading to think that decisions lay down binding rules for later courts. However, although there is a contrast with legislation here, it can be exaggerated. In both situations the propositions of law for which a case or statutory provision is authority must be derived from the case or statute and is not identical with the text of either. The real difference between precedent and statute lies in the fact that in the case of statutes legal systems have elaborate conventions of interpretation to assist in the process of deriving the law from a legislative text, whereas in the case of precedents they do not. But this simply shows that the law derived from precedents may be vaguer and more indeterminate than that derived from (many) statutes; it does not establish that precedents do not create legal rules.

2.1.2 The practice of distinguishing

An integral part of legal reasoning using precedents is the practice of distinguishing. Distinguishing involves a precedent not being followed even though the facts of the later case fall within the scope of the ratio of the earlier case. As the later case falls within the scope of the earlier ratio (i.e., within the scope of the rule), one might expect that the decision in the later case must be the same (unless the court has the power to overrule the earlier case and decides to do so). In legal reasoning using precedents, however, the later court is free not to follow the earlier case by pointing to some difference in the facts between the two cases, even though those facts do not feature in the ratio of the earlier case.

Take the trust example: in a later case the recipient of trust property may not have paid for the property, but may have relied on the receipt in entering into another arrangement (e.g. in using the property as security for a loan). The later court may hold that the recipient is entitled to retain the property and justify its decision by ruling that where (i) the defendant has received trust property (ii) in breach of trust and (iii) has not paid for the property, but has (vii) relied upon the receipt to disadvantageously alter her position, then the defendant is entitled to retain the property. (This result would still leave the beneficiary with a claim against the trustee for the value of the property.)

The effect of distinguishing, then, is that the later court is free not to follow a precedent that, prima facie, applies to it, by making a ruling which is narrower than that made in the precedent case. The only formal constraints on the later court are that: (1) in formulating the ratio of the later case, the factors in the ratio of the earlier case (i.e., (i)–(iii)) must be retained, and (2) the ruling in the later case must be such that it would still support the result reached in the precedent case. In short, the ruling in the second case must not be inconsistent with the result in the precedent case, but the court is otherwise free to make a ruling narrower than that in the precedent. Hence the more accurate statements of the doctrine of precedent are to the effect that a later court must either follow or distinguish a binding precedent—a disjunctive obligation.

At a formal level the practice of distinguishing can be reconciled with the view that rationes are rules by arguing that later courts have the power to modify the rule in the earlier case. An analogy can be drawn to the power to overrule earlier decisions: just as judges can overrule earlier cases, they can also modify earlier law, thereby paralleling the power of legislators to either repeal or amend the law. The analogy, however, is very imperfect. There are two difficulties: (a) Common Lawyers do not conceptualise overruling and distinguishing in this parallel way, and (b) the rationale for a power with this particular scope is unclear.

On the first point, Common Lawyers ordinarily think of precedents as constituting the law up and until they are overruled. Once overruled the later decision is (normally) given retroactive effect, so the law is changed for the past as well as the future. But when a case is distinguished it is not often thought that the law was one thing until the later decision of a court, and now another thing. The law will be regarded prior to the later decision as already subject to various distinctions not mentioned by the earlier court. Indeed part of the skill of a good common lawyer is grasping the law as not stated by the earlier court: learning that cases are ‘distinguishable’ is a staple part of common law education, and no common lawyer would be competent who did not appreciate that the law was not to be identified simply with the ratio of an earlier decision. Common lawyers do not, then, conceptualise distinguishing along lines analogous to overruling.

On the second point, one of the peculiarities of distinguishing is that it cuts across the normal justifications for having rules, namely to have a class of cases treated in a certain way despite individual variation between them, with attendant gains in predictability and transparency in the decision-making process. Instead, the later court is free to avoid the result indicated by the earlier ratio so long as it can find some difference in facts between the two cases that narrows the earlier ratio while still supporting the result in the earlier case. What is more, this power is not merely given to courts of the same level of authority as the one laying down the precedent (as is the case with overruling), but is given to every court lower in the judicial hierarchy. So the Court of Appeal in England cannot overrule a decision of the House of Lords (nor even its own decisions ordinarily), but it is free to distinguish a decision of the House of Lords even when the case before it falls within the ratio of the House of Lords decision. So on the rule-making view of precedent lower courts have the power to narrow the rules laid down by higher courts, just so long as the narrower rule would still support the result reached in the earlier case. It is unclear why lower courts should be given a power to narrow rulings of higher courts in this particularly circumscribed manner.

Two ways in which distinguishing can be made less idiosyncratic are these: (a) to argue that the later court is restricted to making a modification which the earlier court would have made if confronted with the current facts (cf. Raz 1979, 187–8), i.e., that distinguishing is a form of reinterpretation of the original ratio; or (b) to argue that there is a presumption against distinguishing (Schauer 1989, 469–71; 1991, 174–87). Each of these approaches echo forms of legal reasoning found in statutory construction. The first, in asking what the earlier court would have done, assimilates the task of distinguishing to that of determining the law-maker's intent behind their ruling. This is parallel to the practice of interpreting statutes in terms of legislative intent. The alternative approach of there being a presumption against distinguishing parallels the creation of exceptions to statutory rules.[8]

The problem with these two suggestions is that the practice of distinguishing does not conform to either of these constraints: while courts do consider the earlier decision in order to see if the ratio can be reinterpreted, they also introduce distinctions without recourse to the earlier court's views; and they do not typically approach the task of distinguishing as if there is a presumption against it. As a matter of legal practice, then, there are no legal restrictions of this kind on the later court. Distinguishing, then, does not seem to fit easily with the understanding of rationes as creating binding legal rules. (See also Perry 1987, 237–9 on distinguishing.)

A third way which purports to deal with the problem of distinguishing on the rule model is to argue that the ‘rule’ for which the decision is binding is not the precedent court's ruling, but something narrower—the ‘material facts’ that were ‘necessary’ for the result of the case. (See Goodhart 1930, 1959; and see also Burton 1995, 25–58, 60–5 on ‘case-specific facts’ and Eisenberg 1988, 51–4 on ‘minimalist’ and ‘result-centred’ techniques.) This approach makes use of the fact that decisions do not provide canonical formulations of the ratio to argue that the ratio is not to be identified with the court's stated ruling on the issue. The effect of such an approach is to narrow what is regarded as binding in the case to those facts which were crucial to the actual outcome, rather than the stated ruling applied to those facts. The difficulties with this approach are three-fold:

(1) it goes against general legal practice, which usually does identify the ratio with the ruling made by the precedent court (see Simpson 1961, 168–9; MacCormick 1978, 82–3, 1987, 157–8; Raz 1979, 184; Eisenberg 1988, 51–61)[9];

(2) if the precedent court's own characterisation of its ruling is abandoned, there is no coherent way to settle on the ‘material facts’ (Stone 1964, 267–80, 1985, 123–9). Take the case of the recipient of trust property transferred in breach of trust. A key aspect of the facts is that the recipient did not pay for the property. But why is this ‘material’? If the court's own reasoning is put to one side, is it because no consideration was given (so had a token been provided that would have been sufficient); or that inadequate consideration was provided (so more than a token would be necessary); or that a reasonable price was not paid; or that the price was not what the beneficiary would have been willing to accept for the transfer; or that the price is not the best which the trustee could have obtained on the open market? All of the preceding descriptions of the facts are true, but which is ‘material’? The requirement for any of them would invalidate the transfer.

(3) Even if there is some way to characterise the ‘material’ facts, it does not eliminate distinguishing. Take later trust case, for example, in which the recipient has paid nothing for the trust property but has acted detrimentally in reliance on the receipt. The recipient is still a ‘volunteer’ who has not transferred anything to the trustee for the property, but there has been reliance upon the receipt. This may well lead a later court to distinguish the earlier case, although the facts are otherwise identical to those in the original case. On the other hand, if the claim is that the precedent case is only binding when both (a) the ‘material facts’ are present, and (b) no other relevant facts are present, then it is no longer a ‘rule-based’ account of precedent—it is simply reasserting the minimal requirement that the decision in the later case must not be inconsistent with the result reached in the precedent case.

2.2 Precedents as the application of underlying principles

A different response to the problem of distinguishing is to relocate the binding force of precedents in the justification for the earlier decision, rather than in the ruling itself. (See Perry 1987, esp. 234ff and Moore 1987 for two versions of this view.) This approach has three principal attractions. The first is that it explains the lengthy expositions of the reasoning for the result found in many decisions. It is the reasons that contain the gist of the decision, and so it is to this question that most attention is directed by the courts in justifying their decisions. Secondly, this accounts for the fact that courts do not bother (and indeed lack the power) to lay down a precise formulation of their rationes. The ratio does not lay down a rule which must be followed by later courts, but is simply a convenient short-hand way of referring to the overall effect of the principles justifying the result in the case (Perry 1987, 235, 239). Thirdly, and most significantly, this approach provides a natural explanation for the practice of distinguishing. A later case is distinguishable where the justification for the result in the precedent does not apply to the different facts of that case, even if it might seem to fall within the ratio of the decision.

Despite its attractions, the ‘underlying principles’ account faces three major difficulties: (i) the scope of distinguishing; (ii) accounting for the role played by rationes; and (iii) maintaining the distinction between precedent and analogy. The initial difficulty arises from the fact that distinguishing is not restricted to the application of the justification provided by the earlier decision. Any good argument can provide the basis for distinguishing, for example by showing that the novel facts in the later case provide considerations which outweigh the original justification: it is not that the original justification is inapplicable to the novel facts, it is simply that those facts raise additional considerations that are more compelling. So later courts go beyond what was done in the earlier decision in determining whether to distinguish the later case.

One possible line of response to these difficulties is to abandon the idea that what is binding is the precedent court's justification for its decision. After all, the standard view is that later courts are bound by the ruling in the precedent, not its reasoning. Instead, it is argued, whether the earlier decision must be followed in the later case turns on applying the best justification for the earlier decision. But not the best justification for that decision, taken in isolation. Rather, what is binding in law is the set of principles which best fit and justify the totality of the results in past decisions (e.g. Moore 1987, 201, 210; cf. Dworkin 1975, 110–23[10]). From this perspective, distinguishing is not restricted to applying the earlier court's justification for its decision, but in applying the justifications for the doctrine of which that decision forms a part.[11]

The second difficulty, however, applies to both versions of this approach, viz. accounting for the role played by rationes. The practice of precedent involves later courts being bound to either follow or distinguish the earlier decision, but only if the facts of the later case fall within the terms of the ratio. The ratio plays an indispensable role in fixing the scope of the later court's duty to follow or distinguish—it is only if the facts of the later case fall within the ratio that this question arises. This role is not appropriately captured by arguing that it is the justifications, and not the ratio, which are binding.[12] (Cf. Moore 1987, 185–7, 211–3). What the approach does help to highlight, on the other hand, is the role played in the practice of precedent by the justification for decisions. As noted above, determining the ratio is not a mechanical exercise: it involves understanding what was decided in a case—by reference to what was said in the judgment, earlier cases, and the general understanding of that area of the law. The precedent court's own justification for its decision plays an important role in determining the level of abstraction of the factors in the ratio, and for providing arguments for a narrower or wider reading of those factors.[13]

This is related to another point: if the underlying justification for a precedent is binding then it undermines the distinction between arguments from precedent and those by analogy. The ratio of the precedent sets the outer limit of what is binding on later courts—i.e., what a later court is bound to either follow or distinguish. Analogies (as will be argued below) are grounded in the underlying rationale for earlier decisions, but they do not bind later courts. If the underlying justification of precedents were binding, rather than the ratio, then analogies would be binding and legal reasoning would have a different shape.

2.3 Precedents as decisions on the balance of reasons

If a precedent is not laying down a rule, nor binding in terms of its underlying justification, how should it be regarded? One alternative is to think of the precedent as representing a decision on the balance of reasons in the individual case before the court that later courts are required to treat as correctly decided (see Lamond 2005). The precedent court took a range of facts into account in reaching its decision. Those facts—facts such as the breach of trust, the trustee having power to transfer the property, the recipient being a volunteer, and the good faith of the recipient—ground reasons for reaching some particular legal conclusion. On this approach, what the ratio provides is a statement of the factors which the court regarded as providing the reasons that were crucial for reaching its result. So the ratio represents the view of the court that those facts spoke in favour of the outcome, and that they were not defeated by any combination of the other factors present in the case. For example, the court decides that the recipient of trust property must hold the property on trust if they are a volunteer even though they acted in good faith. In reaching its conclusion the court must deliberate on the competing merits of these two parties and decide which is better supported. Both parties were ignorant of the dishonesty or incompetence of the trustee, so neither is favoured on that score; the recipient has acquired property which the trustee did have the legal power (though not the right) to transfer, so upholding the security of property transactions favours allowing the innocent recipient to obtain the complete title to the property (leaving the beneficiary with a personal claim for damages against the defaulting trustee); the principle that no-one can transfer a greater interest than they possess favours the beneficiary. Other considerations favour one or other of the parties. In making its ruling, the court concludes that in the circumstances of the case before it the merits favour the beneficiary of the trust rather than the recipient.

What is the difference between this approach and that in terms of precedents laying down rules? It lies in the fact that instead of the ratio representing a rule which presumptively settles the disposition of later cases whose facts fall within its scope, it provides a pro tanto justification for such a disposition, i.e., other things being equal this is how the later case should be decided. And it is this that provides a natural explanation for the practice of distinguishing. The correct statement of the doctrine of precedent is that later courts are bound by cases—not simply by rationes—and bound to either follow or distinguish them. So later courts whose case-facts fall within the scope of the ratio must consider the precedent, but do so in order to consider whether the differences in facts between the later and the precedent cases justify deciding the cases differently. What the later court cannot do, on the other hand, is to distinguish on the basis of factors that were present in the earlier case (even if they were not part of the decision's ratio), because to do so would be to imply that the earlier decision had reached the wrong conclusion on the balance of reasons. A later court cannot treat the case as wrongly decided, unless it is able and willing to overrule it

The idea that a precedent is reaching a conclusion on the balance of reasons in the particular case at hand makes sense of a number of other features of common law judgments. It explains the practice of providing elaborate accounts of the circumstances of the case, even though only a small subset of those circumstances matter to the ratio, since they were the group of factors that the court considered in reaching its decision. It is also consistent with the lengthy discussions of the reasons for the conclusion, and the lack of interest on the part of courts in providing a carefully worded formulation of the ratio: what matters is the substance of the factors considered in reaching the decision, not the particular language in which they are couched.

The main challenge for this account of precedent lies in explaining when a later court is bound to follow a precedent which it regards as having been incorrectly decided. In the case of the trust property, the later court may think the precedent court mistaken to have concluded that the recipient must return the property to the beneficiary. May a later court avoid the result of the precedent by pointing to any general factual difference between the cases (e.g. this is real property rather than personal property, this is an implied rather than an express trust), and distinguish the precedent by stating a narrower ratio? After all, the balance of reasons never supported the precedent in the first place, so shouldn't it be confined to the narrowest possible statement of its facts? In which case precedents seem to have very little binding force indeed.

One obvious possibility for avoiding this problem would be to ask how the precedent court would have assessed the facts in later case. But although this would be satisfactory in theory (if sometimes difficult in practice), it again does not reflect legal practice. Courts sometimes approach the question in this way, but often they do not, and there is no legal requirement that they do so. A better response is this: the basic common law requirement in stare decisis is to treat earlier cases as correctly decided. A case may be distinguished, but only if that distinction does not imply that the precedent was wrongly decided. So in the later case the court must decide whether the factual difference (real versus personal property, implied versus express trust) provides a better justification against the earlier decision than the facts of that case on their own. If it does, then the court may distinguish (citing that differences with the original case), since that does not imply that precedent was mistaken. If not—because real property or implied trusts raise no special considerations in this context—then the precedent must be followed. This approach, of course, assumes that it is possible to make these sorts of comparative judgements (for arguments that this is not generally possible see Alexander 1989, 34–7).

3. The Justifications for Precedent

Most discussions of precedent focus on the justifications for having a doctrine of stare decisis by which later courts are bound to follow earlier decisions. There is, of course, a prior question of why the decisions of courts should be regarded as making law at all. In some Civilian legal systems, such as the French, the official view is that court decisions do not make law, they merely involve the application of the law. This follows from a straightforward understanding of the separation of powers: the responsibility of the legislator is to make law, the responsibility of the judiciary is to faithfully apply the law made by the legislator. For the courts to make law would be to usurp the legislative function, and to usurp a function to which the courts have no legitimate claim. One distinctive feature of Common Law systems is the existence of central areas of law that have no legislative foundations—such as contract, tort, trusts, and personal property. All of these areas have seen legislative intervention, but most Common Law jurisdictions still leave them on a non-statutory footing. Here the decisions of the courts are the basis of the law.

In practice no modern legal system has functioned without the decisions of the courts playing at least an auxiliary role in settling the content of the law. To take one well-known example, in France the law of civil wrongs (torts, delicts) is based upon five relatively short articles of the Code Civil (§§ 1382–1386). Formally, the law is found in those five articles, and a court decision is legally flawed if it does not cite at least one of them as the basis for its ruling. But there is a vast body of cases interpreting and applying those articles, and these cases are regularly cited before the courts to assist them in reaching their decisions, even though judgments themselves do not mention earlier cases. In substance, then, if not in form, this area is partly constituted by judge-made law.

So one question that can be raised about precedent is why it is justifiable for the decisions of courts to be treated in this way at all, i.e., for them to help constitute the law. There is a more specialised question, however. In the Common Law at least, the doctrine of stare decisis requires later courts to follow earlier decisions even if they were wrongly decided. To say that a case was ‘wrongly decided’ is to say that the legally permissible reasons relevant to the case did not, all things considered, support the conclusion reached by the court. It should be emphasised that such a conclusion depends upon and is relative to the context provided by existing legal doctrine. Take the question of whether parents should be able to recover for the cost of raising a healthy child when it has been born as a result of a negligently performed sterilisation operation on one of the parents. In some legal systems such costs are recoverable, whereas in others they are not. Here it is quite possible that these conflicting decisions are both correct, in the sense that each is correct within its own doctrinal context. So whether a decision is wrong is not a question of how the case ought to be decided without any reference to the law, but whether it goes against the merits of the legally relevant reasons.

The doctrine of precedent thus raises two justificatory issues: (a) why treat court decisions as partly constituting the law, and (b) why require later courts to follow erroneous decisions of earlier courts?[14] The most influential arguments responding to these issues are based upon considerations of:

  1. consistency
  2. expectations
  3. replicability
  4. the need for law-making

(For general discussions of the justification for precedent, see: Schauer 1987, 595–602, Golding 1984, 98–100, Benditt 1987, 89–93.)

3.1 Consistency

The argument from consistency is related to arguments in favour of ‘formal’ justice, i.e., that two cases which are the same (in relevant respects) should be treated in the same way. It would simply be inconsistent to treat them differently. In the case of precedent this argument is said to favour following the earlier case: assuming that one cannot change the earlier decision (because it is too late to appeal, or the party to the case has reasonably relied upon it, etc), the only way to ensure consistency is for later decision-makers to treat the earlier decision as a precedent. The claim of consistency is also sometimes put in terms of ‘equality’: to treat the later case differently to the first would be to fail to treat the parties before the courts equally. This argument is made independently of other concerns such as parties' expectations or community perceptions of the court process or the problem of moral disagreement. Arguments of this kind certainly have weight in some circumstances. If a legal system is morally legitimate and has authority over those subject to it, then it is inconsistent for one person to be treated less or more favourably by the law than another person whose situation is legally indistinguishable. Other things being equal, legal decisions should be consistent across time and/or decision-makers. A later case should only be treated differently to an earlier case when the law itself has been changed (by the legislator or the courts, including cases where the court overrules an earlier decision in reaching a decision on the case before it) So concerns of consistency provide some justification for treating earlier decisions as sources of law, rather than approaching each question anew when it arises again.

This fact does not, however, support a doctrine of following earlier decisions even when they are wrong, i.e., for having a strong practice of stare decisis. If the earlier decision was wrong then the person subject to it may have been treated more or less favourably than they should have been treated. If they were treated more favourably then clearly that should have been corrected (e.g. on appeal). If it was not corrected then the person had an undeserved slice of good fortune. But that a mistake was made in the earlier case is not—in itself—an argument for repeating the mistake in the later case. The first litigant did not deserve their outcome, even if for reasons of the finality of legal processes they are entitled to retain it. Equality does not demand the repetition of mistakes. On the other hand, if the original litigant was treated less favourably than they deserved then again that mistake should be corrected if it can be (e.g. by appeal, or, if that is too late, by remedial legislation or by executive action such as pardon or ex gratia payments), but it is no reason for treating a later litigant unfavourably as well. Taken in isolation from other considerations (such as expectations and predictability), equality does not support the bindingness of incorrect decisions.

By contrast, arguments of equality bite where the court in the original case was confronted with a situation where the correct outcome was indeterminate, i.e., where more than one outcome was possible in light of the legally permissible arguments. This may be due to each outcome being equally well supported by reason, or by the outcomes being supported by different, incommensurable, values. In some of these cases the law has closure rules to settle the matter, e.g. in favour of criminal defendants, but in others there are no closure rules as to the appropriate substantive result to endorse. A possible illustration of such indeterminacy is the position of a person who quite innocently buys stolen goods. In some legal systems the purchaser acquires good title to those goods, whereas in others (such as the Common Law) she does not. Here, arguably, the merits of the two innocent parties (the purchaser and the original owner) are on a par, and all the law can do is choose which one is to prevail. So where an outcome is underdetermined there are arguments of equality for later courts following the earlier decision rather than adopting any of the other possible solutions. None of this, of course, is an argument for following earlier decisions that were wrongly decided, since these are cases where the earlier court did not make a mistake, but took one permissible option.

3.2 Expectations

Another common argument in favour of precedent is in terms of protecting expectations: if an institution has dealt with an issue in one way in the past, then that creates the expectation that it will do so in the future—an expectation which people use to plan their lives and enjoy some control over their situations.[15] So there are good reasons for an institution to follow its previous decisions (other things being equal), even if it turns out that they were mistaken.

The fundamental problem with this line of argument in the case of precedent is that it suffers from a type of circularity. It is true that legal systems that follow a practice of precedent create expectations that earlier decisions will be followed in the future. But it is important to bear in mind that it is only legitimate expectations which need to be considered in decision-making, not any expectation which someone forms. The mere fact that a decision was made in the past provides no reason in itself to expect that it will be followed in the future, and certainly creates no entitlement to expect that it will be followed. That a company orders stationery from a supplier at the start of the year may raise a hope, and even possibly an expectation, that it will do so again later in the year, but the supplier does not have a ‘legitimate’ expectation that it will do so, and the company does not create a precedent for itself. Where there is an institutional practice of following past decisions, on the other hand, the reliance of those subject to future decisions may ground legitimate expectations, but it is always open to the institution to announce that it will no longer treat past decisions as binding and will, instead, decide each case on its merits. Equally, it is a common occurrence in some institutional settings where past decisions are followed for a decision to be made subject to the proviso that it is ‘not setting a precedent’ for the future.

Whether a past decision creates legitimate expectations, therefore, depends upon there being good independent reasons for the institution to follow its earlier decisions, or upon the existence of a practice of doing so. But the practice itself should only be maintained if there are good independent reasons for having it: its mere existence cannot bootstrap a justification for the maintenance of the practice.

3.3 Replicability

The preceding arguments for precedent presuppose that decision-makers can correctly ascertain the merits of the cases before them, but law of course operates under non-ideal conditions where decision-makers make mistakes and disagree among themselves about the merits of cases. In practice, the outcome of a case may be uncertain not simply because the correct result is rationally indeterminate, but because the decision-makers are fallible. Given this, a practice of precedent in law, it can be argued, has a number of advantages due the fact that it may make institutional decisions replicable (see Eisenberg 1988, 10–12, 23–4, whose coinage it is; and Schauer 1987, 597–8). That a decision is replicable refers to the fact that it is possible for others to make an informed judgement on the likelihood of a particular outcome, in the light of the relevant legal materials, the canons of reasoning used in a system, and an acquaintance with the general culture from which the decision-makers are drawn. Replicability means that decisions are more predictable than if they were made de novo each time. This, in turn, allows individuals to make plans that are consistent with the law and to avoid falling foul of it, and hence allows them to be guided by the law.

This provides a rationale both for treating earlier cases as contributing to the law and for the doctrine of stare decisis. Other things being equal, it is better if the law is predictable than if it is unpredictable. It should be noted, however, that such a rationale does not necessarily support as strong a doctrine of precedent as that found in many Common Law jurisdictions. The concern for predictability needs to be weighed against the moral desirability of the law in question. This would suggest that (a) in some circumstances lower courts should be allowed to depart from the decisions of higher courts where their view is that the earlier decision was (in the context of the relevant law) clearly morally undesirable, (b) giving greater freedom to courts to overrule their own decisions on the basis that there was a morally preferable decision (in that legal context).

3.4 Law-making

A final justification for the doctrine of precedent is that it is desirable to give courts the power to make law. The thought here is that it is valuable for the courts to have the power to improve and supplement the law (Hart 1994, 135–6; Raz 1979, 194–201). The assumption underlying this justification is that the law is sometimes incomplete and in need of being given greater specificity, or that it is erroneous and needs to be corrected. On this view the courts are analogous to delegated legislators: they have limited powers to make law within a broader framework of doctrine.

Although the need for law-making is often cited as a justification for precedent, the substance of the argument normally boils down to concerns with either equality or replicability. If the law has resolved an indeterminacy in one (acceptable) way in the past, then precedent helps to ensure that future litigants are treated as (un)favourably as past litigants, and so all are treated equally. In addition, if the application of the law is indeterminate, due to the type of value conflict involved or the nature of the decision-makers, then it is desirable for judicial decisions to constitute precedents in order to make the law more replicable in the future.

On the other hand, if the argument in favour of courts having law-making power is that they can thereby improve the law, this is really an argument in favour of having the power to overrule precedents, rather than an argument in favour of precedent in the first place. Indeed, the need for a power to overrule only arises if earlier decisions are binding even when mistaken, since later courts could otherwise simply disregard decisions that were erroneous. So the argument from law-making, when distinct from arguments from replicability and equality, is an argument for the power to overrule, rather than an argument for stare decisis itself.[16]

In conclusion, both equality and replicability provide arguments in favour of judicial decisions constituting sources of law. And the value of replicability also supports a doctrine of stare decisis by which later courts are sometimes bound even by the erroneous decisions of earlier courts. This in turn leads to the need for courts to have the power to overrule existing law, so that there is scope for incorrect decisions to be reversed.

4. Analogy

An analogical argument in legal reasoning is an argument that a case should be treated in a certain way because that is the way a similar case has been treated. Arguments by analogy complement arguments from precedent in two ways: (i) they are used when the facts of a case do not fall within the ratio of any precedent, in order to assimilate the result to that in the analogical case; and (ii) they are used when the facts of a case do fall within the ratio of a precedent, as a basis for distinguishing the case at hand from the precedent. The force of an argument from analogy is different to that from precedent. An indistinguishable precedent must be followed unless the court has the power to overrule the earlier decision and does so. By contrast, arguments from analogy vary in their strengths: from very ‘close’ analogies (which strongly support a result) to more ‘remote’ analogies (which weakly support a result). Analogies do not bind: they must be considered along with other reasons in order to reach a result. That an analogy is rejected in one case does not preclude raising the analogy in a different case.

Analogies, like precedents, arise within a doctrinal context. The case at hand raises a legal issue, e.g. does the impersonation of a boyfriend vitiate the victim's consent in the law of rape, is cross-burning protected ‘speech’ within the First Amendment to the US Constitution, does the defence of duress require the defendant to have acted as a reasonable person would have done? Other cases dealing with the validity of consent or the scope of protected ‘speech’ or reasonableness in defences provide potential analogies. An analogy may either be to another case or to another legal doctrine, and the analogy rests on there being some common characterisation of the facts in both cases or the two doctrines which is relevant to the issue. So knives may be analogous to guns if the issue concerns weapons, but knives may also be analogous to teaspoons if the issue concerns cutlery. Duress may be analogous to provocation if the issue concerns defences, but duress may also be analogous to incitement if the issue concerns complicity. Two doctrines or sets of facts are not analogous in the abstract, but in the context of a legal issue.[17]

Two questions arise about analogical reasoning. Firstly, by what process does a decision-maker identify the ‘common characterisation’ between the case at hand and the analogous one? Secondly, what type of justificatory force does the common characterisation provide? On the first question, just as no two cases are identical in every respect, so no two cases are such that some common characterisation of the facts cannot be found. But not every case is thought to provide an analogy, so what limits or directs the selection of analogies? The answer to this question flows into the issue of the justificatory force of analogies. What sort of reason does an analogy provide for deciding the instant case in the same way?

It is widely agreed that the existence of an analogy depends ultimately upon the justification for the analogical decision. The facts in a case may fall outside the ratio of an existing precedent, and thus the court is not bound by the precedent. On the other hand the justification for the earlier decision may apply to the later case, and thus provide an argument from analogy. Take the case of the impersonation of a boyfriend in the law of rape. Assume that there is authority for the proposition that the impersonation of a husband vitiates consent for the purposes of rape. Whether the impersonation of a boyfriend is analogous depends upon why such a marital impersonation vitiates consent. If it is thought that part of the significance of being married is the sharing of physical intimacy with that particular person, then the rationale is applicable to other close personal relationships. If instead the rationale is that consent to an impersonator involves committing an act of adultery, i.e., an act different in kind to that consented to, then although the two situations are obviously very similar, the analogy will fail.

It is often argued that reasoning by analogy and distinguishing precedents are mirror images of each other: given the facts of two cases, the question is whether there is a good reason for treating them differently (e.g. Eisenberg 1988, 87). In the case of distinguishing, a precedent must be followed unless there are good reasons for treating it differently. In the case of analogy, it is said, a precedent must be extended unless there are good reasons for treating the instant case differently. But this is misleading, since the symmetry is incomplete. A precedent cannot be distinguished on grounds that would, in substance, imply that the precedent was wrongly decided: it must be treated as correctly decided. A precedent need not be extended, however, if later courts regard its rationale as unpersuasive. A longstanding doctrine of the common law was that a husband could not commit the offence of rape against his wife. By the twentieth century the rule was increasingly recognised to be archaic and objectionable. Thus, unlike the question of impersonation discussed above, no one suggested that the rule should be extended to cohabiting couples.[18] Where a decision is not regarded as misguided, however, it does provide an argument for being followed. The later court may still decide, however, that it would not be desirable, all things considered, to do so.

The explanation for the justificatory force of such resemblances is, however, controversial. There are two major alternative accounts, the one relying on principles, the other on reasons.

4.1 Principles

An influential view on analogy regards it as grounded in the principles that underlie existing cases (e.g. MacCormick 1978, 152–94; Eisenberg 1988, 83–96; Sunstein 1993). A body of cases can be examined to determine which principle (or set of coherent principles) explains and justifies those decisions, in a process akin to reflective equilibrium. The process is only akin to reflective equilibrium because the individual cases (the equivalent of the specific judgements about particular situations) are either immune from revision, or are highly resistant to revision. So the principles must map the decided cases precisely, or must depart from only a small proportion of them. If the principle(s) identified in this process apply to the instant case, then that provides a good reason in favour of the result supported by the principle.

A number of criticisms question whether this account captures what is normally going on in analogical reasoning. One criticism focuses on the fact that the principle must track the existing cases and try to make the best of them. Unless the decisions are all correct on the merits, any principle based on them must itself be flawed: for if it were morally correct it would not support the mistaken decisions. The question this raises is whether it can be justifiable to use such a principle to decide a novel case, rather than decide the case on its own merits. Can there be ‘principles’ of this kind, which are neither conventional parts of a practice nor morally correct? (see further Alexander 1996b, 1998, Alexander and Kress 1995, 1997) A more common view, however, is that a principle that makes best sense of a series of cases or aspects of legal doctrine can have some justificatory force even though the cases or doctrines are morally imperfect. In the case of tort liability, for example, the cases might be best explained by the principle that liability will only arise where the defendant's conduct has been unreasonable, i.e., that both harm to the plaintiff and unreasonable conduct is necessary for liability. This principle may be morally mistaken, i.e., there may be situations where even reasonable conduct should result in legal liability. Nevertheless the principle may still be regarded as having some justificatory force in the context of that legal system. A judge might think that the correct moral principle is that other things being equal there should be no liability without unreasonable conduct. But although the law is imperfect in this way, the legal principle still has some force because it is a near enough neighbour to the correct principle and it explains the existing cases.[19]

A separate line of criticism centres on the fact that courts do not often articulate their use of analogies in terms of some ‘principle’ inherent in an earlier case. Where principles are used as arguments for a result, earlier cases tend to be cited as illustrations of the application of the principle, rather than as analogies to the facts of the case at hand. If another case is cited as providing an analogy, the emphasis will be on how ‘close’ the analogy is, i.e., on how specific the common characterisation of the facts of the two cases is, and how that characterisation relates to the rationale for the earlier decision. The more specific an analogy, the stronger; the more abstract the characterisation, the weaker the argument as an analogy. The reason for this is that the more specific the analogy, the less room there is for distinguishing the two cases, whereas the more abstract the analogy the more grounds on which the two cases may be regarded as significantly different. So if it is lawful to consent to tatooing, it is also lawful to consent to a decorative branding, which is closely analogous.[20] On the other hand, the analogy of boxing to sadomasochistic activities is more remote, although both involve the intentional infliction of a certain level of harm.[21]

This last point relates to the fact that cases are rarely justified solely on the basis of principles: instead there are a range of considerations which are applicable and justify the result. A principle may apply with equal force to two cases with very different facts, but those differences may make the cases not very analogous. What this suggests is that while principles do provide arguments for reaching a certain result, they do not explain the nature of analogical reasoning.

4.2 Reasons

The reasons-based approach to analogical reasoning focuses on the justifications for the analogical case (for two very different accounts see Raz 1979, 201–6 and Brewer 1996). It considers the extent to which the rationale for the decision in the earlier case is applicable to the case at hand. Take the case of the impersonation of a boyfriend in the law of rape. Whether this situation is analogous to the impersonation of a husband depends on the reasons for the latter vitiating consent. There need be no single principle that underlies the rationale: it may rest on a number of factors that reinforce the conclusion.

One consequence of this approach is that if the rationale for the earlier decision is tied exclusively to the particular category used in the ratio, there will be no scope for analogical extension to broader categories. In English law duress is not a defence to murder regardless of the circumstances, due (it is said) to the uniqueness of deliberate killing and the fact that duress is, at best, an excuse. On this rationale there is no room for arguing that duress should be excluded in cases of physically disabling a victim. On the question of whether duress could be a partial defence to murder, on the other hand, there is an arguable analogy to the excuse of provocation, which operates to reduce murder to manslaughter. Killing may be inexcusable, but that does not mean that every deliberate killing warrants a conviction for murder. Of course, duress involves an actual decision to kill, whereas provocation a temporary loss of self-control. The case for reducing killing under duress to manslaughter depends upon whether the rationale for provocation (e.g. as a concession to human frailty) extends to it. Two factors—the defendant's loss of self-control and the victim's involvement in the killing—readily distinguish the two situations, and weaken any analogy.

The reasons-based approach helps to explain why individual cases, and individual doctrines, can ground analogies. It also explains what is accurate in the principles-based approach, since some of the considerations underlying analogical cases will be principles. But there are more legal considerations than principles, and these too play a role in analogical reasoning.

5. The Justification for Analogical Reasoning

Why does the law make use of arguments by analogy, rather than simply deciding novel cases on their own merits? In ordinary moral deliberation, analogies are used to argue that one disputed situation is indistinguishable from another situation where the merits are relatively clear. They leave three main responses open: (a) that the case is indeed indistinguishable since the same rationale applies to both; (b) that the case is distinguishable; or (c) that the case is indistinguishable, but upon reflection the assessment of the original case was mistaken. (Reflection on another case might, of course, lead one to conclude that one's original assessment was mistaken, even though the two cases are distinguishable.) As a result, analogies are useful heuristic devices for deepening and sharpening reflection on the merits. It is also the case that people are often more confident in their judgements about various concrete cases than they are about abstract theories that attempt to account for their judgements, and so regard this is a more profitable way to approach a question (see Sunstein 1993, 775–7).

In law, by contrast, analogies carry a weight additional to the merits of the case. The approach of courts is complex. Some decisions and doctrines are regarded as mistakes and have no analogical weight. Other doctrines may be regarded as imperfect—not wholly correct—but do have analogical weight. Other still may be regarded as simply correct, and their existence provides further support for adopting the view in the novel case. There are a number of possible indirect benefits that accrue from the practice of analogical reasoning, such as exposing judges to a wider variety of fact situations than the particular set before them, making them consider the views of other judges in previous cases and exerting a conservative pressure on individual decision-makers (see Sherwin 1999). But is there any more fundamental rationale to the form of reasoning?

Like precedent, analogies cannot be justified by recourse to expectations. Whether there is an expectation of analogies being followed, such expectations will only be justified if there are good independent reasons for using analogies in this way. Consistency may provide a rationale for a limited exercise of analogy. Where an earlier case has settled some indeterminacy in the application of the law, and where the rationale for the earlier decision is equally applicable to the later facts, then it would be inconsistent to decide the later case differently.

The strongest justification for analogical reasoning, however, lies in the value of replicability. This is often put in terms of the importance of ‘coherence’ in the law (MacCormick 1978, 153, 187–8; Sunstein 1993, 778–9; see also Raz 1979, 204–6 on ‘partial reform’). Arguments in favour of coherence normally emphasise its instrumental value.[22] This is tied up with the replicability of legal decision-making. There are two important characteristics of legal decision-making. The first is the fragmentary nature of legal materials. The second is the plurality of decision-making bodies. Legal materials—precedents, statutes, conventions, principles—are fragmentary in two senses: (a) they are the work of many different hands at different times and with different outlooks and (b) different areas of law owe more to some hands and times than others. As a result legal doctrine tends to exhibit only a thin global coherence, whereas it may possess a thick local coherence. The pluralism of decision-makers is also two-fold: (a) there are many individuals making decisions using the same body of materials, and (b) these individuals do not share a uniform evaluative outlook. Given the fragmentary nature of legal material and the plurality of decision-makers there is considerable scope for disagreement when decision-makers are faced with novel questions.

Analogical reasoning helps to make the outcome of cases more predictable by giving weight to existing legal decisions and doctrines. But it only does so against a certain background, one where despite decision-makers not sharing a uniform normative outlook, there is a large measure of agreement on the existence and importance of certain values. A certain level of agreement is required for decision-makers to see a case as analogous, since that rests on what they judge to be the proper justification for the earlier decision. It also means that while they may disagree on the resolution reached in various cases, the disagreement is unlikely to be profound, but reasonable. (For an argument that this requirement can be overstated, see Sunstein 1993, 769–73).

The use of analogies in law, then, serves to compensate for some of the indeterminacy which flows from fragmented materials and the pluralism of decision-makers. That a close analogy exists usually provides a good reason for deciding the case the same way, since it renders the law more replicable than it would otherwise be, and enables lawyers to predict more accurately how a situation will be treated by the law. Of course, this is only a relative value: analogies can be defeated by other considerations if there is a good basis for distinguishing, or if its merits are too weak.

6. Summary

Precedent and analogy are two central and complementary forms of legal argument. What makes them characteristic of legal reasoning is the circumstances of decision-making in law. The greatest contrast is with individual reasoning, where neither precedent nor analogy have the same significance. An individual may give weight to what she has done in the past, e.g. because she believes the decision was made under optimum conditions, or she should not or does not want to disappoint someone's expectations, or there are special reasons to treat the two situations identically. Similarly, the comparison of the problem at hand with another situation may help clarify one's thinking, but one's judgement on the other case is only relevant to the extent that it is correct.

In an institutionalised system with many decision-makers and a heterogeneous group of legal materials there is a tension between decision-making being relatively predictable for those to whom it will apply and the law being morally improved. In such a context precedent and analogy help to shore up the predictability of decisions whilst leaving room for courts to improve the law. They do this in two different ways. Precedents are distinguishable (and subject to overruling), while analogies provide non-conclusive reasons for reaching a particular outcome. The success of these compromises depends upon there being a fair measure of background agreement between decision-makers over the important values served by the law—both measures would be too weak in the face of widespread and deep value disagreement. A range of mechanisms exist in law that help maintain such a relative consensus: legal education, the working environment, and the selection of candidates for the bench all tend to produce more convergence than is found in the general community. In addition, there is an internal feedback element—in deciding cases, courts are aware that their decisions can be distinguished (as well as overruled), and that it is only their ruling that are binding on later courts. This gives them good reasons to press justifications that are based on values widely endorsed by their brethren.


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  • –––, 1996a, ‘Precedent’ in A Companion to the Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory, Patterson (ed), Oxford: Blackwell
  • –––, 1996b, ‘Bad Beginnings’, University of Pennsylvania Law Review 145: 57–87
  • –––, 1998, ‘The Banality of Legal Reasoning’, Notre Dame Law Review 73: 517–33
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  • –––, 1997, ‘Reply to Our Critics’, Iowa Law Review 82: 923–941
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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I am grateful to Liam Murphy and Joseph Raz for their very helpful comments on a draft of this entry, and to John Stanton-Ife for a number of valuable discussions of the topic.

Copyright © 2006 by
Grant Lamond <>

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