Notes to Emmanuel Levinas

1. Levinas will call the face-to-face relationship “meta-physical”. He does this repeatedly in Totality and Infinity. Cf. TI, Loc. cit., 84. There he says

we have called this relation metaphysical. It is premature and … insufficient to qualify it, by opposition to negativity, as positive. It would be false to qualify it as theological.

By metaphysics, Levinas means an event that repeats in the everyday, but is not reducible to physical or ‘animal’ life.

2. See for example Doyon and Breyer 2015 and Shapiro 2011. The work that first focused on sensibility in Levinas was Drabinski 2001.

3. It should be noted that Levinas makes the striking remark, at the end of his Theory of Intuition in Husserl’s Phenomenology:

Only Heidegger dares to face this problem deliberately, it having been considered impossible by the whole of traditional philosophy. This problem has for its object the meaning of the existence of being…and we feel justified in being inspired by him. (TOI: 154–155)

Some of the seminars of Heidegger from before Being and Time are now available in English. Levinas would have been familiar with them. Note Heidegger he-PIA and he-O. Also see Heidegger, he-BT.

4. According to Husserl’s phenomenology, intentionality means that all consciousness is consciousness-of something. In the beginning is the relationship between intending act and, generally, the object intended. This event is a unity. It can be decomposed, analytically, into the act of intentional aiming and the sense constituted in that aiming. To be sure, not all intentional acts are object-constituting. Indeed, whether it is a question of a sensation, a perceived entity, a memory, or an abstract ideality (e.g., a mathematical equation), the constituted sense and the intention harmonize in the mode in which they are approached and given.

5. Some of these remarks were inspired by Robert Bernasconi’s lectures, “Thinking through the Difference between Immanence and Transcendence: Levinas, Bergson, and Deleuze”, Collegium Phænomenologicum, Città di Castello, Umbria, Italy, July 14–August 1, 2003.

6. This volume, worked out between 1926 and 1927, and conceived originally as part of the plan for Being and Time, specifically the intended Division 3 of Part 1 supposed to be entitled “Time and Being”. Along with Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics (Heidegger 1929 [1997]), this work sketches Heidegger’s early departure from Husserl’s phenomenology, although it maintains the priority of Da-sein’s being-in-the-world for the question of transcendence.

7. Other affective ‘modes’ by which we posit ourselves include shame and nausea. Shame is the inability to make the other forget that we are naked in our flesh. It is an early version of being “to tight in our skin”. Like pleasure, shame is a prima facie relational mode of positing. I am ashamed before another. In nausea, the gap between the being that we are and the being of the world, narrows to the point of disappearing.

8. As Husserl argued in the “Epilogue” to Ideas II, following the development of an eidetics of pure transcendental subjectivity, it is possible to turn to “the science of actual facts” of conscious life. This is what I, and he as well, am calling phenomenology of “psychic reality”. See Ideas II, §§2–3, pp. 410–415 (143–148).

9. Levinas was already exploring the notion of separation, as against participation, in a talk entitled “La séparation”, delivered on 3 December 1957. The concept aimed to maintain an open quality to any philosophical system, from ontology to idealist dialectics. In 1957, he would argue: “Separation breaks the totality, whether it be the unity of the concept or that of number” (LO2: 165).

10. These works were prepared by notes taken during his captivity in the Fallingbostel officers’ camp, mainly between 1940 and 1945. See LO1: 108, 134, 164 (Carnets 3, 5, and 6).

11. This hearkens to kabalistic and romantic speculation about the Biblical Tohu va-Vohu, the primordial chaos (or indeterminate presence) out of which light and order were created. It is a phenomenological interpretation thereof.

12. Work is, for Levinas, effort. In effort, the body is “simultaneously, transcendence, organ, and obstacle”. Just as it was for Maine de Biran (EDE: 186, my trans.).

13. Recall that the being that we are (Da-sein) understands thanks to some mood that “makes manifest ‘how one is, and how one is faring’. In this ‘how one is’, having a mood brings Being to its ‘there’” (he-BT: 173).

14. Two years prior to the publication of Totality and Infinity, Levinas’ 1959 talk, “Au-delà du possible”, explored the theme of the other as hostile, as enemy, or as a source of violence (LO2: 305–306). It shows that he was aware of alterity as a source of struggle.

15. The proposed jury included his friend and mentor, Jean Wahl, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty (who died before the time of Levinas’ defense). Wahl was well versed in Heidegger, Anglo-Saxon philosophy, and German Idealism. Between the publication of his middle works and Totality and Infinity, Levinas was also initiated into intensive study of the Talmud by a mysterious wanderer, “Monsieur Chouchani”. An extraordinary dialectician, Shushani had been teaching Torah and Talmud since the 1930s in a synagogue in Paris. With him, Talmudic study prolonged humanist and rationalist tendencies already present in Levinas’ approach to Judaism (via Mittnagdism) and to the ethical core of the prophets. This approach, along with the ubiquitous influence of Rosenzweig 1921 [2005], inflects the thinking of Levinas’ 1961 work toward questions of ethics, justice, and the hermeneutics of fraternity.

16. “An absolute transcendence has to be produced as not integratable into knowledge or intentional constitution”. (TI: 53.) Subsequently he adds, “A relation with what…comes absolutely from itself is needed to make possible the consciousness of radical exteriority” (192). This is the relation with the other understood as she who speaks to me, or he whose regard has singled me out, before I ponder him as an empirical being. In 1984, Levinas goes so far as to say, “the notion of transcendence, of alterity, of absolute novelty” has a unique relation to knowledge which, beyond the ‘fit’ between consciousness and its objects, “calls to another phenomenology, though it be the destruction of the phenomenology of appearing and knowledge”, (TeI: 17–18, my trans.).

17. In 1961, Levinas defines transcendence strictly in light of the other:

The being that presents himself in the face comes from a dimension of height, a dimension of transcendence whereby he can present himself as a stranger without opposing me as obstacle or enemy. (TI: 215)

My responding to the other enacts a corresponding goodness.

[The] manifestation of the invisible [the unconstitutable dimension of the face as expression] cannot mean the passage of the invisible to the status of the visible; it…is produced in the goodness reserved to subjectivity. (TI: 243)

18. Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics) argues that “what is decent is superior” (1137b 11), which means receiving less than one’s due and offering more than is required.

19. Husserl, Hua 10: §36, “The Time-Constituting Flow as Absolute Subjectivity”, 79.

20. Heidegger is loath to use the term “transcendence”, given its metaphysical resonance. However, given that the ontological difference can only be experienced if Da-sein ceases to flee from itself into a social world and thanks to the power of anguish to dissolve our connections with that world, it is possible to see in the acceptance of one’s groundlessness and mortality a kind of transcendence that enables Da-sein to get itself into view as a whole. This is the only way, indeed, that our temporal dispersion can be consolidated and the question of authenticity (ownmost-ness, Eigent-lichkeit) correctly posed.

The “problem of transcendence” cannot be brought round to the question of how a subject comes out to an Object… Rather we must ask: what makes it ontologically possible for entities to be encountered within-the-world and Objectified as so encountered? This can be answered by recourse to the transcendence of the world—a transcendence with an extatico-horizonal foundation [in Dasein]. (he-BT: §69c)

21. Levinas discusses the trace of responsibility explicitly in OBBE: 46–47, 157–160; in TI it is implicit.

22. This is discussed in OBBE: 45, 70, 160. Cf. Merleau-Ponty 1964 [1968: 167]. Also see mp-PP: 361, 364.

23. Philosophically, mediations may serve various Platonic and Neo-Platonic logics of “emanation”, which absorb multiplicity and difference. See Wolosky 2017.

24. Levinas, “The State of Israel and the Religion of Israel”, in DF: 216, trans. mod for fidelity to the original.

25. Also see Bernasconi 1998: 234–51. See further Simon Critchley 1999b: 183–197.

26. Brezis (2012) has explored Levinas’ use of Christian tropes in Otherwise than Being.

27. See Husserl’s notes on intersubjectivity from 10 January 1927, Hua 14, 404 wherein he claims that life as praxis requires no phenomenological reduction.

28. Also see the seminar Heidegger gave in 1927, intended to be the completion of Being and Time, in Heidegger he-BPP: §§19–21.

29. At the root of what the Greeks called the logos, Heidegger invites us to grasp the essence of this as that, as “formal indication” pointing toward the making-manifest that is beyond the realm of things “present at hand”. See Heidegger he-FCM: §§69–72.

30. Husserl, Hua 10, No. 54, 379–394; Also see Husserl 1973c [notes on intersubjectivity 1929–1935], 398.

31. See Derrida’s commentary on this “At This Very Moment in this Work Here I Am” (1980 [1991]).

32. For a dissenting argument that sets the question of justice, and with it, language, as prior to any “deep saying”, see Franck 2008: 241–245.

33. What Husserl calls the “reduction within the reduction”, see Husserl 1973a (notes on intersubjectivity 1905–1920), No. 5, 77–90.

34. The paradox is that tiny modifications of sensibility or sense contents contribute to the ‘flow’ of consciousness temporalizing. However they can themselves only become intentional objects once they are integrated into the flow, or intentionalized. This makes them already retentions when we turn our attention to them, even though in their upsurge, they would be so bodily as to be pre-intentional. Nevertheless, formally, this pre-intentionality is important to the very possibility of the movement of consciousness as flux.

35. Other influences abound in this work, from his Strasbourg professor of psychology, Maurice Pradines, to Henri Bergson’s descriptions of “duration”, to Merleau-Ponty’s “intertwining” of layered sensibility. See Pradines 1928 and 1932; Bergson 1910 and 1968; in English, respectively, Bergson 2013 and Bergson 1999. Merleau-Ponty 1964.

36. In Being and Time, Heidegger reconceived the famous “hermeneutic circle”, starting from Da-sein, the being for whom its existence (or Being) is a question. Given the interrogative relationship of Da-sein to its being is hermeneutical, Heidegger is not working within traditional hermeneutics understood as a textual method. In this sense beyond Schleiermacher, Dilthey, and Bultmann whom he inspired, Heidegger unfolded a hermeneia in which the meaning intended is that of the being that we are, before any interpretation of texts. As Jean-Luc Nancy put it, Heidegger’s practice deformalized classical hermeneutics by locating meaning in our lived, pre-understanding of our own situation. See Heidegger, he-BT: §9, and Nancy 1982: 18–23 (my trans.).

37. What Talmud scholar Marc-Alain Ouaknin calls the excess of the being-able-to-say (pouvoir-dire) over a text’s intending-to-say (vouloir-dire). This is what makes a book into a Book. See Ouaknin (1993: 225 [1995: 155–156]). Ouaknin repeatedly cites Levinas BTV: 111.

38. Fagenblat extensively clarifies Schmitt’s claim about secularization.

39. Both Fagenblat and Kavka agree that “it is not clear…that…a ‘new direction’ in Jewish philosophy is really new”. See Kavka 2010: 21.

40. While Kavka traces Levinas’ navigation between two major figures in medieval Jewish philosophy, Yehuda Halevi and Moses Maimonides, Fagenblat emphasizes the centrality of the Maimonides, notably around the debate about “creation”—a concept whose contemporary sense is the establishment of (ethical) order and world (2010: 60). For Kavka, the figures of Halevi and Maimonides provide a metaphoric geography between what might be called, the moral intuitionism of the first and the ethical rationalism of the second. In both cases, Levinas focuses attention on the creation of meaning understood first as responsibility and hospitality in 1961 (TI), then as bearing witness or secularized prophecy in 1974 (OBBE).

41. In order of publication, Gibbs 1994; R. Cohen 1994; R. Cohen (ed.) 2009 Nordmann 2017.

42. Ouaknin (1993 [1995]) cites Levinas, “On the Jewish Reading of Scriptures” in BTV: 109.

43. Fagenblat is citing Maimonides’ translator and commentator, Shlomo Pines, who reminds us that at the end of the Guide of the Perplexed (Pines 1974: cxv-cxxii), a striking reversal occurs in Maimonides’ metaphysics—toward the practical. If we can only know “attributes of action”, then in a complex sense, the bios praktikos thus proves higher than the bios theoretikos. One might say that one does not know, but enacts “God”.

44. For a useful debate over Levinas’ attitude toward politics, notably the politics of repression, see Caygill 2002, esp. 188–195, and Morgan 2016, esp. 315–323.

45. Also see Fagenblat 2015: 297–320. Fagenblat points out that “in his 1947 publication, ‘Être juif’, Levinas argues that being Jewish “provides … phenomenological access … to the total passivity of the human condition” (2015: 301). See Levinas, LO1: 172.

46. Hermann Cohen (1915) put it succinctly: While the emergence of ideas, that is, humans’ emancipation from the purely empirical realm, begins as ethical thought, “[w]e find again the same orientation of the primary force of thought” in “the abandonment of perception and its object constituted by empirical man: for the prophet, this [abandonment] is the ascent toward humanity [Jerusalem]; for the Greek, this abandonment amounts to the passage toward the state” (1915: 35, my trans.).

47. Judith Butler and Simon Critchley have similarly called attention to what Butler deems Levinas’ “blatant racism” toward non-European cultures which, like Moten, gives rise to a “vacillation” between ontology and ontic dimensions. See Butler 2005 and Critchley 2007.

48. Levinas recounts being questioned by Latin American clerics about the empirical evidence of the Same concerned by the Other to the point of feeling divided in itself. Levinas provides ‘evidence’: “at least here…in this group of students…who nevertheless had no other subjects of conversation than the crisis” in Latin America. See OGCM: 81.

49. Compare Levinas’ remark with the observation from Bereshit Rabba 49:20. “If it is a world you want, then strict justice is impossible. And if it is strict justice you want, then a world is impossible”, cited by Liska 2017: 54. I thank Marc Zilbert for calling this to my attention.

50. See Critchley 2014: 272. Theodore de Boer has argued that Otherwise than Being demonstrates the priority of metaphysics to ontology more profoundly than did Totality and Infinity. Didier Franck finds in Otherwise than Being a problematic deepening of the relationship between radical transcendence and justice. Rudolf Bernet urges that Otherwise than Being carries Levinas’ engagement with the hermeneutics of sensibility and therewith, the critique of phenomenological account of time to its fullest expression. See respectively: de Boer 1997: 62–64; Franck 2008: 233–245; Bernet 2002: 92–93.

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