Notes to Precedent and Analogy in Legal Reasoning

1 It is often said of such systems that in practice earlier decisions are used by later courts in ways parallel to their use in jurisdictions with an official doctrine of precedent, i.e., that there is an unofficial practice of precedent (see many of the essays in MacCormick and Summers 1997). But it is also possible that this practice reflects a genuinely held belief that such decisions possess theoretical authority, i.e., that they are more likely to be correct given considerations such as the judges on appellate courts being more experienced and able than lower court judges, their judges sitting in large benches and being able to pool their experience and judgement into a single view, and the amount of time they have to consider the matter. In legal systems with a career judiciary (appointed immediately after their academic education) such beliefs are not implausible.

2 Indeed the Common Law already does this for a special class of wrongly decided cases known as per incuriam: a later court is not bound by an earlier decision in which the earlier court failed to consider a precedent binding on it.

3 Famously the House of Lords—the ultimate court of appeal in England—took the view from the late nineteenth century until 1966 that it did not have the power to overrule its own decisions. This view was abandoned in the Practice Statement [1966] 3 All ER 77.

4 It should be noted that these ‘facts’ are not restricted to what are sometimes described as ‘descriptive’ or ‘non-evaluative’ facts: they may include a legal status, such as being a legatee or beneficiary of a trust; or an evaluative assessment, such as someone acting dishonestly, or without due care, or unconscionably.

5 The assumed facts of the landmark case in the English law of negligence Donoghue v Stevenson [1932] AC 562 (House of Lords).

6 For a different typology of theories of precedent see Alexander 1989 and 1996a.

7 Arguably, even Dworkin’s early account of hard cases can be read as a form of this approach, given the distinction he draws between the ‘enactment’ force of a precedent and its ‘gravitational’ force: 1975, 110–22. (Dworkin himself, however, later rejected this reading: 1978, 293, 344.)

8 The approach to exceptions may, on some approaches, collapse into the question of reinterpretation if it is thought that the only exceptions which may be created legitimately are those which the original law-maker would have countenanced.

9 The exception is where the later court has the power to overrule the earlier decision but agrees with the actual result: in these situations the later court may be inclined to gloss over the status of the earlier decision by re-characterising the facts to conform to its own ruling.

10 Those familiar with Dworkin’s work might think that this was his view, too, but it is not. Dworkin’s remarks on the ‘enactment’ force of precedent show he has a more complex account of precedent.

11 An intermediate position is mapped out by Perry, who argues that there is a presumption in favour of following the precedent court’s justification: 1987: 239–43.

12 A point to which Dworkin is sensitive: see his comments on ‘strict’ precedent 1986: 400–1.

13 The justifications do not, however, do all the work: the justifications may underdetermine the appropriate level of abstraction of the ratio, so the descriptions actually employed by the court may fix the content of the ratio.

14 In the following discussion I will ignore the complication that sometimes the law created by a decision that was a mistake becomes desirable due to changes in other doctrines and/or surrounding circumstances, and that the law created by some decisions, although justifiable at the time when it was made, become undesirable due to such changes.

15 See also Alexander 1989, 13–14.

16 It is also an argument for distinguishing on the rule-based view of precedent. The parallel is not exact, however, since the later court is not permitted to ‘narrow’ the ratio in a way that would imply that the earlier case was wrongly decided.

17 Indeed, some analogies occur at two removes: the analogy is to another set of facts in another doctrine.

18 So if the court regards an earlier case as lacking a convincing rationale, then it will lack any analogical weight. In Dworkin’s terminology, it will lack ‘gravitational force’ (1975, 110–23).

19 An alternative view is simply that there are no legal principles that are not believed to be morally correct. But the approach of Common Law judges does not support such a view.

20 R v Wilson [1997] QB 47 (Court of Appeal).

21 R v Brown [1994] 1 AC 212 (House of Lords).

22  Dworkin’s arguments concerning ‘integrity’ are one notable exception, see Dworkin 1986, 176–224.

Copyright © 2006 by
Grant Lamond <>

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