Emmanuel Levinas’ (1905–1995) intellectual project was to develop a first philosophy. Whereas traditionally first philosophy denoted either metaphysics or theology, only to be reconceived by Heidegger as fundamental ontology, Levinas argued that it is ethics that should be so conceived. But rather than formulating an ethical theory, Levinas developed his philosophy in opposition to both these aforementioned approaches. It takes the form of a description and interpretation of the event of encountering another person. Giving rise to spontaneous acts of responsibility for others, the encounter unfolds, according to Levinas, at a precognitive level, thanks to what he called our embodied “sensibility”. That is why a phenomenology of intersubjective responsibility would be ‘first’ philosophy; viz., in the sense of interpretively reconstructing a level of experience precursive to both reflective activity and practical interests.
Some commentators have called Levinas’ work an ethics of ethics, others a meta-ethics, while still others have urged that his thought can accommodate many ethical theories, from intuitionism to rationalism (see below). However that may be, his work is in ongoing, critical dialogue with three philosophers: Husserl, Heidegger, and Hegel. Given these targets—as well as philosophical interlocutors like Maurice Merleau-Ponty—Levinas’ philosophy begins from an enlarged conception of lived embodiment and a powerful extension of Husserl’s technique of suspending conceptualization to reveal experience as it comes to light. He is also indebted to Heidegger for his hermeneutics of being-in-the-world.
- 1. Life and Career
- 2. Thematic Exposition of Levinas’ Philosophy
- 2.1 Philosophical Beginnings: On Escape (1935) or Transcendence as the Need to Escape
- 2.2 Middle Writings: Existence and Existents (1947) and Time and the Other (1947) or Inflections of Transcendence and Variations on Being
- 2.3 The “Treatise on Hospitality”: Totality and Infinity (1961) or Responsibility, Transcendence, and Justice
- 2.4 Otherwise than Being, or Beyond Essence (1974): Transcendence-in-Immanence
- 2.5 Essays and Interviews after Otherwise than Being: The Tension between Ethics and Justice
- 3. Concluding Remarks
- Cited Works by Levinas
- Other Works by Levinas
- Secondary Literature
- Video and Sound Documents
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Career
- 1905: Born January 12 in Kaunas (Kovno, in Russian), Lithuania. Lithuania is a part of pre-Revolutionary Russia and the surrounding culture ‘tolerates’ Jews. He is the eldest child in a middle class family and has two brothers, Boris and Aminadab.
- 1914: In the wake of the War, Levinas’ family emigrates to Karkhov, in the Ukraine. The family returns to Lithuania in 1920, two years after the country obtains independence from the Revolutionary government.
- 1923: Goes to study philosophy in Strasbourg (France). Levinas studies philosophy with Maurice Pradines, psychology with Charles Blondel, and sociology with Maurice Halbwachs. Meets Maurice Blanchot who will become a close friend.
- 1928–29: Levinas travels to Freiburg to study with Edmund Husserl; he attends Heidegger’s seminar.
- 1930: Publishes his thesis in French, La théorie de l’intuition dans la phénoménologie de Husserl [The Theory of Intuition in Husserl’s Phenomenology].
- 1931: French translation, by Levinas, of Husserl’s Sorbonne lectures, Cartesian Meditations, in collaboration with Gabrielle Peiffer.
- 1932: Marries Raïssa Levi, whom he had known since childhood.
- 1934: Levinas publishes a philosophical analysis of “Hitlerism”, Quelques réflexions sur la philosophie de l’hitlérisme [Reflections on the Philosophy of Hitlerism].
- 1935: Levinas publishes an original essay in hermeneutic ontology, De l’évasion [On Escape], in Émile Bréhier’s journal Recherches philosophiques (reprinted in 1982).
- 1939: Naturalized French; enlists in the French officer corps.
- 1940: Captured by the Nazis; imprisoned in Fallingbostel, a labor camp for officers. His Lithuanian family is murdered. His wife Raïssa, and daughter Simone are hidden by religious nuns in Orléans.
- 1947: Following the publication of De l’existence à l’existent [Existence and Existents] (which Levinas began writing in captivity), Le temps et l’autre [Time and the Other], four lectures given at the Collège Philosophique (founded by Jean Wahl). Levinas becomes Director of the École Normale Israélite Orientale, Paris.
- 1949: After the death of their second daughter, Andrée
Éliane, Levinas and his wife have a son, Michael, who becomes a
pianist and a composer.
Levinas publishes En découvrant l’existence avec Husserl et Heidegger (selections appear in Discovering Existence with Husserl, 1998).
- 1957: He delivers his first Talmudic readings at the Colloque des Intellectuels Juifs de Langue française. A colloquium attended by Vladimir Jankélévitch, André Neher, and Jean Halpérin, among others.
- 1961: Publishes his doctorate (ès Lettres), Totalité et infini: essai sur l’extériorité [Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority. Position at the Université de Poitiers.
- 1963: Publishes Difficile liberté: essais sur le judaïsme [Difficult Freedom: Essays on Judaism].
- 1967: Professor at the Université de Paris, Nanterre, with Paul Ricœur.
- 1968: Publishes Quatre lectures talmudiques (English translation in Nine Talmudic Readings).
- 1972: L’humanisme de l’autre homme [Humanism of the Other].
- 1973: Professorship at the Université de Paris IV-Sorbonne. The 1973–1974 lectures will be published as Dieu, la mort et le temps [God, Death and Time].
- 1974: Autrement qu’être ou au-delà de l’essence [Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence], the second magnum opus.
- 1975: Sur Maurice Blanchot (English translation appended to Proper Names).
- 1976: Noms propres [Proper Names].
- 1977: Du sacré au saint (English translation in Nine Talmudic Readings).
- 1982: De Dieu qui vient à l’idée [Of God Who Comes to Mind], L’au-delà du verset [Beyond the Verse] and his radio conversations with Philippe Nemo, Éthique et infini [Ethics and Infinity].
- 1984: Transcendance et Intelligibilité
[Transcendence and Intelligibility] (English translation in
Emmanuel Levinas: Basic Philosophical Writings)
Éthique comme philosophie première [Ethics as first philosophy]
- 1987: Hors sujet [Outside the Subject], a collection of texts, old and new on philosophers, language, and politics.
- 1988: À l’heure des nations [In the Time of the Nations].
- 1990: De l’oblitération: Entretien avec Françoise Armengaud [On Obliteration: An Interview with Françoise Armengaud Concerning the Work of Sasha Sosno].
- 1991: Entre Nous: Essais sur le penser-à-l’autre [Entre Nous: Essays on Thinking-of-the-Other]. An issue of the prestigious Les Cahiers de L’Herne is dedicated to Levinas’ work.
- 1993: Sorbonne lectures, published as Dieu, la mort et le temps [God, Death and Time]. The annual colloquium at Cerisy-la-Salle publishes a volume devoted to him.
- 1994: His wife Raïssa Levinas dies in September. Levinas publishes a collection of essays, Liberté et commandement (two essays, “Freedom and Command” and “Transcendence and Height”, published respectively in Collected Philosophical Papers and Basic Philosophical Writings) and Les imprévus de l’histoire [Unforeseen History], edited by Pierre Hayat.
- 1995: Altérité et transcendance
[Alterity and Transcendence].
Emmanuel Levinas dies in Paris, December 25.
Books published posthumously:
- 1996: Nouvelles lectures talmudiques [New Talmudic Readings].
- 1998: Éthique comme philosophie première [Ethics as First Philosophy; first published as an article in 1984]
2. Thematic Exposition of Levinas’ Philosophy
This entry will follow Levinas’ career chronologically, as his concepts evolve. In what follows, we will emphasize the following arguments and themes: (1) why Levinas’ is a unique first philosophy; (2) how he developed his investigation of the lived conditions of possibility of our concern with ethical reasoning; and (3) the originality of his adaptation of phenomenology and his existentialist hermeneutics of pre-intentional embodied intersubjectivity. In this entry, attention is focused throughout to the contribution of commentators, with a view to providing a gateway to recent secondary literature.
2.1 Philosophical Beginnings: On Escape (1935) or Transcendence as the Need to Escape
Levinas published his thesis, The Theory of Intuition in Husserl’s Phenomenology, in 1930. It was the first book-length introduction to Husserl’s thought in French. By focusing on the theme of intuition, Levinas established what philosophical readers find notably in Husserl’s Ideas I and II (published in 1913 and, for Ideas II, partially in 1930): every human experience is open to phenomenological description; every human experience carries meaning from the outset, and can be examined as a mode of intentionality (Ideas II: §56 h and §§57–61). The following year, he published his co-translation of Husserl’s Cartesian Meditations, in which Husserl had laid out a systematic presentation of transcendental phenomenology. In the 1930s, Levinas continued to publish studies of the thought of his two principal teachers, Husserl and Heidegger. These included the essays “Martin Heidegger and Ontology” (EDE: 53–76) and the extensive “The Work of Edmund Husserl” (DEH: 47–89). In the 1930s and 1940s, his philosophical project was influenced by Husserl’s phenomenological method, whose foundation arguably lay in the centrality of the “transcendental ego” (Ideas I: §49). However, suspicious of the intellectualism of Husserl’s approach to essences (phenomenological “eidetics”), Levinas gravitated toward Heidegger’s more worldly approach to existence in Being and Time. Between 1930 and 1935, he will nevertheless turn away from Heidegger’s approach to being and transcendence and develop the outlines of a new ontology. As we shall see, he will reconceive transcendence as a need for escape from existence, and work out a different analysis of lived time in that project.
Levinas’ first original essay, On Escape (De l’évasion, 1935), examined the relationship between the embodied (sentient) self and the intentional ego from the perspectives of physical and affective states including need, pleasure, shame, and nausea. In this succinct philosophical work, Levinas was less concerned than was Heidegger with the question of existence as it opens up before us when we experience the dissolving of things in the world in anxiety (he-BT: §40). Levinas’ question was not: “Why is there being instead of simply nothing?” His concern was to approach existence differently, through the (human) being as Heidegger had also done, but in light of more embodied experiences like the above-mentioned ones (OE: §6). Enlarging Heidegger’s hermeneutics of being-in-the-world, Levinas gave priority to lived moods and physical states that revealed existence as oppressive and indeterminate. Indeed, in escapism and its various aesthetic expressions, we discover humans’ failed attempts to get away from the being that they themselves are. “Escape”, he wrote,
is the need to get out of oneself, that is, to break that most radical and unalterably binding of chains, the fact that the I [moi] is oneself [soi-même]. (OE: §1)
In the two imbricated dimensions of human life, sentient-affective and intentional, our experience of being comes to pass, in the relationship between body and egoic consciousness.
Levinas’ youthful project approached transcendence secularly, in light of humans’ irreducible urge to get past the limits of their physical and social circumstances. His transcendence is less a question of cognition reaching reality or humans seeking to pass ‘beyond’ themselves (respectively he-BT: §§43, 10) than transcendence attempted through sensuous evasions. This quite materialist approach to transcendence is nevertheless motivated by the question of our mortality and finite being, but unlike Heidegger, it also examines the enigma called infinity.
Levinas thus accepted Heidegger’s arguments that a human being experiences itself as if thrown into its world (he-BT: §38), without cognitive mastery over its birth and death. Heidegger’s human being, or Da-sein (being-there), lives out its time projecting itself toward its diverse possibilities. It flees its uncanny thrownness by distracting itself in social pursuits, a position that Levinas will not adopt. On the other hand, the projective element of transcendence, which Heidegger described in The Basic Problems of Phenomenology (he-BPP) as merely a “stepping over to … as such”, was of great interest to Levinas. But he would enquire: to what and from what are we ‘stepping over’? Levinas then observed:
[M]odern sensibility wrestles with problems that indicate … the abandonment of this concern with transcendence. As if it had the certainty that the idea of the limit could not apply to the existence of what is … and as if modern sensibility perceived in being a defect still more profound. (OE: §1, emph. added)
His argument here concerns a conceit of our ‘modern’ sensibility (and philosophy); namely, that we presume we could thoughtfully frame a better conception of being, wherein existence was in some sense self-sufficient. What Levinas calls the “insufficiency of the human condition” (OE: §1) simply denotes the limitation of our existence, whose transcendence, when understood as escape, promises that we might somehow surpass it, as if through an infinite experience. When transcendence is removed from theological or metaphysical frameworks (i.e., secularized as Heidegger’s “stepping over”), then we grasp it in its historical context-dependency, as the illusions of a finite being pondering pure self-sufficiency. Reconceived in this way, the entire question of transcendence changes, revealing the struggle to get out of our all too finite existence. That is why Levinas asks: “[Is] the need for escape not the exclusive matter of a finite being? … Would an infinite being have the need to take leave of itself” (OE: §2)? In short, is our first response to mortality not the urge to take leave of our existence, if periodically? This question is not so different from Heidegger’s conception of inauthenticity. But unlike Heidegger, true authenticity does not lie in securing our freedom for our most personal possibility, death. Levinas argued that we can approach death as possibility only through that of others and that we grasp being as finite by way of their mortality. On the other hand, when secularized, the idea of infinity refers to something absolute in human consciousness (OE: §1), which motivates our repeated efforts at escaping ourselves into various ecstasies. This is clearly a conception of being different from Heidegger’s. Later, of course, Levinas will attribute infinity to a different experience, that of the unbounded quality of the face of the other. However, intersubjectivity is little discussed in the 1935 essay. The encounter with the other first comes into view as a theme in his 1940s works (TO and EE). Significant here, nevertheless, are the following two points: (1) Levinas’ argument that Heidegger’s conception of existence is specific to a history, that of German thought and that of hermeneutics; (2) to be an embodied psyche is to struggle with the limits of one’s facticity or existential situation, and it is there that the question of being as our existence initially arises.
Heidegger’s Da-sein confronted the question of being when it found itself brought before itself in anxiety (he-BT: §40). In contrast, Levinas proposed other ways by which the gap narrows between being itself and the beings that we are. Following his leitmotif of our recurrent urge to escape, Levinas examined the invariable disappointments following our attempts at transcending our existence: the aforementioned states of need and pleasure give way to a sobering up or disillusionment. In affective and physical states like shame and nausea, the bodily self is experienced as a substance trapped in its stifling existence and desperate for a way out. Commentator Jacques Rolland has explored Levinas’ return to the body, to concreteness, escape, and the way in which he deformalized even Heidegger’s hermeneutics (OE: 29–32). Rolland adds that this approach was inspired by Levinas’ critical meditation, published one year earlier (1934), on the materialist “blood and soil” philosophy popular with National Socialism (RPH). As regards stifling existence, when Levinas refers to being, it is as ongoing presence, rather than the event of disclosure that Heidegger described. It remains a matter of debate whether this interpretation of being constitutes a step back to an older metaphysics prior to Heidegger’s innovations, or not (Franck 2008: 31).
Whether we choose to take Levinas’ approach to being as deformalizing Heidegger or as inspired by him, commentators often underscore its fresh empiricism. Megan Craig compares the early works of Levinas with the “radical empiricism” of William James (Craig 2010: xv). Lisa Guenther, in turn, has examined embodiment and the experience of maternity in the later Levinas (2006: 119–136, see §3.4.5). From the outset, the “fact of existing” refers to philosophically unexplored phenomena of our embodiment, our aforementioned I-self (moi-soi) dualism.
Polemically, Levinas urged that the most extreme state he described, nausea, amounts to being-there, what Husserl’s phenomenology called “self-positing”: “… nausea posits itself not only as something absolute, but as the very act of self-positing: it is the affirmation itself of being” (OE: §6). Other forms of self-positing occur, of course, as this event refers to the experience of unity between the embodied self and the ego of intentions, or indeed between what Raoul Moati compared with the “first-” and the “third-person” perspectives (2012 [2017: 38–71]). Thus, in immediate experience, I am my joy or my pain, provisionally, just as I may observe myself joyful, like a third person. Nevertheless, our various efforts to get out of our concrete situations are not the same as what Heidegger deemed projections toward new possibilities, wherein our death lies at the end of all the others, as the ultimate limit, or “possibility of impossibility” (he-BT: §50). For Levinas, by contrast, escape represents a positive, dynamic need. In this youthful work, he also rethinks need as fullness rather than as mere privation. As we indicated, he is working toward a different understanding of existence itself. Whether it is characterized by pleasure or suffering, need is the very ground of that existence. A secular transcendence responds to need, promising a path toward “something other than ourselves” (OE: §3), which is why the deep motivation of need is to get out of our finite condition. Already by 1935, Levinas’ ontology has displaced Heidegger’s being in light of the dynamic relation between the sentient self and the intentional ‘I’; it has refocused attention on the present over Heidegger’s emphasis on the future, and explored new modes by which we experience the being that we are.
Reconceived as need, pleasure, and nausea, our attempts at transcendence open access to an experience of time different from both Aristotle’s “measure of motion”, and the fullness of awaiting (the anticipated moment or khairos that Heidegger developed in his early work). Pleasure and pain are intensities: “something like abysses, ever deeper, into which our existence … hurls itself” (OE: §4). The priority of present-time, concentrated into an extended now-moment is opened up through sensibility and affectivity. In pleasure as in pain, we need—not out of lack—but in desire or in hope. “Pleasure is … nothing less than a concentration in the instant” (OE: §4). Over Heidegger’s ongoing openness to possibility (he-BT: §31), the present of embodiment here receives existential priority. Levinas’ emphasis on the present is a theme he never abandons. Moreover, though he adapts it from Husserl’s phenomenology of “psychic reality”, he will also enrich it.
In sum, Levinas’ early essay is structured around his reconceptualization of fundamental existential categories. If Husserl’s transcendental ego returns as the “I” of intentions in Levinas, it remains that the embodied self has great importance as the locus or situation from which egoic transcendence arises (i.e., we wake up as if out of our sleeping body, our soi). If the self and “I” duality is where the weight of being shows itself most clearly, most affectively, then the precedence Heidegger accorded to the world and to being qua call are decisively displaced. As indicated earlier, the latter’s focus on being, as the event of disclosure and withdrawal, is interpreted by Levinas in a pre-Heideggerian fashion, as the constant presence which Heidegger had characterized skeptically as metaphysical. Levinas approaches that presence through modalizations provided by sensations and affects that were unexplored by either Heidegger or Husserl.
In 1935, Levinas was convinced that through sensation and states of mind we also discover the futility of getting out of existence. In the physical torment of nausea, we experience being in its simplest, most burdensome neutrality. To this, Levinas adds three provocative themes. First, if being is disclosed only through the being that we are, then any being that seeks to escape itself because it feels trapped in its own facticity, is a “creature”, carrying “the stigmatum of [finite] existence” (OE: §8). Second, nausea is not simply a physiological event. It shows us dramatically how existence can encircle us on all sides, to the point of submerging us. As Rolland observes, in that case social and political life may also nauseate us. Third, if being is experienced in its pure form as weighty indeterminacy, then we can neither bypass it (following the “aspirations of Idealism” [OE: §8]), nor even simply accept it as passive subjects. Being is existence, and it is firstly our existence. The mark of creaturely existence is need and, by extension, a struggle with being. Levinas concludes polemically,
[e]very civilization that accepts being—with the tragic despair it contains and the crimes it justifies—merits the name “barbarian”. (OE: §8)
The question remains: how shall we best think through the sensuous need to transcend being? Embodied need is not an illusion; is transcendence one? Levinas will answer this question fully in 1961.
2.2 Middle Writings: Existence and Existents (1947) and Time and the Other (1947) or Inflections of Transcendence and Variations on Being
The 1940s writings extend Levinas’ innovations in ontology, always with recourse to interpretations of embodiment and against Heidegger’s philosophy of existence which, for Levinas, entails engagement with being as “participation” without alterity. These writings inflect his notion of transcendence, away from the imagined transcendence of evasion and pleasure, toward eros and the promise of the birth of a child. This requires he explore alterity, understood as the feminine other (EE: 86).
In Existence and Existents (1947) and Time and the Other (1947), being now has a dual aspect, of light and of dark indeterminacy. It is as though being were divided between the being of a created world and the darkness out of which light was brought. This shifts phenomenological focus onto being as light and visibility, in which we constitute objects, and being as the dark turmoil that we experience in insomnia. Levinas’ attempt to expand the sense of the embodied Da-sein, and reconsider the distinction between being and Da-sein (existence and the perceptual open that we are) has also changed. Following Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology, in which a multi-layered “I” directs intentional focus like a center from which our attention radiates, Levinas’ embodied ego is neither preceded nor outstripped by its world. The corporeal self [soi], henceforth called the “hypostasis”, is its own ground; i.e., we awaken out of ourselves, into light; we proceed with our projects (EE: 61–86; TO: 51–55). We fall asleep, curled about ourselves, thereby exiting our conscious existence. Embodied consciousness thus begins and ends with itself. As such, it is both dependent on and independent from its environment, and Levinas will urge that the subject, upon awakening, uses and masters being.
In the middle period essays, the partial transcendences of pleasure and desire, already sketched in 1935, receive fuller development and variations. The meaning of transcendence focuses on a new temporality promised by desire and “fecundity”, or the birth of the son (EE: 100; TO: 91–92). The son incarnates alterity in a curious way. He is, in a sense, his father and not his father. However, his birth opens a focus on the future. No longer conceived as one of open possibilities, as Heidegger had argued, the time opened by the son responds to two basic limitations on our understanding and representation: death and the other person. While not denying Heidegger’s intuition about death as the “possibility of impossibility”, Levinas repeats his earlier argument that we witness death only in the death of the other. But even as such it escapes everyday understanding. Hence Levinas will qualify death as an alterity as radical as that of the other human being who confronts me.
In death the existing of the existent is alienated. To be sure, the other that is announced does not possess this existing as the subject possesses it; its hold over my existing is mysterious. It is not unknown but unknowable. (TO: 75)
Of course, we can and do constitute the other an alter ego. Yet such constitution by phenomenological analogy never exhausts his fundamental difference (TO: 78–79). In so arguing, Levinas proposes to radicalize Husserl’s “other”, of whom the latter said that he or she is “an analogon of myself, [yet also] not an analogon in the habitual sense” (hu-CM §44: 92-96).
Two reversals should be noted, here, relative to 1935. First, against Hegel’s conception of work as the dialectic of spirit transforming nature, Levinas describes labor phenomenologically as effort and fatigue, again highlighting his distinction between the embodied, working self and the cognitive ego. The second reversal concerns moods themselves. In Heidegger, anxiety, joy, and boredom were states of mind, with anxiety as the privileged mood by which humans are confronted with themselves, their lack of ground, and with the question of their existence. In his middle period, Levinas will expand the experience of being to moods now including horror. Nighttime being reveals an indeterminate dark presence that is not pure nothing. “The horror of the night, as an experience of the there-is, does not then reveal to us a danger of death, nor even a danger of pain” (EE: 57). Therefore pure being can never be just Heidegger’s lighted clearing. And our existence in the world requires stronger embodiment than an eye and a hand that reaches to grasp objects “ready-to-hand” (Heidegger). Once again, Levinas recurs to bodily states, this time including fatigue, indolence, insomnia, and awakening. In the first three, the aforementioned gap between the embodied self and the intentional I increases. Upon awakening, the embodied ego (soi-moi) reasserts its mastery over things and even its own bodily torpor. But for Levinas being in the world is less a matter of utility and Heidegger’s phenomenon of “falling” into distraction, than one of love of life and sheer enjoyment (he-BT: 179). This, too, is part of Levinas’ critique of Heidegger, for whom our concern for the world often coexists with instrumentalist relationships with things. In search of variations on being as a call or a revelation, and in privileging the basic subjectivity (or “hypostasis”) capable of raising itself above being (now understood as the neutral “there is”), Levinas is en route to his secular philosophy of alterity and transcendence.
It bears recalling that, in phenomenology, light plays figurative and literal roles, from Husserl’s daylight as the condition for optimal perception (Ideas II §18) to his metaphor for the intentional “ray” directed like a spotlight upon an object, to Heidegger’s lighted opening that is Da-sein itself (he-BT: 171). Levinas in turn underscores the ‘work’ of light as able to suspend, phenomenologically, the traditional distinction between subjective and objective: “due to the light an object, while coming from without, is already ours in the horizon which precedes it” (EE: 41). Consequently, intelligibility is well figured by light. Phenomenological evidence is guaranteed by lighted circumstances—albeit for someone. Whereas Heidegger defined Da-sein almost operationally (“by its very nature, Dasein brings its ‘there’ along with it” [he-BT: 171]), Levinas returns to the Moderns’ principle “every object presupposes a subject”. Moreover, while the being of Da-sein is itself light and “disclosedness” (he-BT: 171), the being of Levinas’ hypostasis is characterized by its living cycle of drowsing, sleeping, waking, and acting. Thus, if being is equated with illumination, for Levinas it must also include the dark anonymity of night (EE: 54). It is both gift (Heidegger’s es gibt) and “there is” (Blanchot’s il y a, as taken up by Levinas). Consequently, the question that inaugurates fundamental ontology: Why is there being instead of simply nothing? is not Levinas’ primary concern. Nothingness, understood as pure absence, may be thinkable, but it cannot be experienced. Indeterminate, nocturnal being remains ‘something’. As the “there is”, being fills in all spatial and temporal intervals, whereas consciousness arises out of it thanks to its self-originating awakening and focus. This is Levinas’ first comprehensive sketch of being as a totality, in which the self-ego dyad appears as the limited transcendence of neutral being. Over the course of his analyses, this self-ego will hearken to a call. However, the call comes not from being but from an alterity that Levinas compares with death itself. “Just as with death, I am not concerned with an existent, but with the event of alterity” (TO: 87, emph. added). With “the event of alterity”, however, there is the call of the other person, notably female, experienced as desire, need, even generosity. These works set the stage for later descriptions of world, facticity, time as now-moment, transcendence in immanence, and transcendence toward a future fecundity in the family. They constitute the core of Levinas’ first major work, Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority.
2.3 The “Treatise on Hospitality”: Totality and Infinity (1961) or Responsibility, Transcendence, and Justice
Totality and Infinity was written as Levinas’ Doctorat d’État. His concept of transcendence provides us a useful point of departure in Totality and Infinity, provided we understand his debt to Husserl’s phenomenology. Husserl understood transcendence in several ways, of which one significant dimension was that typical of consciousness extending toward, and encountering, the worldly objects at which it aims. After Husserl, Heidegger will define transcendence as the essence of our existing in the world; Da-sein is always already in the world among things, according to a worldly transcendence or being out-there. Sartre followed Heidegger in this, urging that “transcendence is a constitutive structure of consciousness” (Sartre 1943 [1992: 23]), and his concept of consciousness is similarly in the world and ingredient in our actions.
For Levinas, these senses of transcendence are acceptable but not primary. Instead, he aligns transcendence with exteriority, in the sense of what lies outside myself but eludes my comprehensive knowledge: the other person (TI: 49). The encounter with the other is an encounter with a visible thing, of course. But this other speaks to me, implores or commands me. In responding, I discover my responsibility to them. This is the ground of ethics or indeed our concern with ethics as the good of the other person.
As Levinas argues, when ethics goes in search of its existential ground, before any consideration of utility, virtue, or duty, it discovers the intersubjective enactment of responsibility, which resists being integrated into accounts in which the other is a universal other to whom it is my duty, for example, to act ethically or in the hope of increasing the happiness of the collectivity. Utility, virtue, and duty are crucial to ethical debates. Yet Levinas is pointing to their common lived origin in the irreducibility of the face-to-face encounter.
2.3.1 Totality and Infinity’s Contribution to Ethical Theory
Michael Morgan has discussed Levinas’ existential basis of ethics in relation to the three ethical schools just indicated (2007). He reminds us that Levinas is working at a pre-theoretical and embodied level that represents the impetus behind ethical systems forged through reflection, tradition, and critique. In that sense, Levinas’ objective is simultaneously phenomenological and hermeneutical: he describes the encounter with the other, argues that it imposes a limit on object constitution, and interpretively traces ethics back to the birth of intersubjective meaning. As opposed to Heidegger’s inaugural question of being, Levinas’ concern is with the exteriority or transcendence of the other who addresses me. Consistent with Morgan’s claim, Diane Perpich has argued that the face-to-face in Levinas gives rise to a “normativity without norms” (2008: 126–127). For his part, Steven Crowell observes that the normativity of the face is also epistemic; it is the ground for the objectivity of any perception because, if the other did not face me and call my experience into question, I would never encounter a “sense of the normative, of standards against which the validity of my experiences can be judged” (Crowell 2015: 574). Indeed, the first normativity I experience, prior to reflection, corresponds to an affect (TI: 294), which accompanies my experience of the other’s exteriority. At the same time, I respond to that other. As Levinas writes,
[l]anguage makes possible the objectivity of objects and their thematization. Already Husserl argued that the objectivity of thought consists in being valid for everyone. To know objectively is therefore to constitute my thought in such a way that it already contain[s] a reference to the thought of others. What I communicate therefore is already constituted in function of others. (TI: 210, emph. added)
Thus, Levinas’ existential phenomenology of the face-to-face is relevant to contemporary ethics above all insofar as ethics is concerned with its own grounds in lived intersubjectivity. We can even note parallels between Levinas and some contemporary ethicists. For example, the neo-Kantian, Onora O’Neill, bases the rationality of practical reason on a “minimal but authoritative demand”, which implies that the ethical principles I espouse never be irrational so that another person could not similarly adopt them. Levinas might say that the “authority” motivating such demands is experienced like an effect of the other’s transcendence (O’Neill 1996: 51–57). Moral intuitionists like David Wiggins and John McDowell have, similarly to Levinas, focused on our sensibility when it comes to grasping moral truths. In discussing authentic education, McDowell argues that acquiring an ethical sensibility makes possible our intuitions of what is right and good. It even fosters a flourishing rational will able to discern bona fide ethical requirements (McDowell 1998, Wiggins 1987 ). Both McDowell and Wiggins share with Levinas an effort to enrich the perspective on the subject as a purely rational agent, although Levinas reconstructs the intersubjective, existential origins of that agency.
It goes without saying that the philosophical influences and debates of the above-mentioned ethicists are different from Levinas’. Despite this difference, however, Morgan (2007) and Jean-Michel Salanskis have both underscored the importance—for the justification of any ethics—of scrutinizing its existential conditions. Salanskis asserts that Levinas’ arguments tally with what he calls “the three requirements to which any philosophical exposition of morality must respond”. These are:
duty as irreducible to being, as Hume, Kant, and Wittgenstein experienced and expressed it. [And ethics, secondly,] must nevertheless favor the … designation of an objective duty, not relative to a subjective or psychological trace (such relativity being precursive to the dissolution of morality pure and simple). [Thirdly,] duty must be felt; it is not really duty unless it is mine. (Salanskis 2006: 63, my trans.)
If ethics refers to the study or to a system of moral principles, then Levinas provides a phenomenology of the everyday genesis of these principles. Salanskis calls this “a new philosophy of morality” (2006: 31–73).
In turn, Gabriela Basterra has recalled that Kant’s moral law, understood as the basis of a positive feeling and as the object of our greatest respect (Achtung) is cognized a priori, and even the respect we experience for it is not of empirical origin. Respect is thus a unique affect that motivates my will to follow the moral law, though it is not a feeling in an empirical psychological sense (Kant 1788 ). Instead, it is something that affects me, and Basterra compares it to the affection that Levinas identifies as the interruption of my activity by the other who faces me (Basterra 2015). Once again, the two philosophies are different, notably because they entail distinct approaches. But it remains that, like Kant’s a priori, we cannot assimilate the motivation experienced before the face of the other to a subjective state or to an objective concept.
2.3.2 Structure of the Work
Totality and Infinity unfolds around phenomenological descriptions of being, depicted initially as nature or forces in conflict (TI: 21–22). However, our being in-the-world also entails the enjoyment of natural elements and love of life (TI: 110–115). “We live from ‘good soup’, air, light, spectacles, work, ideas, sleep, etc.… These are not objects of representations. We live from them” (TI: 110). Levinas also reframes labor as the creation of a store of goods thanks to which the other can be welcomed (TI: 157–161, 205), rather than solely as the mastery or humanization of nature. Because we take joy in living and in creating a home, our lives are not firstly like Heidegger’s “care” (Sorge; TI: 112). Instead, we live nourished and can receive the other into our space. On the basis of these descriptions, transcendence as defined above comes to pass in several stages. First, the onset of the other—as the expression of the face—interrupts our free activity (and willing) and calls us to account for ourselves (TI: 198, 291), something Levinas calls “goodness” (TI: 200). Second, in thereby responding, the subject approached by the other engages in an act that opens the possibility of dialogue. The unfolding of dialogue expands the social relationship, and Levinas argues that social life preserves a residuum of the initial “ethical” encounter with the face. Intersubjective dialogue entails conversation, teaching, and at a more general level, literary or philosophical discourse (TI: 51, 57, 251–52, 295).
Over the course of this expansion, the trace of responsibility is attenuated and conundrums arise concerning the well-being of others and conflicts within the community. These require deliberations about justice and fairness. For instance: what does justice for the other(s) mean? Should it above all concern the reparation of wrongs? Can responsibility for an other coexist with disinterested equity? Or is justice ultimately in service to the stronger and opposed to responsibility? Now, because it can clearly be interpreted as all these things, justice sometimes appears as intermediary between Levinas’ aforementioned ontology of worldly forces in conflict (or elementary being) and acts of responsibility. This would tally with Aristotle’s two conceptions of justice, first as political and second, as unbidden ‘decency’, tò epiekes, meaning to accept receiving less than one’s share. Aristotle himself defined the combination of the two as complete virtue (Nicomachean Ethics, 1130a, 119 and 1137b7–11). There would thus be an interesting precedent to Levinas’ question of the relationship between responsibility and justice in Aristotelian virtue ethics.
Levinas’ argument in Totality and Infinity unfolds up to the question of justice and then takes an unanticipated tack. Rather than pursuing justice as it is refined through civil society into the State, Levinas focuses on a smaller-scale institution, the family, arguably common to all humanity. It is presumably in the family rather than in the State that the responsibility described in the face-to-face encounter is most clearly enacted. If the family is consolidated by the birth of the child, then, as Levinas puts it, it is the father who elects and calls the child to responsibility, just as the child grows up serving his siblings in a way more personal than that prescribed by the impersonal justice of States. According to Levinas, this justice carries a specific temporal modalization: “The unique child, as elected one, is accordingly at the same time unique and non-unique. Paternity is produced as an innumerable future”, as open posterity (TI: 279). In this penultimate section entitled “Beyond the Face”, the phenomenology of the family thus inserts the responsibility experienced in the face-to-face into a micro-society, in which questions of justice may arise, but with a new emphasis on future time.
2.3.3 Time, Transcendence, and Sociality
Totality and Infinity does not devote attention to clock time or to the time of universal (or Hegelian) history. Because Levinas begins his analyses with the concept of being as virtually aligned with material causality and strife, the experience of ‘subjective’ time as the interruption by the face is not yet social time. History, too, seems to be a metaphysician’s history. In his “Preface”, Levinas describes history as violence, punctuated by extremes of war and temporary peace (TI: 21–23). Morgan has argued that this makes Levinas’ approach to ethical intersubjectivity anti-naturalistic, at least to the degree that naturalism is tied to a Hobbesian mechanistic ontology and by extension an ego-centered anthropology (Morgan 2011: 246). Levinas would be the last, however, to deny the self-interest of our drives and instincts. To the contrary, only an intersubjectivity inaugurated by the other’s summons interrupts these behaviors (Morgan 2011: 246). Yet Levinas also envisions an alternative history in which it is possible to bear witness to wrongs undergone by persons. These wrongs may not be recorded in the official history of governments, but their attestation prolongs the discussion of human sensibility invested by responsibility. Levinas writes,
History is worked over by the ruptures of history, in which a judgment is borne upon it. When man truly approaches the Other he is uprooted from history. (TI: 52)
Levinas’ phenomenological account of time thus contains three levels, an initial one equivalent to formal historicist time; a second level comparable to Husserl’s universal flow of immanent time-consciousness, and a third temporality that is episodic and affectively colored, which he calls an interruption or rupture.
[The] discontinuity of the inner life interrupts historical time [notably in the face-to-face encounter]. The thesis of the primacy of history constitutes an option for the comprehension of being in which interiority is sacrificed. The present work proposes another option (TI: 57).
The aforementioned interruption of our immanent consciousness qua time-flow by the other, an interruption that Levinas says characterizes our “inner life”, is aligned with the experience of transcendence.
Unlike Heidegger, who explained the subject in terms of Da-sein—itself an ongoing transcendence toward the world in which Da-sein “comes toward itself futurally” (he-BT: §69) in facing the possibility of its mortality—Levinas situates his very concrete transcendence in the interruption of the first two temporal levels. Indeed, whereas Heidegger gradually translated his conception of the silent call of being (to Da-sein) into the notion of the event (Ereignis) in the 1930s, Levinas makes his interruption an intersubjective affair or rather the basis of ethical intersubjectivity. For him, the encounter with the other is not an ontological event in Heidegger’s sense. Neither is it like an occurrence that breaks up the historical status quo, modifying the course of history into a ‘before’ and ‘after’, in function of its magnitude. Nevertheless, Levinas does argue that the encounter with alterity may leave a trace in historical time. Now, because the interruption brings to light a basic personal responsibility for an other, a host of responses are possible post facto, from welcoming that other with hospitality to attempting to get him out of our way. Be that as it may, a trace of the interruption persists in the subject, like a grain of sand in an oyster or a preconscious motivation to bear witness to the other’s suffering. Jill Stauffer has recovered some of these ‘traces’ in her research on the testimonies of those deprived of human rights (2015: 40–43, 56–58, 61–64, 91 inter alia).
Flowing out of the temporal interruptions that leave affective mnemonic traces in persons, the ground of social existence in Levinas does not resemble the solipsism for which Heidegger was sometimes criticized. Our life with others is never a flight from what should be the resolute assumption of our mortality (Heidegger’s “inauthenticity”), nor even moments disappearing in a teleology of expanding socio-political groups that culminate in the State (Hegel, sometimes Husserl). As individuals, we are always already in social relations, marked by a remainder of responsibility. We have always already been impacted by the expression (or face) of an other. Yet, because the immediacy of this impact resists conceptualization, we tend to overlook the force the other’s address has on us (as facial expression or words). We carry on, in our respective spheres, apparently motivated by desires and projects, some of which entail the kind of quests for mastery and recognition that Hegel described. Nevertheless, in Totality and Infinity, these quests are as if undercut by “metaphysical desire” (TI: 33–34, 114, 148ff.), which Levinas defines as “a desire [for the other] that cannot be satisfied”. As he explains, “we speak lightly of desires satisfied, or of sexual needs, or even of moral and religious needs” (TI: 34). However, metaphysical desire “desires beyond everything that can simply complete it. It is like goodness—the Desired does not fulfill it, but deepens it” (TI: 34). This under-layer of our everyday desires comes to light in the faltering of our will to mastery as experienced in the face-to-face encounter. The other’s facial expression or bodily posture affects me before I begin to reflect on it. As indicated, it is dual: a command and a summons. Naked and defenseless, the face signifies, with or without words, “Do not kill me”. It opposes a passive resistance to our desire for mastery wherein our freedom asserts its sovereignty (TI: 84). Levinas speaks of the face of the other who is “widow, orphan, or stranger”. While these are biblical figures, he argues that we encounter them concretely even before transcribing them into religious allegory (TI: 76–78). Indeed they invest our freedom as the possibility of giving.
It is as summons and injunction that expression precipitates transcendence. If I am self-sufficient in my everyday activities and perception, then this is because I am a being that inhabits overlapping worlds in which my sway is largely decisive for me. The passive resistance of the face alters this sway through an affective mood not unlike one Levinas had explored in 1935: shame. In shame, we experience our freedom as unjustifiable. In thus being as if lifted out of its concerns, the “I” offers an account to the other, who is thereby treated as if higher than that “I” when considered in its personal sovereignty. For that reason as well, the “I”, singled out and addressed by the other, is chosen or as if “elected” to respond (TI: 245–246, 279). It “transascends” (35, 41) or rises to the other, answering “here I am” (EI: 106). Levinas argues that this instant of “election” belongs to a temporal order different from that of everyday existence: the moment of enactment of a “good beyond Being” (TI: 80, 102–104, 292–293).
It is impossible to set up a temporal order of succession or alternation between being and the good beyond being. For humans, the good comes to pass almost trivially and in everyday contexts. Of course, as readily as responsibility and generosity may be glimpsed in human affairs, cruelty and competition are also obvious. Given this, Levinas seeks support for his intuition about the good in at least two moments in the philosophical tradition wherein its occurrence and irreducible value have been identified: Plato’s Idea of the good, and Descartes’ infinite substance, which points beyond itself to an unknowable cause. However, that humans experience moments of inexplicable generosity, even enact them spontaneously, is a fact that would remain enigmatic within an ontology of competing drives or merely utilitarian desires. In that respect, the trace of the good is present within existence as the possibility that something other than rivalries and instrumentalization take place intersubjectively.
As Levinas understands it, transcendence has the non-metaphysical characteristic of an interruption, a relation in nuce, and what he now calls “infinity”. Insofar as infinity denotes what is non-limited, uncircumscribable, it refers to the unpredictable quality of a face’s expression (TI: 5). As he writes,
[t]o think the infinite, the transcendent, the Stranger, is hence not to think an object. But to think what does not have the lineaments of an object is in reality to do more or better than think. (TI: 49)
So far as infinity has a positive sense, then, it has that sense as our unquenchable desire for sociality. Thus, before we interpret it as “God” or reify it as a summum ens, the idea of infinity is rooted in an everyday encounter whose implications are clearest at the sensuous-affective level, and even somewhat resemble Husserl’s explorations of spontaneous empathy (Einfühlung as radicalized in the 1930s notes on intersubjectivity [Husserliana, vols. 13–15 (Husserl 1973a,b,c)]). Rather than Husserl, however, Levinas refers to the French phenomenologist Maurice Merleau-Ponty’s conception of lived intersubjective flesh, urging that this corporeal intertwinement is part of our “fundamental historicity”, that is, part of the sedimented experiences that contribute to our grasp of new situations. Rich with the accumulation of past experiences, intersubjective sensibility proves to be the locus of relationality and transcendence in 1961.
In the fourteen years separating Existence and Existents and Time and the Other from Totality and Infinity, we see both continuities and differences. If Heidegger had begun what he conceived to be a hermeneutic deformalization of Husserl’s phenomenological consciousness, seeking what “lies hidden” beneath phenomena (he-BT: §7c), then Levinas extended this deformalizing gesture already in 1947, arguing that light itself is incipient meaning, suspending the opposition between the a priori and the a posteriori. By 1961, it is the experience of the face-to-face encounter that destabilizes the a priori-a posteriori dichotomy by urging that, in the face-to-face, the third party (humanity) looks at me through the eyes of the other. This is because the non-spatial “proximity” that is the interruption of our flowing time-consciousness takes place with an unnoticed spontaneity like that of the blinking of an eye, yet nevertheless leaves a trace. Consciousness always takes up after these instants of interruption and reconnects itself as a homogeneous flow. Thus the good beyond being is not radically separated from existence in 1961. Consequently and to repeat, this affair is a human one. Any philosophical translation of concrete embodied life must therefore approach the human subject as it emerges through its relations with others, even though the intersubjective situation entails both my particularization through election and a loss of egoic mastery. This is in line with many of Merleau-Ponty’s analyses, some of them inspired by Husserl, although Merleau-Ponty argues against transcendental subjectivity, urging that the classic phenomenological “I” constituting its world alone will drift toward an unwanted absoluteness. It could thus never be alone and must be approached existentially (mp-PP: 365).
2.3.4 Being, Mediations (the Family and the State), and the Will in Ethics and Politics
Whereas in Existence and Existents, Levinas voiced “the profound need to leave the climate of [Heidegger’s] philosophy” (EE: 4), by 1961 he will have done so, albeit not without significantly reworking Heidegger’s fundamental ontology. As we have seen, Levinas envisages being as constant, neutral presence and, at times, like a Hobbesian state of nature. Derrida reminds us that this pre-Heideggerian conception is close to Kant’s notion of existence understood as conflictual intensities (1997 [1999: 49, 86]). That is why, in its natural expression, being takes on almost a mechanistic quality in Levinas. In social and institutional senses, being is conceived as the encompassing of individuals and communities by the State. On the latter depend security and property, life and death. But in the “Preface” to Totality and Infinity, Levinas compares the State with systematic philosophy: as the ‘organon’ of politics, the State manages commerce and conflicts, just as it declares wars. Similarly, Hegel’s idealist dialectics oversees and integrates sensibility and cognition, passing from the individual to the collective, and expressing the movement of Geist or Spirit, itself (TI: 21–23; 36–38; 87–88).
Overall, Levinas’ most sustained criticisms target fundamental ontology. As we have seen, leaving the “atmosphere” of Heidegger’s thought motivates his return to more traditional conceptions of being. To be sure, Levinas was skeptical about deriving an ethics from ontology. Certainly, such an ethics could not limit itself to Heidegger’s Mitsein, that sociality into which Da-sein flees when troubled by its uncanny groundlessness (its being thrown into-the-world). Having attempted, from 1935 onward, to deformalize Heidegger’s being-there and its states of mind or moods (Befindlichkeiten), that is, down to more embodied experiences of shame, desire, hunger, and nausea, Levinas’ conviction is that Da-sein remains too formal an entity to exist in a world in which intersubjectivity is more substantial than a mere refuge from the anxious care of groundlessness (he-BT: 232). Indeed, although for Heidegger anxiety individuates us and discloses our possibility for “the freedom of choosing … and taking hold of [ourselves]” (he-BT: 232), this process remains solipsistic in the sense that it is our freedom and our mortality that are in question. When intensified, Angst reveals the groundlessness of our being-there, ultimately freeing us for the most radical question: why might there ‘be’ anything at all? Against Heidegger, Levinas understands this framing as tantamount to a hermeneutic universe in which the idea of our authentic possibility concerns only death and underestimates the significance of the encounter with the other person. Only through a different hermeneutics, which reveals human existence as embodied and interpersonal, can we conceptualize the opening to responsibility that the encounter with the other creates.
In this respect, and despite his debt to Heidegger, Levinas stands closer here to the French existentialists and to Charles Taylor, whose conception of the corporeal self is moral “through and through” (Morgan 2007: 169). However, unlike Taylor, Levinas does not endorse a plurality of strong values, because the encounter with the other is the primary condition for him. While Taylor’s philosophy is influenced by Christianity, a significant debate has been ongoing for over a decade about Levinas’ philosophy and its relationship to Judaism. It has been suggested that Levinas’ critique of Heidegger’s ontology as a “philosophy of the Neuter” (TI: 298) relies on decisive attention paid to the influence of “Jerusalem” over that of “Athens” in the Western philosophical tradition. Scholars like Shmuel Trigano have traced a number of crucial Levinasian “philosophemes” to Jewish positions, notably as expressed by Philo and Maimonides (Trigano 2002: 145–178). On the other hand, commentators like Leora Batnitzky have argued that, when compared with the thought of Leo Strauss, for whom Jewish philosophy still holds a place for “revelation”, Levinas’ work largely rehabilitates the tradition of Modern philosophy—and with it a secular, almost political, project (Batnitzky 2006: 4). Despite this, and in light of Totality and Infinity, she comes close to Trigano when she argues that Levinas tends to ignore important political questions, including that of the Jewish State, which has dire consequences for his thought, because
to think politics is urgent in an undertaking [such as Levinas’], since it amounts to thinking through the criterion of ethical validity of the universalization project … with regard to the other and with regard to self …. (Batnitzky 2006: 173–174)
Levinas’ recourse to Descartes’ Meditations may well justify Batnitzky’s qualifying his thought as Modern. More important is that his argument that ethics is first philosophy (TI: 29, 47, 304) runs into the difficulty of universalizing our pre-intentional “experience” of spontaneous responsibility toward the other. Hence, in Totality and Infinity, the transition from the micro-sociality of the face-to-face encounter to social existence more broadly occurs through language as teaching and dialogue (TI: 194–197; 201–203). As indicated, Levinas will open still another path to universalization, through the family, in his final section “Beyond the face” (TI: 267–280). Despite this second path, the question remains how it is that, through the eyes of the other, the whole of humanity looks at me (TI: 213). Gillian Rose first criticized this limited universalization of responsibility as lacking important socio-political mediations (1992). Ernst Wolff has investigated this passage toward universality in light of Levinas’ evolving conception of liberal society, from a skeptical stance toward a more positive appraisal (2007).
By focusing on temporal mediations (rather than social or spatial ones), Levinas does provide a partial universalization of responsibility by way of the aforementioned phenomenon of the family. This choice, resembling the solidarity through love found in Hegel’s early theological writings, works responsibility out in terms one might today consider traditional or patriarchal, i.e., through paternal election and the service of the son to his brothers. Introducing this discussion, Levinas admits:
The acuity of the problem [of universalization] lies in the necessity of maintaining the I in the transcendence [of the face-to-face] with which it hitherto seemed incompatible [given its self-interests]. (TI: 276)
That is, although the face-to-face is a momentary interruption, the trace of responsibility needs to be received and assured in a more durable way, which leads Levinas to assert that “the fecundity of the I is its very [temporal] transcendence” (TI: 277). That is, thanks to the time of generations, an ego surpasses itself through its children (TI: 277). Thus, while this under-determined time of generations “adds something new to being, something absolutely new” (TI: 283), the child, it provides a partial mediation between the affective instant of responsibility and the creation of institutions and practices apt to ensure that the ethical trace has a potential for universality.
Both Rose (1992) and Derrida have pointed toward the difficulty of introducing ethics into questions of justice and politics in this way (Derrida 1964 [1978: 121, 133–136]). Part of the difficulty here lies in the tension between universalization understood as the ethical cultivation of humanity, versus universalization understood as providing an ethical inflection to politics broadly conceived. For Levinas, the passage of responsibility into politics is invariably fragile, because ethical language is frequently absorbed or imitated by political rhetoric. Yet, in 1961, the question of how responsibility and election experienced in the family passes—without tribalism—into a vaster history and public space remains under-thematized; notably, as it concerns demands for social justice and equality. Levinas partly responds, urging that the notion of fraternity is not firstly biological or genetic, but intersubjective; it flows out of face-to-face encounters—and what he calls the human kinship forged by “monotheism” (TI: 214), by which he means the ethical core or essence of Judaism. He argues,
The very status of the human implies fraternity and the idea of the human race. Fraternity is radically opposed to the conception of a humanity united by resemblance, a multiplicity of diverse families arisen from the stones cast behind by Deucalion, and which, across the struggle of egoisms, results in a human city. (TI: 214)
This unification in difference is created only when monotheism results in a law that equalizes those obliged by it. Indeed, as we have seen, Levinas similarly traces what he calls originary “religion” to the face-to-face, following his phenomenological genealogy (TI: 40). Commentators have nevertheless insisted that, unless ethics can correct or amend justice on the basis of a subject’s experience of responsibility, the possibility of universalization stands open to doubt (Wolff 2007: 383–399). And for many commentators, interpersonal responsibility remains the exception not the rule. It may be subject to codification, though that would be the concern of ethical theory, which is not Levinas’ priority (see Morgan 2007: 238).
Two dilemmas thus arise in Totality and Infinity. It is an open question whether they are laid to rest in Otherwise than Being. They concern first the dichotomy between what was traditionally called free will versus nature, and second the socio-cultural mediations between families and States. In the first case, it may be surprising that Levinas characterizes human existence in terms resembling those of physiological determinism, that is, in terms of drives and the interests attaching to them. For him, the problem of reconciling freedom and nature would above all be one of interrupting the activity of the drives, which is the bodily substrate of consciousness and contributes to its dynamic temporal unity. Understanding the will, then, does not begin with freedom so much as with something closer to conatus essendi or even to a will to power (i.e., with something “natural”). Levinas proves close to Kant here. For the latter, the motivation to disregard one’s interests in favor of the moral law lies in the unique affect called Achtung. Kant urged that Achtung be considered in its negative and positive aspects: negatively, as attention or freedom from sensuous distraction. In its positive sense, Achtung corresponds to reverentia, respect, understood as the freedom to grasp the law as something eminently worthy of adherence, despite its constraining quality. Moreover,
the presentation of something as determining basis of our will humbles us in our self-consciousness when we compare it with the sensible propensity of our nature. (Kant 1788 [2002: 45]; Nancy 1983 [2004: 142]; Basterra 2015: 91–98)
As the focus of attention and motivation, Achtung is unique in that it is what Kant calls an intellectual affect (Kant 1788 [2002: 66]). It has no direct relationship to our bodily make up, which, as we know from Levinas, is indissociably tied up with drives and instincts. When thus motivated, practical reason determines itself to act out of respect for a law indemonstrable by theoretical reason, thereby discovering freedom in the performance of its moral act. It is only then, post facto, that freedom is found to have reality, through obedience.
Basterra has argued that Kant’s ethics affords us an important insight into the question of nature versus freedom in Levinas. Whereas for both, the will follows its natural course (desires and emotions), something outside it may compel it toward ethical behavior or responsibility. For Kant, the categorical imperative does not “belong” to the self-positing subject, but rather addresses them as if from without and elicits humility. For Levinas, it is the face of the other that addresses us thus and focuses our attention, prior to our considering that face’s empirical qualities (sex, ethnicity, etc.; Basterra 2015: 125–126).
Let us now turn toward the second dilemma: the fraught relationship between ethics and politics. In 1961, Levinas characterizes politics and drives as unfolding in a parallel fashion. Both are sites for the manifestation of the will to persist in being. He doubts that politics “left to itself” can become or long remain ethical (TI: 300; Wolff 2007: 129). However, he remarks that justice can be addressed as a demand posed to some States, notably liberal ones.
This does not solve the problem of mediations, yet suggests that it may be misguided. After all, what do the mediations ultimately serve, if not the finality of the State as overarching protector and regulator? Levinas was aware of this. In 1951, in his first published article on the State of Israel, he did not hesitate to forestall accusations of idolatry even against a Jewish State. Arguing philosophically that the “State is not an idol because it precisely permits full self-consciousness”, he added that modern humans “acknowledge [their] spiritual nature … when acting in the service of the State and in their dignity as citizens”. This is indeed why, he added, the decline of organized religions is tied to the advent of modern States. Here and elsewhere, he recognized that a State, and preeminently one founded on a religion, embodied a paradox whose solution—in Israel’s case at least—could only be found in an approach to religion as the symbolic pendant of ethical responsibility (DF: 218). He thereupon added the more existential claim that
the Jewish people craved their own land and their own State, not because of the abstract independence which they desired, but because they could then finally begin the work of their lives. (DF: 218)
Clearly, this is not an exhaustive solution to the problem of mediations between family (or ethnicity) and the State (or politics).
Commentators have taken various positions on Levinas’ politics. Howard Caygill’s Levinas and the Political was the first systematic, critical study thereof. Caygill emphasized inconsistencies in Levinas’ texts on politics and Israel, and pointed to his “problematic fusion of rabbinics and Hegelianism” (2002: 79–93). Morgan and Salanskis have recently argued that politics can stand within both history and a certain idealism, at least insofar as one understanding of “Israel” acknowledges Jewish particularity as carrying the possibility of universalization, thanks to the Biblical prophets’ call for justice (Morgan 2016: 250ff; Salanskis 2006; see also Salanskis 2016). It bears noting that by 1984 Levinas will be more generous toward European liberal States, and more willing to trace the genealogy of liberalism back to a Biblical conception of responsibility. In “Peace and Proximity” (1984), he ventured,
Europe is not a simple confluence of two cultural currents. It is the concreteness where theoretical and biblical wisdom do better than converge. The relation with the other … that is, with peace[,] comes a reason that thematizes, synchronizes, and synthesizes, that thinks a world and reflects on being, concepts necessary for the peace of humanity. (col-BPW: 168)
2.4 Otherwise than Being, or Beyond Essence (1974): Transcendence-in-Immanence
Otherwise than Being grew up around its core fourth chapter, entitled “Substitution” and first published in 1968 (OBBE: 99–129). It is a justifiable simplification to say that Levinas’ concept of substitution corresponds to that of responsibility, explored this time as immanent relationality rather than “my” response to the face, understood as exteriority. In this work, Levinas uses the term “intériorité” repeatedly, which the translator renders as “inwardness”, perhaps to avoid introducing spatial binaries (OBBE: 28, 87, 92, 108, 119). The work is not about inner-outer dichotomies, much less cognitive operations, or object-memories of events or things. It has little to do with what we discover phenomenologically through reflection. “Inwardness” denotes a bodily life as if haunted by others, which is also now called “proximity” (OBBE: 81–94). Comparable in this to Husserl’s horizon of apperceptions, inwardness entails a spectrum of affective tones. Perhaps unlike Husserl, these tones require recourse to discursive figures that Levinas now borrows from psychology, poetics, hermeneutics, even theology and dogmatics (e.g., “obsession”, “persecution”, “recurrence”, “too tight in its skin”, “exile”, “maternity”, “love”, and finally “expiation” and “kenosis”). While thus concerned with intersubjective affectivity in its immediate passive undergoing, substitution is manifest in action or praxis, a domain in which we experience immediacy. By 1974, then, transcendence, understood as the other “outside”, has become transcendence-in-immanence, in a sense closer to Merleau-Ponty’s account of intercorporeity, which similarly urged that philosophies of embodiment should never oppose immanence and transcendence (mp-PP: 308). For Levinas, the concept of the other would still have some reference to the face as expression and exteriority, but it would denote principally the “inwardness” of non-object forming memories, whose affective return or “recurrence” complexifies the linear time-structure of Husserl’s phenomenological consciousness (OBBE: 88).
2.4.1 The Structure of the Work
Otherwise than Being opens with a general overview of the argument, in which being and transcendence are also named “essence” and “disinterest”. Emphasizing the processual quality of being, Levinas will refer to it equivalently as “being” or “essence”, venturing that he might even have used the dynamic form essance (OBBE: 187 note 1). Responsibility will be focused and discussed as the condition of possibility of all verbal signification (OBBE: 43–47). But the themes of conversation and teaching recede into the background. He now makes a more strategic use of the body as flesh, that is, as a locus with simultaneously an inside and an outside, as in Merleau-Ponty. Subjectivity is again framed affectively as the coming to pass of responsibility, although this time the phenomenological analysis of intentionality is analyzed into its primitive layer of sensibility that Levinas calls “pre-originary susceptiveness [susception pré-originaire]” (OBBE: 122, 136–138). For him, that means that subjectivity always entails pre-cognitive dimensions that are from the outset intersubjectively conditioned. The other has become other-in-the-same, as indicated. But the other-in-the-same is not objectively different from the factical other who faces me, because neither are objects and both are expressions or modes of alterity. As we will see, the other-in-the-same describes a pre-thematic “investiture” (because I never know when I first experienced this other in me; OBBE: 125): “All my inwardness is invested in the form of a despite-me, for-another” (OBBE: 11). In Otherwise than Being, Levinas has returned to Husserl’s inquiries into passive synthesis, to the latter’s perplexities about the stretch of retentions of passive experiences, about the unbidden spontaneity of our associations, and the near-infinity of sensuous horizons—all part of a process unfolding in what Husserl called in 1926 “a phenomenology of the so-called unconscious” (Husserl 2001: 201 and “Appendix 19” 512–519). In light of this return, we should not approach interiority and exteriority as opposed terms, but as dimensions of intersubjectivity and the inhabitation of a self by alterity.
The second chapter approaches Heidegger’s discussion of language as the way in which being becomes, the way it temporalizes (he-BT: §68). Levinas revisits Heidegger’s argument that the logos gathers up being and makes possible its unveiling (alētheia). He will argue that the lapse of time between lived immediacy and its reflective representation is never fully gathered by the logos. Therefore, the temporal lapse poses a challenge to language understood as Heidegger’s gathering and it falls, much the way that transcendence as interruption did in 1961, outside the realm of being, even though Levinas still considers being a process of totalization, something all-encompassing. This rethinking of the lapse along with transcendence-in-immanence will be Levinas’ ultimate modification of Heidegger’s project. Together, the lapse and this new conception of transcendence do ultimately pass through language as words addressed. I will come back to this. For now, suffice it to say that it is the inhabitation of a self by alterity that forms the sensuous conditions of possibility of speech. Thus it is not being that addresses us through language, it is a quite different alterity.
Two additional innovations in Otherwise than Being include: (1) the proposed phenomenological reduction to the birth of meaning in a bodily self that carries what it cannot identify as properly itself (the “other”, affectively). This appears to be a radicalization of Husserl’s discussion of the pre-reflective ego in Ideas II (§58, “Supplement 12” §§2–3). Whereas Husserl emphasized the basis of the ego in its ongoing flow of lived experience, which he said was “lawful”, Levinas focuses on the discontinuity of time consciousness (see also Franck 1981 [2014: 149–166]). (2) A hermeneutics of the self, emerging through intersubjective contact in which the “proximity” of the other elicits passive “substitution” and opens onto spontaneous communication (OBBE: 113–121). In what suggests an attempt at deepening Husserl’s concept of empathy (Einfühlung; OBBE: 125), the figures of proximity, recurrence, and substitution characterize the intersubjective intertwining that makes communication possible: “Communication would be impossible if it should have to begin in the ego, a free subject, to whom every other would be only a limitation that invites war” (OBBE: 119). Indeed, prior to spoken or written language, prior to signs reciprocally exchanged, “we suppose that there is in the transcendence involved in language a relationship that is not empirical speech, but responsibility” (OBBE: 120). As “my pre-originary susceptiveness”, the nature of intersubjective sensibility shares its time-structure with strong passions, sometimes indeed with trauma (OBBE: 122–124). As Levinas writes:
[this susceptiveness] describes the suffering and vulnerability of the sensible as the other in me …. the ipseity [also known as embodied selfhood] has become at odds with itself in its return to itself. The self-accusation of remorse gnaws away at the closed and firm core of consciousness … fissioning it
in its temporal unity (OBBE: 124–125). Consequently, vulnerability and sensitivity to trauma not only provoke retreat into self but heighten our awareness, however tenuous, of our connection with the other(s), and they motivate our bearing witness. Thus the affective in-habitation of my self by others precedes speech-acts and speech-communities. If the reverse were the case; that is, if a de facto community were posited as prior to the event of words addressed, then this would presuppose what it was meant to show: the genesis of speech-acts (OBBE: 92). Instead, ‘beneath’ words proffered lies a fundamental vulnerability that psychology might interpret as a predisposition to witnessing, from oneself to the other. Levinas calls this vulnerability the “Saying” (OBBE: 149–152). It is both precursive to words uttered in the form of address (i.e., pre-linguistic), and it would accompany communication like its affective horizon. The duality of Saying and Said is a new concept in Levinas’ late work.
Building on the exploration of proximity begun in chapter three, chapters four and five evince a tone more somber than any found hitherto in Levinas’ œuvre. This is in keeping with the dedication of the book, written in Hebrew and in French, which announces that it will be a work of mourning. While Derrida characterized Totality and Infinity as a phenomenology of hospitality (Derrida 1997 [1999: 21]), Otherwise than Being commemorates the “victims of the … hatred of the other man”. It develops the parallel between semiotic “substitution” of a word for a thing (or the signifying function of all language) and the spontaneous substitution of myself for an other (implied by a spectrum of acts of self-sacrifice), which Levinas calls the one-for-the-other (OBBE: 45–50, 70–74, 119–129). Whereas Heidegger had explored the hermeneutics of Da-sein, for whom communication unfolds thanks to our (as Da-sein) taking or equivalently offering “this [thing or word] as that [thing]” (he-BT: §31), Levinas will arguably set Heidegger’s “as” into his “for”: Heidegger’s “this as that” becomes Levinas’ “one for the other” of substitution. While responsibility expressed the unfolding of the intersubjective affects that Levinas compared to Plato’s “Good beyond Being” in 1961 (TI: 292–293, 304–307), the good of substitution is more ambiguous, occurring “on the brink of tears and laughter” (OBBE: 18), yet also “glorious” (OBBE: 94, 140–144).
The experience of time characteristic of trauma, and mourning, does not take the place of Husserlian phenomenology’s flowing-yet-always-also-present (strömend-stehend) time-consciousness, any more than it replaces the succession and uninterruptedness of clock time. If what-is results from the self-giving of things to the focus of phenomenological attention, and if together they invariably find a place in the formal flow of time-consciousness, then even for Husserl what-is, i.e. being, must temporalize. Husserl had always urged that, insofar as there is appearing, there is being as well (hu-CM: §46; also see Heidegger, he-BT: §7). For Heidegger, being temporalized through Da-sein, which was out-ahead-of-itself or oriented toward its future. Yet if, in both their cases, being unfolds temporally, then for Levinas, our sensibility shows a different temporal character, because the sensibility called the other-in-the-same returns and repeats rather than flows. Like trauma and mourning, responsibility in its new somber tones recurs without definitively halting the flow of time-consciousness. This is why Levinas referred to the cluster of concepts around substitution as adverbial: they pass through being (understood as verbal or processual) and its time, and they modify it. Indeed, when being is understood as the verbal dynamism expressed by “essence”, then responsibility and substitution can only be compared to ad-verbs. Hence the title, autrement, other-wise or ‘otherly’ than being (OBBE: 35).
The final half of chapter five recurs to the performative register of language to convey the tension of a consciousness striving to consolidate itself in the wake of alterity as affective investiture, by which its passivity slowly becomes active witnessing. This opening out of inward affects becoming gestures of generosity motivates Otherwise than Being’s recourse to a new, performative language. Thus, Levinas adds,
and I still interrupt the ultimate discourse in which all the discourses are stated, in saying it to one that listens … That is true of the discussion I am elaborating at this very moment. (OBBE: 170)
Aware of the seemingly artificial quality of calling his authorial witness “immediate”, Levinas’ claim is nevertheless more than a literary artifice. Basterra compares it to Kant’s idea of autonomy, which shows itself only when we follow a law that “exceeds and addresses the subject”, motivating our ethical act (Basterra 2015: 126). Earlier in her study, she had argued that the intellectual affect of Achtung was capable of focusing our attention and opening us to a respect comparable to Levinas’ Saying, which he also calls “sincerity”. For pure reason, autonomy “is therefore an illusion”, but it is one only insofar as that which is not intrinsically part of my interests can still motivate me to act. Thus pure reason erroneously supposes that my ethical gesture came from me (Basterra 2015: 129). Levinas provides us a crucial hermeneutics of the intersubjective origin of this Kantian “illusion”. He sets our misinterpretation of heteronomy as autonomy in Kant’s practical reason into a hermeneutic register, referring to the sincerity and substitution underlying the words we offer: “It is in the risky uncovering of oneself, in sincerity, the breaking up of inwardness … exposure to traumas, vulnerability” that I bear witness to, and for another (OBBE: 48). Again, it does not come from us. Levinas finds illustrations of such witnessing in many places, from the justice imperative of the prophets to the concern of Latin American clerics over the events unfolding in Chile in 1973 (OGCM 81–82).
2.4.2 New Existential Moods and Fleshly Memories
As in his 1935 discussion of need and nausea, Otherwise than Being argues that lived sensibility often overflows representation. And again, Levinas suggests sensuous modes different from Heidegger’s Befindlichkeiten (see §2.2 above), in which all understanding takes place for Heidegger (he-BT: 17). Indeed, interwoven layers of affectivity are unfolded in Otherwise than Being. Levinas explores the sensuous-affective proto-experience of the other in light of new moods, writing: “Remorse is the trope of the literal sense of sensibility. In its passivity is erased the distinction between being accused and accusing oneself” (OBBE: 125). Unlike Existence and Existents, wherein light overcame the distinction between subjects and objects, allowing the subject to make the object intelligible within its horizon of appearing (EE: 41), Otherwise than Being approaches transcendence in sensuous and temporal terms, arguing inter alia for the insistence of a past that eludes thematization (OBBE: 122–123). In that sense, transcendence for an embodied being is always transcendence-in-immanence. The affective “experience” of my relations with particular others is thus preserved as a trace or pre-thematic reminiscence of the flesh, as “a relationship with a singularity without the mediation of any principle, any ideality” (OBBE: 100). Invoking Otherwise than Being (OBBE: 105–107), John Llewelyn has called this affective dimension of invested selfhood, or “ipseity”, a “‘deep’ saying” that “bears witness to what is neither recollected nor forgotten in the epistemic sense of these terms when [or once] it is represented as a sign” (Llewelyn 2002b: 135).
As indicated, Otherwise than Being problematizes Levinas’ earlier, more ontological approach on the basis of Husserl’s inquiries into passive syntheses and Einfühlung (empathy). There is good reason for this. Responsibility denoted an event that repeats, and even increases as it is assumed (already TI: 100–101). In Otherwise than Being, however, the question of immanence and passivity arises in regard to responsibility’s unremarked persistence and its affective upwellings in us. This is because the status of a memory of sensuous events, which affect us before we represent them, is elusive. For the phenomenologist, it might correspond to an apperception or horizon, in the sense of something not directly perceived. Thus Levinas also insists that, unlike the apperceptions Husserl was able to explore thanks to the reduction he set on memory, this affective past continues to elude thematization because it was never an intentional object at all, and because memories of our lived flesh precede the consolidation of our ego (OBBE: 144–147). John Drabinski has explored this “pre-history” in light of Levinas’ reprise of genetic phenomenology (2001: 185–206). Theodore de Boer approaches it as an echo of both Rosenzweig and Jewish prophetism (1997: 87–100). Of course, Levinas is aware that such a temporality is open to skeptical critique. He even reminds us that skepticism itself obeys an ethical imperative to deconstruct philosophy and with it, all totalizing discourses, whether they are logical or political (OBBE: 168–170).
Levinas does not propose a solution to the conundrum of how non-objective memories can be translated into objects for philosophical reflection. His aim is to deconstruct dialogue down to its embodied condition of possibility, and this leads to a discussion which is not so unlike Husserl’s genetic inquiries into “proto-intentionality [Urintentionalität]” explored in the 1920s. Unlike Husserl, however, he does not aim at a system consisting of levels of drives and affects formatted by higher egoic structures (Husserl, E Manuscript III 9/5a, cited in hu-GDP: lixff). Yet he does exploit a difficulty that beset Husserl’s early phenomenology of time-consciousness, one that would argue in favor of Levinas’ 1974 conception of “diachrony”, or the interruption that he equates with transcendence-in-immanence. This was the paradox of sensation in relation to intentionality that Husserl identified in Appendix 12 of his lectures on internal time consciousness (Hua 10: 130–133). In his 1965 essay, “Intentionality and Sensation” (DEH: 135–150), Levinas focused on the gap (i.e., diachrony) between bodily sensation entering intentionality and sensation as pre-conscious bodily processes. He recalled the paradox that the sensuous origins of intentionality lay outside intentionality’s field or reach, in the body, even as the ongoing alterations of sensation forge our feeling of ongoing temporal progression. To be explicitly experienced, sensation thus had to intentionalize. Yet much of its prior, bodily existence eludes our consciousness.
Levinas compared this dual, conscious-preconscious status of sensibility to his idea of a pre-intentional “receptivity of an ‘other’ penetrating into the ‘same’, [in sum, to our intersubjective] life and not [to] ‘thought’” (DEH: 144). As already broached by Husserl, this sensuous “other” will support Levinas’ 1974 arguments for the affective interruptions of the even flow of time-consciousness, and his claim that intersubjective affects overflow the framework of all representational consciousness. Sophie Veulemans has fruitfully compared Levinas’ diachrony with Bergson’s approach to the “new” in the midst of duration (Veulemans 2008). Rudolf Bernet, in turn, equates the newness of the phenomenological instant with “the root of all alterity and all difference” in Levinas, which allows Bernet to urge that the intersubjective investiture of the subject “will always [prove] unthinkable in a philosophy of consciousness” (Bernet 2002: 92). Following his argument, phenomenology would not have adequately thought through the sensuous way “in which the other liberates the subject from its captivity within … immanence” (Bernet 2002: 93).
2.4.3 The Saying and the Said
Otherwise than Being involves an innovative discussion of signification. Given Levinas’ hermeneutic insight that language is not merely a system of words paired up with pre-existing, objective realities, but instead brings reality to light, language and time will have analogous functions. That is, both make meaning possible as the realization of our world. Indeed, while Heidegger had argued that being resonates in (poetic) language, as the verb “to be”, Levinas, as we have seen, had counter-argued for an otherwise than being that showed itself in ad-verbial meaning. Yet, if the relationship between language and being is fully encompassing, even in a sense mystical, as it is for Heidegger, then either Levinas’ otherwise than being looks like mere speculation, or it simply inheres in being or participates in its verb-like transcendence. Either way, fundamental ontology thereby proves primordial and weakens Levinas’ claims. Yet for the latter, transcendence in fact points to the temporality that, as we have seen, already differs from phenomenology’s totalizing flow or the way Heidegger’s being temporalizes through Da-sein (i.e., as out-ahead-of-itself toward its ownmost possibility; OBBE: 169–170, 178–182). The lapse of time between the pre-intentional sensuous moment and its intentionalization denotes the transcendence that Levinas also equates with “the Saying” (OBBE: 37–55). His discussion of the Saying correlates with his treatment of sincerity, introduced already in Existence and Existents. Otherwise than Being radicalizes his notion of sincerity, insisting that the structure of sensibility is always as if punctuated by sensuous lapses. It is thanks to such time lapses that we are open and able to communicate because, as we have seen, proximity is an affective mode that motivates dialogue. While all sensuous lapses are not necessarily openings to intersubjective communication, proximity and vulnerability are the loci of transcendence-in-immanence and the birth of signification (whether words are actually uttered or not). For Levinas, there is more in living affectivity than Heidegger’s conception of being speaking through language captured. This is clear the moment we understand signification originally as an affective proto-intentionality and not as some thought, already formulated, that the I thereupon chooses to communicate to another (OBBE: 43).
Levinas thus conceives language as more than denotation and description. Already verbs escape the coupling of words with things that we find in the case of the noun. “In the verb of apophansis [predication], which is the verb properly so called, the verb ‘to be’, essence resounds and is heard” (OBBE: 41). “Red reddens” without requiring conversion into propositions; sounds resound in music and poetry. Nevertheless, a verb can be converted into a noun, thereby losing its processual quality.
Through the ambiguousness of the logos … the verb par excellence [‘being’] in which essence resounds … is nominalized, becomes a word designating and sanctioning identities, assembling time … into a conjuncture. (OBBE: 42)
Thus, even the verbality or event-like quality of being can take on a nominal form, such as in “a being”. Levinas calls this convertibility “the amphibology of being and entities” (OBBE: 43). While this back-and-forth reference expresses the danger of taking being for a thing—a danger about which Heidegger warns us—the amphibology also fails to grasp fully the reflexive quality of verbs like se dire, understood as “to say” but in a passive sense, as though one were saying oneself, self-communicating. Levinas then sets his ethical-hermeneutic “reduction” on the reflexive particle se, urging that, although being “speaks” through the logos, the se points toward an intersubjective mode of our embodied sensuous passivity (OBBE: 43–45). This passivity is enigmatic because the se is not a verb and cannot really be made into a noun. It is in its enigmatic structure that the vulnerability that arises in proximity as if grounds signification, and words said, to another. To this reflexive se, or “self”, corresponds our passivity, as it occurs in the temporal lapse called “diachrony”. Diachrony thus expresses our sincerity toward the other and a certain transcendence: “the spirit hears the echo of the otherwise” (OBBBE: 44). With the adverb (“otherwise”), a modalization of fleshly investiture momentarily escapes the nominalization flowing out of the aforementioned amphibology between verbs and nouns, between being and a being. Here we find the ultimate sense of transcendence, which Levinas compares with Merleau-Ponty’s “fundamental historicity”, those unremarked, passive bodily sedimentations that make up our selfhood (OBBE: 45).
2.4.4 Hermeneutics and Jewish Philosophy
Levinas’ later work, notably Otherwise than Being, has been characterized as hermeneutic. Focusing on the discussions of the other-in-the-same and passivity in that work, commentator Giuseppe Lissa provides an apt description of Levinas’ interpretive project. By investigating the depths of consciousness, by comparing its passivity to the process of ageing, Levinas investigates a
reality unknowable, but perhaps interpretable by a thinking that no longer claims to be an exercise in knowledge … because this thinking is engaged in the search for a meaning that precedes all knowledge.
Lissa concludes that Levinas intimates a meaning that, in “preceding [knowledge], founds it, orients it, and to some degree justifies it” (Lissa 2002: 227). For him, Levinas’ turn to hermeneutics largely dates from his abandonment of his phenomenology of “exteriority”, as the subtitle of Totality and Infinity indicates: An Essay on Exteriority. As we have seen, insofar as the search for meaning underlying intentional object-constitution (and other modes of intentionality) presupposes a meaning only incipiently grasped—which corresponds to Heidegger’s rethinking of hermeneutics in light of Da-sein’s basic understanding—Levinas appears to owe a debt both to Heidegger’s existential hermeneutics as well as to a much older, polyphonic practice of reading: Talmudic thought as interpretively elaborating Jewish law (Halakhah) and recounting and parsing narratives (Aggadah). Because this hermeneutics differs from that of Christian theology by giving significantly less weight to philosophical justifications of faith, it is worth our turning briefly to it.
Levinas presented twenty-three Talmudic readings in the context of the Colloques des intellectuels juifs de langue française. However, in 1957, at the first meeting of the colloquium, he merely participated in the debates. Salomon Malka reminds us of one of his profoundly hermeneutic observations:
Judaism is not a religion, the word doesn’t exist in Hebrew; it is much more than that, it is an understanding of being. The Jews introduced into history the idea of hope and that of a future …. Moreover, Jews have the sentiment that their obligations toward the other person come before their obligations in regard to God. (Malka 2002: 42, my trans., emph. added)
This remark already shows us two important things. First, that Judaism might be an “understanding of being” implies that this understanding is profoundly aware of its finitude and, by extension, has to be an ongoing process. It helps us grasp how it is that Levinas found resources in Heidegger’s hermeneutics, both utilizing and criticizing its approach. Second, that our obligations to the other person somehow come before duties toward God (from rituals to norms), and occasionally also abrogate these duties, already opens a secular, or better, a human-oriented dimension within Judaism.
The relationship between Levinas’ thought, its Jewish influences, and phenomenological philosophy has given rise to multiple evaluations. Martin Kavka argues that “Levinas understood both Judaism and Western philosophy as engaging in structurally similar forms of thinking” (Kavka 2010: 20–21). He situates the structural similarity in that “both [these intellectual corpuses] consist of texts that point to what cannot be brought to presence” and consequently work on, or between, the dimensions of reference, explanation, and hermeneutic pre-comprehension (cf. Ouaknin 1993: 225 [1995: 155–156]). Yet Kavka adds that Levinas’ relationship to the Jewish canon is also “inherently muddy”, though it is also clear that there is more than one canon, more than a single interpretation thereof. Indeed, both Michael Fagenblat and Kavka agree that “it is not clear … that … a ‘new direction’ in Jewish philosophy is [ever] really new” (Kavka 2010: 21). Moreover, Fagenblat has argued that Levinas’ ethics prolongs, in a phenomenological-hermeneutic register, “the dispersal of [modern approaches to the] Judeo-Christian God in social life” (Fagenblat 2010: 196). He also examines the hermeneutic extension that Otherwise than Being gives to Totality and Infinity. Both commentators suggest that Levinas’ increasingly critical stance toward the epistemological and foundationalist aspects of Husserlian phenomenology motivated him to extend his hermeneutic recourse beyond Heidegger’s Existenzphilosophie toward Jewish thought, including Neo-Platonic currents and Maimonides (Fagenblat 2010: 97–110). ,  But it can also be argued that Levinas’ hermeneutics begins well before Otherwise than Being. His reinterpretation of being-in-the-world, the meaning of facticity, the creation of a dwelling, and even his reading of eros and the family in 1961 entail interpretive choices, indebted to at least two significant hermeneutic themes: Heidegger’s interpretation of our pre-comprehension of existence and Franz Rosenzweig’s approach to Jewish life in The Star of Redemption (Rosenzweig 1921 ).
In 1961, Levinas wrote that Rosenzweig’s Star of Redemption was “too often present in this book [Totality and Infinity] to be cited” (TI: 28), and numerous are the commentaries on the presence of Rosenzweig in Levinas’ work. It is important to recall that Rosenzweig had been a scholar of Hegel until the experience of the trenches in World War I motivated his rethinking of idealist political philosophy and Christian universality more broadly. The Star of Redemption is a complex work analyzing the respective tasks of Jewish and Christian wisdom and ritual. Peter Eli Gordon argues that Rosenzweig is
a post-Nietzschean philosopher, in that, like Heidegger, he denies that human meaning is intelligible independent of a life-context. Temporal hermeneutics thus replaces the transcendental search for essence. (Gordon 2003: 185)
The same could be said of Levinas. Since he conceives temporality in human terms (as opposed to eternity or stasis), meaning itself can only be approached in light of time. Readers familiar with Rosenzweig’s “new thinking” may know that he situated one of the principal hermeneutic differences between Judaism and Christianity in the way their theologies ‘temporalized’: Christianity being oriented around the life and death of the incarnate God, an event whose occurrence lies in the past; Judaism, on the other hand, being future-oriented, awaiting the messiah (who does not come).
Levinas took up the question of meaning and temporality in a way somewhat different from both Rosenzweig and Heidegger. In 1961, as we have seen, his phenomenology of hospitality proceeded on the present-time of love of life and the encounter called the face-to-face. However, the place where he explicitly uses the term “phenomenology” therein concerns precisely a secularized messianic future. This is the chapter entitled “Phenomenology of Eros”, which deploys “a phenomenological model for the ultimate term of our desire”, as Fagenblat puts it (2010: 93). The argument would be this: before eros is sublimated in civil society, eros and (sometimes) the family bring to light our concern with others in their particularity and difference, independently of their biological or social roles. We can take the family as a “model” here, in the Frankfurt School’s sense of
an intellectual construction … [whose elements] are borrowed from empirical experiences that have already shown their worth such that the elements used appear henceforth obvious. (Broch 2008: 43)
The phenomenology of eros opens a future of “election” within the family and perhaps beyond it. Despite the apparent heterosexism of his formulations, Levinas introduces abiding concern for singularity and uniqueness by defining the figure of paternity as the possibility of electing each son in his specificity, even as the latter may serve (and clash with) his brothers. Consistent with a model, the family is both figure and reality. It serves Levinas’ hermeneutic secularization of messianic future-time through the succession of generations. Interestingly, eros unfolds “phenomenologically” in much the same way as did the proto-experience of the “there is” (il y a). That is, it unfolds in a darkness overlooked by phenomenologies that rely on light and the universal evidence that light enables (TI: 256). There would consequently be a neglected underside to the phenomenological account of object-constitution, which precedes and accompanies intentionality’s encounter with objects. And that requires hermeneutics.
Like Fagenblat, scholars from David Banon to Marc-Alain Ouaknin have explored the hermeneutic dimension of Levinas’ thought, even beyond his Talmudic readings that delve into the many-voiced debates between the rabbis of the Mishna and the Gemara (the oldest and subsequent transcriptions of Jewish oral traditions; Banon 1987). Indeed, as Ouaknin points out, in the case of Talmudic and Biblical hermeneutics, Levinas always considered the eminence of a book—what defines it as “the Book”—to be less its themes than its structure. Levinas focuses “on the structure of the Book of books inasmuch as it allows for exegesis [hermeneutics], and on its unique status of containing more than it contains”. Hermeneutics is thus engendered by excesses of potential meaning over senses already printed on the page, or even discerned by the reception traditions of the work. It would thus be the specific architecture of the book that conditions its reception. Moreover, the parallelisms that we have seen—between the Saying and the Said and between temporal diachrony and synchrony—are also found at the literary level in Biblical and Talmudic texts, with their openness to ongoing interpretation. Levinas even equates “revelation” with the call of the text to each reader or listener, who thereby becomes responsible for its interpretation. “The Revelation as calling to the unique within me is the significance particular to the signifying of the Revelation” of the text, which is understood as dialogical to its core. Here we see the structural analogy between the call of the other and my response that begins as Saying, as opening to words addressed. Levinas adds,
the totality of the true is constituted from the contribution of multiple people, the uniqueness of each act of listening carrying the secret of the text; the voice of the Revelation, as inflected … by each person’s ear, would be necessary to the ‘Whole’ of the truth. (BTV: 133–134)
Hermeneutic truth here becomes the responsibility of an open community, as much as an invitation to participation extended to each possible listener. That is why Levinas could urge that Scripture be understood as a call to respond as readily as could proximity, substitution, and responsibility, all of which similarly express the ethical investiture that results in words offered.
Levinas’ hermeneutics might nevertheless be deemed immanent, concerning one book and one community. Although commentators like Batnitzky find in Levinas a project for a modern politics, and thus for universality, others are skeptical about her claim. Trigano objects that Levinas’ ethics unfolds out of a sort of non-site, starting with the category of the singular. “For Levinas”, he argues,
it is ethically imperative to think the singular in order that the horizon of the other person arise. The universal is, in effect, a dangerous game that can lead to totality and to the negation of the other person. To decide in favor of the singular is to avoid such a development
and with it, a politics (Trigano 2002: 173). In short, the original hermeneutic turn that Levinas gives to Husserlian and Heideggerian phenomenologies has left commentators with questions about the relationship between an immanent hermeneutics and one concerned with politics as the sphere of the universal. These questions imply discussions about politics in our time from which Levinas would have refrained in his time, in the wake of the Shoah, when politics seemed less important than questions of the survival and future of Jewish communities. Yet this apparent absence of politics explains why Michel Haar (1991: 530) asked of Levinas whether his ethics could really unfold outside any site, outside any positive reciprocity, and outside all objectivation (cited by Trigano 2002: 175, note 79). Indeed, Trigano criticizes Levinas, urging that the dialectical relationship between singular experience and universal meaning (and institutions) implies that philosophy should have a minimal relationship to politics,
which is the very field in which the disjunction between the universal and the singular … is established, and this disjunction—so far as it is at once the separation of the same and the other and [yet] also the path of their alliance … is the very condition of possibility of the other. (Trigano 2002: 176)
On Trigano’s account, it follows that Levinas’ hermeneutics only partly responded to Jews’ post-war need for the universalization of their experience, at a human level encompassing both theory and politics (Trigano 2002: 176). This does not contradict Batnitzky’s reading, which considers Levinas’ œuvre as a whole. But it can certainly be argued that universalization in Levinas’ ethics remains largely formal. On this question turns the important matter of what it means to develop a Jewish philosophy. And it is fair to say that
the universal, the neo-Kantian ethicization of Judaism emerged in ruins from the Shoah, the more so that the essential question of political philosophy today is that of the place of the singular within the political universal. (Trigano 2002: 177)
If we accept this claim, then any comparison between Levinas and a pre-Shoah Jewish thinker goes only part way toward addressing the problem of Jewish hermeneutic philosophy today.
2.4.5 The Third Party, Illeity, and Politics
Jacques Derrida once called Totality and Infinity a “treatise on hospitality” (1997 [1999: 21]). As we have seen, Levinas’ 1961 work approached being as war or a conflict of wills that persist in their existence like the philosophical tradition’s concept of conatus essendi (the will to persist in being). Neutral existence or the there-is (il y a) denoted indeterminate nocturnal being, which gives way to the diurnal being called “the elemental” (sunlight, winds, rain). As noted, being in Levinas thus entails both dynamic forces and a conception of natural processes and causality. However, hospitality, also called “metaphysical desire” (TI: 33), cannot be grounded on such forces, much less on a conception of the will as based on drives of self-preservation or self-expansion. And, because hospitality is elicited by the other—and is non-reciprocal—it does not presuppose an original social exchange, much less moral sentiments or innate emotive capacities for empathy or compassion. If it did, there would be no question of escaping a so-called natural order of existence. That is why Levinas—aware that the concept of nature has a debated history—characterizes both our response to the other and, in 1974, proximity, as “pre-natural signification” (OBBE: 68). He explains,
[i]n renouncing intentionality as a guiding thread toward the eidos [formal structure] of the psyche … our analysis will follow sensibility in its pre-natural signification to the maternal, where, in proximity [to what is not itself], signification signifies before it gets bent into perseverance in being in the midst of a Nature. (OBBE: 68, emph. added)
In order to clarify this, Levinas had to develop further concepts. In 1961, he referred to our desire for the other as “religion” (“the bond … established between the same and the other” that does not totalize) and as “transascendence”. “Transcendence, like desire and inadequation, is necessarily a transascendence” (respectively TI: 41, 35). By 1974, Levinas calls “illeity” the value and dignity of responding to another person. He defines illeity as
a neologism formed with il (he) or ille, [whereby alterity] indicates a way of concerning me without entering into conjunction with me. (OBBE: 12; also 13–16, 147–162)
Beyond the concept of the third party introduced in Totality and Infinity, “illeity” also refers to something absolute, even divine, in the other. We can see here how our responsibility to the other person thus almost stands in the place of our responsibility to God, which, as we have seen, is an important hermeneutic dimension of Judaism.
The question remains, as it did already in Totality and Infinity: How do responsibility and transcendence thereupon enter into the ongoing flow of time and the totality of being? And how does an investiture of this affective intensity pass into rationality? As in the 1961 work, we find in 1974 that the “third party”—denoting both other people and the reprise of intentionality—similarly “looks at me through the eyes of the other” (TI: 213). Here too the passage to reason, social existence, and objective time occurs because the temporal lapse called “diachrony” is invariably reabsorbed by intentional consciousness. On this point, Levinas accords Husserl his argument that affects are always on the verge of becoming intentional (Hua 10: Appendix 12). The responsibility and fraternity, which are now formulated as the unfathomable other-in-the-same, still leave a trace in social relations. And, faithful to his 1961 project, the trace is not framed as metaphysical. It is found, rather, in our concern for restorative justice, even for modest equity. This concern for justice does not erase the Hobbesian or Machiavellian nature of human drives. In 1974, however, the difficulty of holding together the passive temporality (which Levinas likens to ageing, [OBBE: 54]) with the flowing time of intentional consciousness and social rationality, has become more obvious. Levinas inquires, “Does a face abide in representation and in proximity; is it community and difference?” (OBBE: 154, emph. added). Undecidable, this is a question for us as well:
The third party introduces a contradiction in the saying whose signification before the other until then went in one direction [toward the singular other]. It is of itself the limit of responsibility and the birth of the question: What do I have to do with justice? A question of consciousness. (OBBE: 157)
With the return to a philosophy of consciousness and representation, the indispensable figure of the trace that Levinas has introduced becomes attenuated. As we have seen, to confront eventual skepticism about the trace, he enacts his witness in a literary here and now. His figural performance points not toward another world or to a being different from that discussed by Heidegger, so much as to the intensities and vulnerability of pre-conscious affectivity. Levinas’ writing thus appears to come down to a poetics of the inexpressible. Nevertheless, since he also demands that we reflect on intersubjectivity from a standpoint outside the face-to-face encounter, his work gives us a double task: conceptualization and the as-if of an enacted here-and-now. Still, justice does not only come down to the question “what do I have to do with justice?” It entails an additional explanatory move that Levinas cannot make. This move would have to account for what the other means to the third party, and why third parties insist that “I” also receive just treatment. These are questions requiring a systematic perspective, outside the now-moment in which “I” emerge and enact my witness, affectively invested by alterity (OBBE: 158).
The equalizing situation from which comparison, justice, and normativity can be deduced is beyond Levinas’ immediate concern. Such a situation is that of objective consciousness. This is, for example, the approach adopted by Hegel in the Phenomenology of Spirit, which he calls the “for-us” or the externalist standpoint (Hegel 1807 [1977: §25]). Levinas thus simply marks this standpoint, which is for him a conundrum, saying,
[t]he relationship with the third party is an incessant correction of the asymmetry of proximity in which the face is looked at. There is weighing, thought, objectification … in which my anarchic relationship with illeity [transcendence] is betrayed … There is betrayal of my anarchic relation with illeity, but also a new relationship with it: it is only thanks to God that, as a subject incomparable with the other, I am approached as an other by the others, that is, “for myself”. (OBBE: 158, emph. added)
Would Levinas’ “thanks to God” then stand in the place of Hegel’s “for-us” account?
Commentators differ on the interpretation of the phrase “thanks to God”. In his subsequent use of the expression, Levinas sets these words between quotation marks. Franck interprets the new concept of illeity as denoting the force of proximity and the dignity of my investiture by the other. It is the
He [illeity] in whose trace the Thou or the face that intends and assigns me signifies … [But] the He … does not point toward another world in which the phenomenological and ontological orders would nevertheless prevail … [Rather, as Levinas says,] “it is the … Infinity of the absolutely other, escaping ontology”. (Franck 2008: 109, my trans.)
“Illeity” thus points to an indeterminate place or source, the sheer dignity of the other who faces me, or the other always already motivating my saying. Yet despite this, Levinas sometimes extends illeity to the possibility of my receiving justice from other people. He writes, “thanks to God [Il] … I am approached as an other by the others” (OBBE: 158). But, of course, even if universal justice is “thanks to God”, this God is not part of being (OBBE: 162)—a claim familiar to both negative theology and to Maimonides’ ultimate approach to God through human action. Levinas is fully aware of the paradox he introduces into “illeity”. And he clearly knows the theological reversion to praxis that Maimonides proposes at the end of his Guide of the Perplexed: “The only positive knowledge of God of which man is capable is knowledge of the attributes of action” (Fagenblat 2010: 113). As Levinas puts it, “to know God is to know what must be done” (DF: 17). It is not to know some being or even to erect a regulative idea. The dignity and force of illeity thus share an important connection with what we might call our enacting God through responsibility to the other or through justice. Another word for this is “holiness”, whether this comes from me in the form of the Saying or from the others as justice toward me.
Here lies the point at which a reading begins that bridges the philosophical and the religious—above all the Talmudic—dimensions of Levinas’ thought. Indeed, as he put it in his 1966 article “Infinity” (AT: 53–76):
An entire strain of contemporary philosophy, setting out from the irreducibility of the interpersonal to relations of objectivity, thematization, and knowledge, is situated in the religious tradition of the idea of the infinite … even when it expresses itself in a deliberately and rigorously atheistic way. (AT: 76, emph. added)
That suggests that whether we approach it atheistically or religiously, the tension between interpersonal relations and objectivity implies the third party and by extension a social relationality which is indissociable from justice and politics. But it is not clear that Levinas ever decided whether politics implied above all war or the means toward a peaceable State. In his late essay “Peace and Proximity” (1984; col-BPW: 161–169), Levinas expressed an attitude surprisingly favorable to the idea of the politics which, when the State is a liberal one, evinces palpable aspects of the trace of responsibility in its policies.
It is not without importance to know—and this is perhaps the European experience of the twentieth century—whether the egalitarian and just State [and its politics] in which the European is fulfilled … proceeds from a war of all against all—or from the irreducible responsibility of the one for the other. (In Rolland, ed. 1984, 346, my trans.)
Of course, the notion of a just politics has meant different things according to the form the State takes, whether totalitarian, authoritarian, or liberal. Given his evocations of a pluralist or multilayered existence in Totality and Infinity (TI: 19, 80, 306), Levinas’ argument that justice is marked by the trace of responsibility seems to accord relatively well with liberal theories of political justice and sovereignty. As is well known, Anglo-American theorists of sovereignty and politics emphasize that individuals live in multiple social associations, which impose a host of responsibilities on them. A pluralistic socio-political existence diminishes the emphasis on sovereignty as concentrated in the State alone. Be that as it may, Levinas’ notion of a trace of responsibility within justice does not explain how other people, not just I, can be said to be ethically “invested” by responsibility. That I receive justice from them thus remains “thanks to God”. Moreover, what is true of ethical systems may well be true of political ones. That is, following his comprehensive comparison of Levinas’ philosophy with contemporary theories of ethics, Morgan admits:
I do not think that Levinas would favor any particular moral system—say, some form of Kantian morality or of consequentialism, insofar as it is a system. (2007: 456, emph. added)
This may be true of any form of political regime as well, because for Levinas politics attempts to forge systems—as he says, to totalize (TI: 15, 21, 292–305). We have seen above Rose’s neo-Hegelian objection that Levinas’ ethics lacks mediations sufficient to have real implications for politics (§2.3.4). Recently, Salanskis has nevertheless proposed a surprising “mediation”, found in Judaism itself, arguing that the latter provides an “idealist horizon liable to interest all of humanity”, because it ties this horizon narratively “to a practical and intellectual testing ‘laboratory’, that of the life of a people” (Salanskis 2016: 129, note 68). This claim suggests that there is a proto-political project in Biblical and Talmudic Judaism, though Salanskis leaves unexplored the further implications of his “laboratory”. As to the political implications of the Talmud’s pluralism of rabbinic voices, which is part of Salanskis’ laboratory, Levinas does at times emphasize the importance of Jewish thought entering into “universal history”, even while promoting responsibility for others and the ethics of messianic awaiting (DF: 96). For example, in his Talmudic reading entitled “Messianic Texts” (1962), he justifies the creation of a Jewish State on the basis of the possibility of protecting both messianic patience and a Talmudic education to responsibility, despite the violence implied by Israel becoming one State among others, within universal and secular history (also see Morgan 2016: 256–265, responding to Kavka 2015).
Let us focus for a moment more directly on this question of justice in Jewish thought. Insofar as we can speak of one Jewish philosophical tradition, notably a modern one, the question of justice forms the core of its approach to the prophetic message. In that respect it would certainly have a political dimension; or, at the least, a social-existential one. It may be that to answer the question of the politics (in the minimal sense of State policies) liable to emerge from Levinas’ ethics requires that we pay close attention to his philosophical anthropology, i.e., to his conception of the human condition or what it means to be a human being. Recently, Sarah Hammerschlag has returned to Levinas’ captivity notebooks in which he jotted his wartime insights into Judaism as he lived it then:
J. [might be compared to] a splinter in the flesh. One might live without it, but if one didn’t have [this source of suffering], my life [would be deprived] of its acuity … or fallen back into infancy. (LO1: 172, my trans.)
This conception of a Jewish “anthropology” corresponds not to particular Jews, but to our human condition when we understand it as a condition largely received, passively and without our explicit choice. As Hammerschlag and Fagenblat have urged, this human pathos, consistent with a pluralistic ontology, might well be approached as an existential category (Hammerschlag 2012: 389–419). This too is why Levinas characterized Judaism as “an understanding of being”, rather than as a religion. Yet this category may surprise us if we overlook the fact that a definitive part of our existence does comes from without, i.e., through the internalization of the life of our community, its founding texts, but also through social and political characterizations of us (antisemitism, racism, sexism).
Approached as unbidden passivity, of course, the existential category called Judaism raises the question of other passive ascriptions and their implications for the question of what it means to be a human being. If, by 1974, politics and the third party are largely synonyms for “humanity” for Levinas, then we must conclude that politics has, by extension, become more for him than the conflict and strife he described in his preface to Totality and Infinity (TI: 21–25). Politics would have to take seriously a pluralistic humanism, as well as the condition of passive ascriptions including racism. The implication is that one may sometimes have a choice, in one’s actions, about whether politics is indeed a war of all against all or the site in which traces of justice toward the other can be demanded. However that may be, some commentators have raised the concern that “humanity” for Levinas looks basically like Husserl’s rationalist ideal of humanity (Husserl 1954 [1970: 275], cited by McGettigan 2006: 16). This would be the humanity of Europe, and beneath that, one flowing out of the intertwined voices of “Athens” and “Jerusalem”. To be sure, the Biblical prophets demanded justice (and repentance) from their wayward communities. But political justice requires a public space, an agora in which the agorein (public speaking) gives rise to categories of thought (kat’agorein means to accuse publicly).
This dual preoccupation with justice as rectitude, and justice as civic virtue, seems to suggest that together Athens and Jerusalem give us a comprehensive approach to politics, as both practice and ideal. Drabinski and Fred Moten have questioned this universality (Drabinski 2011: 165–196), and with it the category of “being-Jewish”, in favor of an emphasis on the passivity intrinsic to a multiplicity of human situations, including race, ethnicity, and gender. Moreover, as Moten cautions, passivity can be readily observed in our relations to things rather than persons. He thus adds that the Bible and the Greeks, although often presented as “the whole world”, thereby become a teleological reflection that expresses an unacknowledged European malaise, wherein the non-European receives the status of a mere object (Moten 2018: 9, 11). Attributing this to the transcendence toward-the-world of phenomenological intentionality, which shares some of the blind spots of the colonial enterprise, Moten discusses the object-like passivity of being on the receiving end of multiple racisms, including Levinas’ own “unintended racism”. If we take his concern seriously, then passivity as a category of being-human strains against being attributed to Jews alone. In turn, this raises the philosophical-anthropological question of situational passivities, the very idea of humanity, and those “beings” that inhabit worlds unacknowledged by the European tradition (Moten 2018: 17). While this is a critique of Levinas, Moten also invites us to expand the latter’s anthropological category of being-Jewish, and to ask ourselves what kind of politics might flow out of such an expansion.
2.5 Essays and Interviews after Otherwise than Being: The Tension between Ethics and Justice
Subsequent to Otherwise than Being,Levinas’ works return to and refine his major themes. These works include Transcendence and Intelligibility (1984), In the Time of the Nations (1988), Entre Nous (1991), and Alterity and Transcendence (1995), all of which are collections of essays from various periods between 1951 and 1989. However, the first of these collections to appear, entitled Of God Who Comes to Mind (1982), contains the important essay “God and Philosophy” (1975; OGCM: 55–78), which is a critical confrontation with the God of Descartes and Malebranche, and a subtle debate with Heidegger. This essay is followed by the transcript of a two-hour discussion with professors from the University of Leyden (OGCM: 79–99), in which social problems infrequently addressed by Levinas are raised. Despite the wide temporal gamut run by these publications, we find few new developments, other than a clearer resolve to address the ambiguity intrinsic to the signifier “God” (OGCM: §§10–13, 17–19), and the verbal dynamics of being (corresponding to Heidegger’s Wesen), henceforth characterized by Levinas’ neologism “essance” (OGCM: 43–51).
However, Franck has detected a profound divergence in these new developments. In a highly sophisticated reading of the essays and interviews written or given after Otherwise than Being, he notes that the tension between the two aforementioned conceptions of justice (that of 1961 and that of 1974) has come to look like an epistemological inconsistency. This inconsistency is due to Levinas’ later choice to hold justice and (empirical) social life at a significant distance from each other. Indeed, by progressively aligning justice with transcendence, Levinas runs into an important difficulty after 1974. That is, either justice belongs to responsibility from the outset (1961), whereupon the “third party” refers simply to the tendency of intentional consciousness to reconnect any sensuous gaps in itself, or responsibility and transcendence firstly require justice in order to be pondered and communicated. In other words, for Franck, either justice and responsibility are co-originary, in which case responsibility cannot leave a trace in justice and being, or responsibility itself presupposes justice, a constituted world, and linguistic concepts. In the first case, that of aligning responsibility and justice, the third party would simply denote everyday consciousness (TI). In the second case, justice would in fact gravitate toward illeity, the “He-ness” of the absent God (OBBE and after). Once again, in the first case and in terms of lived time, the third party is indeed largely simultaneous with the other, given our social life and context. As Franck explains, we clearly live in society and any phenomenological description must operate within reflection, which is also the domain called the third party. But in the second case, if we hold the third party close to illeity, then the question why I receive justice “for myself” from others can only be answered quasi-theologically, as “thanks to God”. Yet this second option shifts our attention from justice within social life toward the enigma posed by the fact that I do receive justice from others thanks to some near-miraculous concern of theirs for me. But then, should justice for all refer to our social and legal contexts or rather to an absolute called illeity? Mobilizing extensive arguments, Franck shows that this difficulty comes into a crude light in the late works. And indeed, if the later Levinas chooses to hold these two conceptions together, then justice is both social and in some sense divine, like a godly justice or a theopolitics (Franck 2008: 239). If it is the latter, then Levinas’ hermeneutics of an ethical “otherwise than being” just amounts to an abstraction rooted essentially in theology.
As if anticipating Franck’s strong, structural critique, Levinas staked out a surprising claim for the social simultaneity of the other and the third party in a 1982 interview entitled “Philosophy, Justice, and Love” (EN: 103–122). He there argues,
I do not live in a world where there is but one ‘first come’. There is always a third [party] in the world; he too is my other, my neighbor. Consequently, it matters to me to know which of the two passes first: is the one not the persecutor of the other? Must men, [although understood] as incomparable, not be compared? Justice is thus prior here to taking the other’s fortunes upon oneself. (EN: 103–104, emph. added)
The supposed priority of the other would thus depend on one’s approach, which can be ethical or socio-juridical. Indeed, the problem of priority is further complicated by the fact that, as early as 1974, Levinas cited Isaiah 57:19, deliberately inverting the order of the terms, “neighbor” and “the one far away”. He thus writes, “Peace to the neighbor and to the distant one” (OBBE: 157). Eleven years later, he corrects his citation in an interview entitled “On Jewish Philosophy” (1985; ITN: 167–183): “‘Peace, peace, to him that is far off and to him that is near’, says the Eternal”. And he adds,
Outside the one who is near … he who is far off compels recognition. Outside the other there is the third party. He is also an other, also a neighbor. But which is the closest proximity? […] There must be knowledge of such things! (ITN: 172, emph. added)
As a critical reader of Levinas, Franck appears to be the only commentator who has raised Levinas’ later remarks to the status of epistemological inconsistency. Franck argues cogently that if we must be able to determine whether the third party is also an other, or a persecutor of others, or a criminal, then justice must precede responsibility, rather than the reverse. That is, rather than responsibility grounding justice thanks to the trace it leaves within justice, the latter must have priority (2008, 240–242). Franck’s objection has important implications for the relationship between ethics and politics in Levinas. We live in human society, and we cannot escape that, he says. But does this not imply that it is impossible to set justice decisively outside politics, and as if outside ontology, as Levinas’ later work seems to do? That also means that we can never separate the sincerity that Levinas calls “the Saying” (or le dire) from the very words (le dit) that express and describe it. We therefore need words, and intentionality, to make what Levinas characterized as the pre-thematic into a theme (OBBE: 99). We even need words to stabilize the affect called sincerity or the Saying. Failing words, sincerity and with it proximity are simply abstractions, philosophical constructions. There is nothing wrong per se with such philosophical constructs, if that is what these concepts are. It is illegitimate, however, to argue that they precede intentional consciousness and even reflection.
Now, given Otherwise than Being’s rapprochement between the third party and illeity, must the third party not admit two distinct, even irreconcilable senses? The 1961 sense would still refer to social existence and the moderation of responsibility, while the 1974 sense would henceforth point to a radically absent Il, also called “God”. This too has consequences for the question of justice—i.e., whether it is primary to Levinas’ existential ethics, or secondary and largely derivative from responsibility. As we know, the Jewish tradition, and others as well, holds the judge responsible for fair decisions; this specialist of laws is also a member of the community and must obey the Law he adjudicates. This is more than simply a platitude; the judge’s dual status casts light on the competing priorities of responsibility versus justice. To explain his positions Levinas recurs to Psalm 82: “God stands in the divine assembly, among the divine beings. He pronounces judgment”. In other words, only if illeity refers to a transcendent absolute, viz., “God in the divine assembly”, can the third party (understood as the others or society) be raised above an everyday social function and confer on justice something like a regulative idea able to preserve a trace of transcendence.
Levinas’ reference to Psalm 82 is less surprising than we might suppose. Echoing Carl Schmitt’s Political Theology, Fagenblat points out, firstly, that all the important concepts in modern statehood theory are secularized religious ideas. But, secondly, the secularization process does not stop with statehood theory, “a similar phenomenon applies to secular moral concepts” (Fagenblat 2010: xi, emph. added). In short, “God” is the crucial name for an absolute, indispensable to justice understood as an ongoing project. To be sure, for Franck, the reference to a “God” who judges is less a problem of secularization than a reason why it is impossible to argue for the priority of responsibility over justice. And this is true whether the priority is defined as ontological or practical. But Franck fails to acknowledge that Levinas is aware of this tension. In “Philosophy, Justice, and Love”, Levinas draws a complex portrait of the third party as “God” based on a new, and crucial, distinction between the meaning of “God” as Elohim and “God” as the Tetragrammaton (YHWH; EN: 108). In the rabbinic tradition, Elohim, God of justice, first created the world. That world did not survive by itself; that is, without the “supplement” provided by YHWH, the God of mercy. Hence, the necessity of a second creation where justice was more than equal treatment.
Given the mythic alignment of Elohim with justice, and YHWH with mercifulness, Levinas argues that illeity has two possible modalizations: justice or equity; mercy or compassion. The priority of one God thus depends on the perspective we adopt: justice would belong to ontology, compassion to an ethical perspective. For Fagenblat, the ethical priority emerges as the possibility of creating and safeguarding meaning—by extension, as creation tout court (2010: 44–53). That is, in Biblical symbolism, when read in the rabbinic tradition, a world created first on justice (as equality and comparison) does not survive, because demands for equality (and with them, for blind justice) are unceasing and do not admit an outside or transcendent term allowing for considerations beyond bilateral comparison. It is the transcendent term, the outside as it were, that motivates justice to strive asymptotically towards an idea. That is why Levinas observes that being human implies that we are certainly born into a social world, a world of many others and third parties. But we are sustained, and individuated, by mercy. Moreover, mercy represents, for justice, the trace of responsibility. This becomes clear only when one reads Levinas’ philosophy together with his Talmudic texts.
For this and other reasons, the all-important question of the priority of responsibility as against justice must be approached as a complex one, in part dependent on lived circumstances. From the “metaphysical” perspective that Levinas defined as desire for the other in Totality and Infinity (TI: 39), responsibility and proximity come first (EN: 107–108). From the perspective of practice and our living-in-society, justice stands closer to ethics and may sometimes precede it. Gérard Bensussan has pondered this question in light of the Christian tradition in the West, for which Judaism already represents an alterity—in text and in act; for example, when the Passover seder re-enacts the escape from enslavement in Egypt, it ritually recalls: “strangers we were, and thus, strangers we are”, even now (Bensussan 2008: 78). A more rigorously philosophical reckoning may require that the relationship between the two perspectives, justice and mercy, be further clarified. Be that as it may, this is one point on which the Jewish writings of Levinas enrich, even ground, his philosophical arguments.
3. Concluding Remarks
Commentators have differed on the comparative importance of Levinas’ major works, Totality and Infinity and Otherwise than Being. Some have urged that we see in them two sides of a single coin: that of responsibility experienced in the face-to-face encounter and that of the insistence of an affective trace that interrupts flowing time as conceived by classical phenomenology (Peperzak 1993: 7). Other commentators have argued that Otherwise than Being is Levinas’ magnum opus, a study on the intersubjective pre-conditions of language indebted to, yet diverging from, Heidegger’s investigations of the poetic logos (in which man dwells and being is intimated; Heidegger he-EHP: 59–64). As we have seen, Derrida called Totality and Infinity a “treatise on hospitality” (see §2.4.1 above) and devoted, in sum, more attention to it than to Otherwise than Being, although the latter work was in part a response to Derrida’s criticisms in “Violence and Metaphysics” (Derrida 1964 ). There is little question that the novelty of Otherwise than Being lies in its three innovations: (1) the analyses and tropes for transcendence-in-immanence (recurrence, proximity, obsession, persecution, and substitution); (2) the deconstruction of language understood as the site in which existence is said and explained, and (3) Levinas’ “wager” of stepping out of philosophical reasoning into a performative register that both “says” and “unsays” itself by turns (OBBE: 167).
Despite these innovations, Levinas’ philosophical project remains largely constant: to rethink the meaning of existence in terms of the ethical transcendence of the other. To that end, he consistently revisited Husserl’s phenomenological method. He reconceived Heidegger’s ontological difference as an irreducible separation between being and the good we enact. He had extensive, often undeclared recourse to the profound, anti-totalizing intuitions of religious life found in Franz Rosenzweig’s new thinking. By reason of his opposition to systems-thought, Levinas never adhered uncritically to any one philosophy.
A common thread runs through his philosophy and his Talmudic readings. Transcendence is one of his words for the spontaneity of responsibility for another person. Responsibility is experienced in concrete life and is variously expressed, from words like “here I am” to apologies and self-accounting. This is the case, Levinas argues, even before a de facto command is heard or reflected on. This surprising proposition hearkens to the debated meaning of Jews “receiving the Torah before knowing what was written in it” (NTR: 42–43). Levinas names this responsiveness Platonically the “Good beyond being”. We perform that good, that trace of the infinite, because instances of answering to or for another are everyday events, though they may not appear typical of natural or self-interested behaviors. Above all, we do not choose to be responsible. Responsibility arises as if elicited, before we begin to think about it, by the approach of the other person. Because this theme is found in his philosophy as well as in his interpretations of Talmudic passages, Levinas’ thought has, at times, left both Talmud scholars and philosophers dissatisfied. For some Talmudists, his thought seems secularly humanistic, with “infinity” suggesting a clandestine concept of divinity. No stranger to Mishna and Gemara (Talmud), his interpretations are less preoccupied with traditional inter- and intra-textuality, than with the ethical content of the teachings therein. To philosophers skeptical of him, Levinas’ thought reinterprets Heidegger’s hermeneutic circle of facticity in a metaphysical vein. Indeed, its anti-foundationalist approach to responsibility, as the pre-reflective structure of the embodied, intersubjective “self” (soi), appears to these critics to lie between phenomenology and religious thought, even if it lacks specific dogmatic commitments. As we have seen, in his later philosophy, the seemingly metaphysical concept of illeity expresses my emotive experience of a “power” or an affective excess greater than I can contain. In this way, it also resembles Descartes’ “light so resplendent” (Descartes 1641 , Meditation V). But it is precisely in these tensions, between the Jewish religious and philosophical traditions, on the one hand, and his phenomenological-existential thinking-of-the-other, on the other hand, that Levinas’ originality lies.
Cited Works by Levinas
- 1930, “La Théorie de l’intuition
dans la Phénoménologie de Husserl”, Doctoral
dissertation, published, 1963, Paris: J. Vrin.
- [TOI] The Theory of Intuition in Husserl’s Phenomenology, André Orianne (trans.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1975; second edition, 1995.
- 1934, “Quelques réflexions sur la
philosophie de l’hitlérisme”, Esprit,
November, 199–208. Reprinted 1997, Miguel Abensour (ed.), Paris:
[Levinas 1934 available online]
- [RPH] “Reflections on the Philosophy of Hitlerism”, Seán Hand (trans.), Critical Inquiry, 1990, 17(1): 63–71. doi:10.1086/448574
- 1935, De l’évasion, Notes by
Jacques Rolland, Montpellier: Fata Morgana, 1982.
- [OE] On Escape / De l’évasion, Bettina Bergo (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2003.
- 1947, De l’existence à
l’existant, second edition, Paris: Vrin, 1986.
- [EE] Existence and Existents, Alphonso Lingis (trans.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1978.
- 1947, “Le temps et l’autre”, in
Le choix, le monde, l’existence, Jean Wahl (ed.),
Grenoble: Arthaud. Reprinted Montpellier: Fata Morgana, 1979.
- [TO] Time and the Other, Richard A. Cohen (trans.), Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1987.
- [EDE] 1949, En découvrant
l’existence avec Husserl et Heidegger, Reprinted with new
essays. Paris: Vrin, 1982.
- [DEH] Discovering Existence with Husserl, Richard A. Cohen and Michael B. Smith (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1998.
- 1961, Totalité et Infini: Essais sur
l’Extériorité, Phænomenologica 8. The
Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
- [TI] Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority, Alphonso Lingis (trans.), Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1969.
- 1963, Difficile liberté: Essais sur le
judaïsme, Third Edition revised. Paris: Éditions
Albin Michel, 1976.
- [DF] Difficult Freedom: Essays on Judaism, Seán Hand (trans.), London: Athlone, 1991.
- 1968, Quatre lectures talmudiques, Paris: Les Éditions de Minuit.
- 1977, Du sacré au saint: cinq nouvelles
lectures talmudiques. Paris: Les Éditions de Minuit.
- [NTR] Nine Talmudic Readings, Annette Aronowicz (trans.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990. This translation regroups readings between 1968 and 1977.
- 1974, Autrement qu’être ou
au-delà de l’essence, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
- [OBBE] Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence, Alphonso Lingis (trans.), (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1978).
- 1982, L’au-delà du verset: lectures
et discours talmudiques, Paris: Éditions de Minuit.
- [BTV] Beyond the Verse: Talmudic Readings and Lectures, Gary D. Mole (trans.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
- 1982, De Dieu qui vient à
l’idée, Second edition corrected and enlarged.
Paris: Vrin, 1986.
- [OGCM] Of God Who Comes To Mind, Bettina Bergo (trans.), Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1998.
- 1982, Éthique et infini: Dialogues avec
Philippe Nemo, Paris: France Culture Radio broadcast, 1982.
Paris: Livre de Poche, 1982.
- [EI] Ethics and Infinity: Conversations with Philippe Nemo, Richard A. Cohen (trans.), Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1985.
- [TeI] 1984, Transcendance et
intelligibilité, Geneva: Éditions Labor et Fides.
- “Transcendence and Intelligibility”, in col-BPW: 149–160.
- 1988, À l’heure des nations,
Paris: Les Éditions de Minuit.
- [ITN] In the Time of the Nations, Michael B. Smith (trans.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
- 1993, Entre Nous: Essais sur le
penser-à-l’autre, Paris: Éditions Bernard
Grasset, Collection Figures.
- [EN] Entre Nous: On Thinking-of-the-Other, Barbara Harshav and Michael B. Smith (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 2000.
- 1995, Altérité et
transcendance, Montpellier: Fata Morgana.
- [AT] Alterity and Transcendence, Michael B. Smith (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 1999.
- [LO1] 2009a, Œuvres 1: Carnets de Captivité et Autres Écrits, Rodolphe Calin and Catherine Chalier (eds.), Paris: Bernard Grasset.
- [LO2] 2009b, Œuvres 2: Parole et Silence et Autres Conférences Inédites Au Collège Philosophique, Rodolphe Calin (ed.), Paris: Bernard Grasset.
Other Works by Levinas
Other Philosophical Works by Levinas
- 1976, Sur Maurice Blanchot, Montpellier: Fata Morgana. Translated in Proper Names, Michael B. Smith (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1997.
- 2013, Levinas Œuvres III: Éros, littérature et philosophie, Jean-Luc Nancy et Danielle Cohen-Levinas (eds.), Paris: Grasset.
Collections of Philosophical Essays and Lectures
- 1972, Humanisme de l’autre homme, Montpellier: Fata
- 2003, Humanism of the Other, Nidra Poller (trans.), introduction by Richard A. Cohen, Urbana, IL: Illinois University Press.
- 1976, “Jean Wahl sans avoir ni être” in Xavier Tilliette and Paul Ricœur (eds and co-authors), Jean Wahl et Gabriel Marcel, Paris: Beauchesne.
- 1976, Noms propres: Agnon, Buber, Celan, Delhomme, Derrida,
Jabès, Kierkegaard, Lacroix, Laporte, Picard, Proust, Van
Breda, Wahl. Montpellier: Fata Morgana.
- 1997, Proper Names, Michael B. Smith (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
- 1987, Hors sujet, Montpellier: Fata Morgana.
- 1993, Outside the Subject, Michael B. Smith (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
- 1990, De l’oblitération: Entretien avec
Françoise Armengaud, Paris: Éditions de la
Différence. Republished in 1998.
- 2019, On Obliteration: An Interview with Françoise Armengaud Concerning the Work of Sacha Sosno, Richard A. Cohen (trans.), Zurich: Diaphanes.
- 1991, La mort et le temps, Jacques Rolland (ed.), Paris: Éditions de l’Herne. Lectures presented 1975–76.
- 1993, Dieu, la mort et le temps, Jacques Rolland (ed. and
notes), Paris: Éditions Bernard Grasset.
- 2000, God, Death, and Time, Bettina Bergo (trans.), preface by Jacques Rolland, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
- 1994, Les imprévus de l’histoire, preface by
Pierre Hayat, Montpellier: Fata Morgana.
- 2003, Unforeseen History, Nidra Poller (trans.), introduction by Richard A. Cohen, foreword by Don Ihde, Urbana, IL: Illinois University Press.
- 1994, Liberté et commandement, preface by Pierre Hayat, Montpellier: Fata Morgana.
- 1998, Éthique comme philosophie première, Jacques Rolland (ed.), Paris: Rivages.
Other Talmudic Writings and Studies on Judaism by Levinas
- 1995, Nouvelles lectures talmudiques, Paris: Les
Éditions de Minuit.
- 1999, New Talmudic Readings, Richard A. Cohen (trans.), Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne Press.
Other Collections of Works by Levinas in English
- 1989, The Levinas Reader: Emmanuel Levinas, Seán Hand (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
- 1987, Collected Philosophical Papers of Emmanuel Levinas, Alphonso Lingis (trans.), (Phænomenologica 100), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
- [col-BPW] 1996, Emmanuel Levinas: Basic Philosophical Writings, Adriaan Peperzak, Simon Critchley, and Robert Bernasconi (eds.), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- 2001, Is it Righteous to Be? Interviews with Emmanuel Levinas, Jill Robbins (ed.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
Bibliographies and Concordance
- Burggraeve, Roger, 1990, Emmanuel Levinas: Une bibliographie primaire et secondaire, Leuven: Éditions Peeters. (A comprehensive bibliography of works on Levinas from 1929 to 1989 in several languages.)
- Ciocan, Cristian and Georges Hansel (eds.), 2005, Levinas Concordance, Berlin/Heidelberg: Springer-Verlag. doi:10.1007/1-4020-4125-X
- Nordquist, Joan, 1997, Emmanuel Levinas: A Bibliography, Santa Cruz, CA: Reference and Research Services.
Articles and Books
- Aeschlimann, Jean-Christophe, 1989, Répondre d’autrui. Emmanuel Lévinas, Boudry- Neuchâtel: Les Éditions de la Baconnière.
- Ajzenstat, Oona, 2001, Driven back to the Text: the Premodern Sources of Levinas’s Postmodernism, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Alford, C. Fred, 2002, Levinas, the Frankfurt School and Psychoanalysis, Middletown, CT: Wesleyan University Press.
- Allen, Sarah, 2009, The Philosophical Sense of Transcendence: Levinas and Plato on Loving beyond Being, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, second revised edition, Terence Irwin (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
- Arnett, Ronald C., 2017, Levinas’s Rhetorical Demand: The Unending Obligation of Communication Ethics, Carbondale, IL: Southern Illinois University Press.
- Atterton, Peter, Matthew Calarco, and Maurice Friedman (eds), 2004, Levinas and Buber: Dialogue and Difference, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Atterton, Peter and Matthew Calarco (eds), 2010, Radicalizing Levinas, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Awerkamp, Don, 1977, Emmanuel Levinas: Ethics and Politics, New York: Revisionist Press.
- Bailhache, Gérard, 1994, Le sujet chez Emmanuel Levinas: fragilité et subjectivité, Paris: Presses de France.
- Banon, David, 1987, La lecture infinie: Les voies de l’interprétation midrachique (préface d’Emmanuel Levinas), Paris: Le Seuil.
- –––, 2008, Entrelacs: La lettre et le sens dans l’exégèse juive, Paris: Éditions du Cerf.
- Batnitzky, Leora, 2006, Leo Strauss and Emmanuel Levinas: Philosophy and the Politics of Revelation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511499050
- Basterra, Gabriela, 2015, The Subject of Freedom: Kant, Levinas, New York: Fordham University Press. doi:10.5422/fordham/9780823265145.001.0001
- Bauman, Zygmunt, 1993, Postmodern Ethics, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
- Benso, Silvia, 2000, The Face of Things: A Different Side of Ethics, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Bensussan, Gérard, 2008, Éthique et expérience: Levinas politique, Strasbourg: La Phocide.
- Bergo, Bettina, 1999, Levinas between Ethics and Politics. For the Beauty that Adorns the Earth, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Bergson, Henri, 1910, Essai sur les données immédiates de la conscience, Paris: Quadrige—Presses universitaires de France, 2011.
- –––, 2013, Time and Free Will: An Essay on the Immediate Data of Consciousness, Oxfordshire: Routledge.
- –––, 1968, Durée et simultanéité: À propos de la théorie d’Einstein, Paris: Quadrige—Presses universitaires de France, 2019.
- –––, 1999, Duration and Simultaneity: Bergson and the Einsteinian Universe, Manchester, UK: Clinamen Press.
- Bernasconi, Robert, 1982, “Levinas Face to Face—with Hegel”, Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology, 13(3): 267–276. doi:10.1080/00071773.1982.11007593
- –––, 1986, “Hegel and Levinas: The Possibility of Reconciliation and Forgiveness”, in Intersoggettività Socialità Religione, Marco M. Olivetti and Antonio Rosmini (eds), (Archivio di Filosofia, 54), Padua: CEDAM, 325–346.
- –––, 1987, “Deconstruction and the Possibility of Ethics”, in Deconstruction and Philosophy, John Sallis (ed.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press: 122–139.
- –––, 1988, “The Silent Anarchic World of the Evil Genius”, in The Collegium Phænomenologicum: The First Ten Years, John C. Sallis, Giuseppina Chiara Moneta, and Jacques Taminiaux (eds.), (Phaenomenologica 105), Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- –––, 2002, “What Is the Question to Which ‘substitution’ Is the Answer?”, in Critchley and Bernasconi 2002: 234–251. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521662060.011
- –––, 1988, “Levinas: Philosophy and Beyond”, in Philosophy and Non-Philosophy Since Merleau-Ponty, Hugh J. Silverman (ed.), (Continental Philosophy, 1), New York: Routledge: 232-258.
- Bernasconi, Robert and David Wood (eds), 1988, The Provocation of Levinas: Rethinking the Other, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
- Bernasconi, Robert and Simon Critchley (eds), 1991, Re-Reading Levinas, (Studies in Continental Thought), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- Bernet, Rudolf, 2002, “Levinas’s Critique of Husserl”, in Critchley and Bernasconi 2002: 82–99. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521662060.004
- Bloechl, Jeffrey, 2000a, Liturgy of the Neighbor: Emmanuel Levinas and the Religion of Responsibility, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2000b, The Face of the Other and the Trace of God. Essays on the Philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas, New York: Fordham University Press.
- Botwinick, Aryeh, 2014, Emmanuel Levinas and the Limits to Ethics: A Critique and a Re-Appropriation, New York: Routledge.
- Brezis, David, 2012, Levinas et le tournant sacrificiel, Paris: Hermann, 2012.
- Broch, Hermann, 2008, Théorie de la folie des masses, Pierre Rusch and Didier Renault (trans.), Paris: Éditions de l’Éclat.
- Burggraeve, Roger, 1985, From Self-Development to Solidarity: An Ethical Reading of Human Desire in its Socio-Political Relevance According to Emmanuel Levinas, Leuven: Centre for Metaphysics and Philosophy of God.
- –––, 1990 , Lévinas over vrede en mensenrechten: met vier essays van Emmanuel Levinas vertaald door Gertrude Schellens, Leuven: Acco. Translated as The Wisdom of Love in the Service of Love: Emmanuel Levinas on Justice, Peace and Human Rights, Jeffrey Bloechl (trans.), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2008, The Awakening to the Other: A Provocative Dialogue with Emmanuel Levinas, Leuven: Peeters.
- Butler, Judith, 2005, Giving an Account of Oneself, New York: Fordham University Press. doi:10.5422/fso/9780823225033.001.0001
- Cahiers d’études lévinassiennes, 2002–2018. Arcueil: Institut d’études lévinassiennes.
- Calin, Rudolphe and François-David Sebbah, 2002, Le vocabulaire de Levinas, Paris: Ellipses.
- Caputo, John D., 1993, Against Ethics: Contributions to a Poetics of Obligation with Constant Reference to Deconstruction, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- Caygill, Howard, 2002, Levinas and the Political, New York: Routledge.
- Cederberg, Carl, 2010, Resaying the Human: Levinas beyond Humanism and Antihumanism, Sodertörn (Sweden): Södertörn University.
- Chalier, Catherine, 1982, Judaïsme et Altérité, Lagrasse: Verdier.
- –––, 1987, La persévérance du mal, Paris: Le Cerf.
- –––, 1993, Lévinas: L’utopie de l’humain, Paris: Éditions Albin Michel.
- –––, 1998 , Pour une morale au-delà du savoir. Kant et Levinas, Paris: Albin Michel. Translated as What Ought I to Do? Morality in Kant and Levinas, Jane Marie Todd (trans.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2002.
- –––, 2002, La trace de l’infini: Emmanuel Levinas et la source hébraïque, Paris: Le Cerf.
- Chalier, Catherine and Miguel Abensour (eds), 1991, Cahier de L’Herne: Emmanuel Lévinas, Paris: Éditions de l’Herne.
- Champagne, Roland A., 1998, The Ethics of Reading According to Emmanuel Lévinas, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
- Chanter, Tina (ed.), 2001a, Feminist Interpretations of Emmanuel Levinas, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
- –––, 2001b, Time, Death and the Feminine: Levinas with Heidegger, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
- Ciaramelli, Fabio, 1989, Transcendance et éthique: essai sur Lévinas, Brussels: Éditions Ousia.
- Coe, Cynthia D., 2018, Levinas and the Trauma of Responsibility: The Ethical Significance of Time, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- Cohen, Hermann, 1915, Der Begriff der Religion im System der Philosophie, Giessen: Alfred Töpelmann.
- Cohen, Richard A. (ed.), 1985, Face to Face with Levinas, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- –––, 1994, Elevations: The Height of the Good in Rosenzweig and Levinas, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- –––, 2001, Ethics, Exegesis and Philosophy: Interpretation after Levinas, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511488238
- ––– (ed.), 2009, “Levinas-Rosenzweig”, Cahiers d’études lévinassiennes, Vol. 8, Arcueil: Institut d’études lévinassiennes.
- –––, 2017, Out of Control: Confrontations between Spinoza and Levinas, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Cohen-Levinas, Danielle (ed.), 1998, Emmanuel Levinas (Rue Descartes 19), Paris: Collège International de Philosophie, Presses Universitaires de France.
- ––– (ed.), 2006, Emmanuel Levinas: pour une philosophie de l’hétéronomie, Paris: Bayard.
- ––– (ed.), 2010, Emmanuel Levinas et le souci de l’art, Paris: Manucius.
- ––– (ed.), 2011, Lire Totalité et Infini, Études et interprétations, Paris: Hermann.
- ––– (ed.), 2015, Une percée de l’humain, suivi d’un texte par Emmanuel Levinas “Être juif”, Paris: Payot/Rivages poche.
- Cohen-Lévinas, Danielle and Marc Crépon (eds.), 2014, Lévinas, Derrida: Lire Ensemble, (Collection “Rue de La Sorbonne”), Paris: Hermann.
- Cohen-Levinas, Danielle and Alexander Schnell (eds.), 2015, Relire “Totalité et infini” d’Emmanuel Levinas, (Problemes & controverses), Paris: Librairie Philosophique Vrin.
- ––– (eds), 2016, Relire Autrement qu’être ou au-delà de l’essence, Paris: Vrin.
- Cohen-Levinas, Danielle and Shmuel Trigano (eds), 2002, Emmanuel Levinas: philosophie et judaïsme, Paris: In Press Éditions.
- ––– (eds), 2007, Emmanuel Levinas et les théologies, Paris: Éditions In Press.
- Craig, Megan, 2010, Levinas and James: Toward a Pragmatic Phenomenology, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- Critchley, Simon, 1992, The Ethics of Deconstruction: Derrida and Levinas, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers. Third Edition 2014, Edinburgh University Library.
- –––, 1999a, Ethics Politics Subjectivity: Essays on Derrida, Levinas and Contemporary French Thought, London: Verso.
- –––, 1999b, “The Original Traumatism: Levinas and Psychoanalysis”, in his Ethics Politics Subjectivity: Essays on Derrida, Levinas and Contemporary French Thought, London: Verso, 183–216.
- –––, 2007, Infinitely Demanding: Ethics of Commitment, Politics of Resistance, London: Verso.
- –––, 2015, The Problem with Levinas, Alexis Dianda (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198738763.001.0001
- Critchley, Simon and Robert Bernasconi (eds.), 2002, The Cambridge Companion to Levinas, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521662060
- Crowell, Steven, 2015, “Why Is Ethics First Philosophy? Levinas in Phenomenological Context: Why Is Ethics First Philosophy?”, European Journal of Philosophy, 23(3): 564–588. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0378.2012.00550.x
- Davis, Colin, 1997, Levinas: An Introduction, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- De Bauw, Christine, 1997, L’envers du sujet: Lire autrement Emmanuel Levinas, Paris: Vrin, Éditions Ousia.
- De Boer, Theodore, 1997, The Rationality of Transcendence: Studies in the Philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas, Amsterdam: J. C. Gieben.
- De Vries, Hent, 1998, “Levinas”, in A Companion to Continental Philosophy, Simon Critchley and William R. Schroeder (eds), Oxford: Blackwell: 245–255.
- –––, 2005, Minimal Theology: Critiques of Secular Reason in Adorno and Levinas, Geoffrey Hale (trans.), Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
- Derrida, Jacques, 1964 , “Violence et métaphysique: essai sur la pensée d’Emmanuel Levinas”, Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale, two parts, 69(3): 322–354 and 69(4): 425–473. Collected in L’écriture et la différence, Paris: Éditions du Seuil, 1967. Translated as “Violence and Metaphysics: An Essay on the Thought of Emmanuel Levinas”, in Writing and Difference, Alan Bass (trans.), New York: Routledge Press, 1978.
- –––, 1980 , “En ce moment même dans cet ouvrage me voici”, in Laruelle (ed.) 1980: 21–60. Translated as “At This Very Moment in this Work Here I Am”, Ruben Berezdivin (trans.), in Bernasconi and Critchley 1991: 11–49.
- –––, 1997 , Adieu à Emmanuel Levinas, Paris: Editions Galilée. Translated as Adieu to Emmanuel Levinas, Pascale-Anne Brault and Michael Naas (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1999.
- Descartes, René, 1641 , “Meditation V”, translated in The Philosophical Works of Descartes, Elizabeth S. Haldane and G.R.T. Ross (trans), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1911: 22–32.
- Desmond, William, 1994, “Philosophies of Religion: Marcel, Jaspers, Levinas” in Twentieth-Century Continental Philosophy, (The Routledge History of Philosophy, 8), Richard Kearney (ed.), London: Routledge, 131–174.
- Dimitrova, Maria (ed.), 2011, In Levinas’ Trace, Newcastle upon Tyne: Cambridge Scholars Publishing.
- Diprose, Rosalyn, 2002, Corporeal Generosity: On Giving with Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Doyon, Maxime and Timo Breyer (eds), 2015, Normativity in Perception, Hampshire: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1057/9781137377920
- Drabinski, John E., 2001, Sensibility and Singularity: The Problem of Phenomenology in Levinas, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- –––, 2011, Levinas and the Postcolonial: Race, Nation, Other, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
- Drabinski, John and Eric Nelson (eds), 2014, Between Levinas and Heidegger, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Dudiak, Jeffrey, 2001, The Intrigue of Ethics: A Reading of the Idea of Discourse in the Thought of Emmanuel Levinas, New York: Fordham University Press. doi:10.5422/fso/9780823220922.001.0001
- Dupuis, Michel (ed.), 1994, Levinas en contrastes, Brussels: De Boeck.
- Duncan, Diane Moira, 2001, The Pre-text of Ethics: On Derrida and Levinas, New York: Peter Lang.
- Eaglestone, Robert, 2000, Ethical Criticism: Reading after Levinas, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
- Edelglass, William and James Hatley (eds), 2012, Facing Nature: Levinas and Environmental Thought, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Eskenazi, Tamara Cohn, Gary A. Phillips, and David Jobling (eds), 2003, Levinas and Biblical Studies, Atlanta, GA: Society of Biblical Literature.
- Eskin, Michael, 2000, Ethics and Dialogue: In the Works of Levinas, Bakhtin, Mandel’shtam, and Celan, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Fagenblat, Michael, 2015, “‘The Passion of Israel’: The True Israel According to Levinas, or Judaism ‘as a Category of Being’”, Sophia, 54(3): 297–320. doi:10.1007/s11841-015-0463-3
- –––, 2010, A Covenant of Creatures: Levinas’s Philosophy of Judaism, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
- Faulconer, James, 2004, “Emmanuel Lévinas (1906–1995)”, in Twentieth Century European Cultural Theorists, Paul Hansom (ed.), (Dictionary of Literary Biography, 296), Detroit, MI: Gale, 285–295.
- Feron, Étienne, 1990, “Avant-Propos”, Études Phénoménologiques, 6(12): 3–9. doi:10.5840/etudphen19906121
- –––, 1992, De l’idée de transcendance à la question du langage. L’itinéraire philosophique d’Emmanuel Levinas, Grenoble: Éditions Jérôme Millon.
- Finkielkraut, Alain, 1984, La sagesse de l’amour, Paris: Gallimard.
- Forthomme, Bernard, 1979, Une philosophie de la transcendance: La métaphysique d’Emmanuel Lévinas, Paris: Vrin.
- Forthomme, Bernard and Jad Hatem, 1996, Affectivité et altérité selon Levinas et Henry, Paris: Cariscript.
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- –––, 2008, L’un pour l’autre: Levinas et la signification, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
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- Fryer, David Ross, 2004, The Intervention of the Other: Ethical Subjectivity in Levinas and Lacan, New York: Other Press.
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- Gibbs, Robert, 1994, Correlations in Rosenzweig and Levinas, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- –––, 2000, Why Ethics? Signs of Responsibilities, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
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- Guenther, Lisa, 2006, The Gift of the Other: Levinas and the Politics of Reproduction, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Guibal, Francis and Stanislas Breton, 1986, Altérités: Jacques Derrida et Pierre-Jean Labarrière: avec des études de Francis Guibal et Stanislas Breton, Paris: Éditions Osiris.
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- Hammerschlag, Sarah, 2016, Broken Tablets: Levinas, Derrida and the Literary Afterlife of Religion, New York: Columbia University Press.
- –––, 2010, The Figural Jew: Politics and Identity in Post-War French Thought, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- –––, 2012, “‘A Splinter in the Flesh’: Levinas and the Resignification of Jewish Suffering, 1928–1947”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 20(3): 389–419. doi:10.1080/09672559.2012.699273
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- –––, 1997, Individualisme éthique et philosophie chez Levinas, Paris: Kimé.
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- –––, 1929 , Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik, fifth edition, Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1991, Translated as Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, Richard Taft (trans.), based on the German fifth edition, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1997.
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- [he-FCM] –––, 1983 , Die Grundbegriffe der Metaphysik. Welt-Endlichkeit-Einsamkeit, Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann; originally a lecture course in 1929/30. Translated as The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude, William McNeill and Nicholas Walker (trans.), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- [he-PIA] –––, 1985 , Phänomenologische Interpretationen zu Aristoteles: Einführung in die phänomenologische Forschung, Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann; originally lectures at the University of Freiburg, Winter 1921/22. Translated as Phenomenological Interpretations of Aristotle: Initiation into Phenomenological Research, Richard Rojcewicz (trans.), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
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- [Ideas I] Husserl, Edmund, 1913 , Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Erstes Buch: Allgemeine Einführung in die reine Phänomenologie, Halle: Max Niemeyer. Reprinted in 1950, Walter Biemel (ed.), (Husserliana 3), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff. Translated as Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy—First Book: General Introduction to a Pure Phenomenology, Fred Kersten (trans.), (Edmund Husserl: Collected Works 2), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1982.
- [hu-CM] –––, 1931 , Méditations cartésiennes: Introduction à la phénoménologie, Gabrielle Peiffer and Emmanuel Levinas (trans.), Paris: J. Vrin; the German original was first published in 1950. Translated to English as Cartesian Meditations: An Introduction to Phenomenology, Dorion Cairns (trans.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973.
- [Ideas II] –––, 1952 , Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Zweites Buch: Phänomenologische Untersuchungen zur Konstitution, Marly Biemel (ed.), (Husserliana 4), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff. Translated as Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy—Second Book: Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution, Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer (trans.), (Edmund Husserl: Collected Works 3), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1989.
- –––, 1954 , “Der Wiener Vortrag” in Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzendentale Phänomenologie, Walter Biemel (ed.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1954 (pp. 314–348); original was an unpublished manuscript, 1935. Translated as “The Vienna Lecture”, in The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, David Carr (trans.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press (pp. 269–299).
- [Hua 10] –––, 1966 , Zur Phänomenologie des inneren Zeitbewusstseins (1893–1917), Rudolf Boehm (ed.), (Husserliana 10), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff. Translated as On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893–1917), John Barnett Brough (trans.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1991.
- –––, 1973a, Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität. Texte aus dem Nachlass. Erster Teil 1905–1920, (Husserliana 13). Iso von Kern (ed.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
- [Hua 14] –––, 1973b, Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität. Texte aus dem Nachlass. Zweiter Teil: 1921–1928, (Husserliana 14). Iso von Kern (ed.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
- –––, 1973c, Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität. Texte aus dem Nachlass. Dritter Teil: 1929–1935, (Husserliana 15), Iso von Kern (ed.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
- –––, 2001, Analyses concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic, Anthony J. Steinbock (trans.), Dordrecht: Kluwer; from the lectures between 1920 and 1926.
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- –––, 2004, Levinas: A Guide for the Perplexed, New York: Continuum.
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- Kant, Emmanuel, 1788 , Kritik der praktischen Vernunft, translated as Critique of Practical Reason, Werner Pluhar (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, Akademie Ausgabe, Vol. 5.
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- –––, 2012, Levinas and the Crisis of Humanism, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
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- –––, 1989, Dialogues with Contemporary Continental Thinkers: The Phenomenological Heritage. Paul Ricœur, Emmanuel Levinas, Herbert Marcuse, Stanislas Breton, Jacques Derrida, Manchester, UK: Manchester University Press.
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- –––, 1986, Les philosophies de la différence: Introduction critique, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
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- –––, 2002b, “Levinas and Language”, in Critchley and Bernasconi 2002: 119–138. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521662060.006
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- ––– (ed.), 2000, Positivité et transcendance, suivi de Lévinas et la phénoménologie, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
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- –––, 1964 , Le Visible et l’invisible, Claude Lefort (ed.), Paris: Editions Gallimard. Translated as The Visible and the Invisible, Alfonso Lingis (trans.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1968.
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- –––, 2016, Levinas’s Ethical Politics, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
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- –––, 1983 , “Le Katègorein de l’excès”, in his L’impératif catégorique, Paris: Flammarion, 81–19. Translated as “The Kategorein of Excess” in A Finite Thinking, Simon Sparks (ed.), James Gilbert-Walsh (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 142.
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- –––, 1932, Philosophie de la sensation, Vol. II “La sensibilité élémentaire”, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
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- Ricœur, Paul, 1990 , Soi-même comme un autre, Paris: Éditions du Seuil. Translated as Oneself as Another, Kathleen Blamey (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
- –––, 1997, Autrement. Lecture d’Autrement qu’être ou au-delà de l’Essence d’Emmanuel Levinas, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
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- –––, 1999, Altered Reading: Levinas and Literature, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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- –––, 2000, Parcours de l’Autrement: Lecture d’Emmanuel Levinas, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
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- –––, 1993, Judaism and Modernity: Philosophical Essays, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
- Rosenzweig, Franz, 1921 , Stern der Erlösung, Frankfurt am Main: Kauffmann. Translated as Star of Redemption, Barbara E. Galli (trans.), Madison, WI: University of Wisconsin Press, 2005.
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- Saint Cheron, Michaël de, 2010, Entretiens avec Emmanuel Lévinas, Livre de Poche. Translated as Conversations with Emmanuel Levinas: 1983–1994, Gary D. Mole (trans.), Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press, 2010.
- Salanskis, Jean-Michel, 2006, Levinas vivant, Paris: Les belles lettres.
- –––, 2016, Le fait juif, Paris: Les belles lettres.
- Saracino, Michele, 2003, On Being Human: A Conversation with Lonergan and Levinas, Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press.
- Sartre, Jean-Paul, 1943 , L’Être et le néant : Essai d’ontologie phénoménologique, Paris: Éditions Gallimard. Translated as Being and Nothingness: A Phenomenological Essay on Ontology, Hazel Barnes (trans.), New York: Washington Square Press.
- Schroeder, Brian, 1996, Altared Ground: Levinas, History and Violence, New York: Routledge.
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- –––, 2001 , Épreuve de la limite: Derrida, Henry, Levinas et la phénoménologie, Presses Universitaires de France. Translated as Testing the Limit: Derrida, Henry, Levinas and the Phenomenological Tradition, Stephen Barker (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2012.
- –––, 2009, Lévinas et le contemporain: Les préoccupations de l’heure, Besançon: Éditions Les Solitaires Intempestifs.
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- Severson, Eric, 2013, Levinas’s Philosophy of Time: Gift, Responsibility, Diachrony, Hope, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Shankman, Steven and Massimo Lollini (eds), 2002, Who, Exactly, is the Other? Western and Transcultural Perspectives. A Collection of Essays, Eugene, OR: University of Oregon Books.
- Shapiro, Lawrence, 2011, Embodied Cognition, New York: Routledge.
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- –––, 1993, “Emmanuel Levinas: Ethik als erste Philosophie”, in Bernhard Waldenfels, Phänomenologie in Frankreich, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag.
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- Tahmasebi-Birgani, Victoria, 2019, Emmanuel Levinas and the Politics of Non-Violence, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
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- Todd, Sharon, 2003, Learning from the Other: Levinas, Psychoanalysis and Ethical Possibilities in Education, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Topolski, Anya, 2015, Arendt, Levinas and a Politics of Relationality, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield International.
- Toumayan, Alain P., 2004, Encountering the Other: The Artwork and the Problem of Difference in Blanchot and Levinas, Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press.
- Trigano, Shmuel (ed.), 1997, L’école de pensée juive de Paris, (Pardès 23), Paris: Éditions In Press.
- –––, 2002, “Levinas et le projet de la philosophie juive”, in Cohen-Levinas and Trigano 2002: 145–178.
- Vasseleu, Cathryn, 1998, Textures of Light: Vision and Touch in Irigaray, Levinas and Merleau-Ponty, New York: Routledge.
- Velling, Terry A., 2014, For You Alone: Levinas and the Answerable Life, Eugene, OR: Cascade Books.
- Veulemans, Sophie, 2008, “On Time : Levinas’ Appropriation of Bergson”, in Burggraeve 2008: 279–302.
- Wall, Thomas Carl, 1999, Radical Passivity: Lévinas, Blanchot, and Agamben, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Wehrs, Donald, 2013, Levinas and Twentieth-Century Literature: Ethics and the Reconstitution of Subjectivity, Newark: University of Delaware Press.
- Westphal, Merold, 2008, Levinas and Kierkegaard in Dialogue. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
- Wiggins, David, 1987 , Needs, Values, Truth: Essays in the Philosophy of Value, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Third edition, 1998.o
- Winkler, Raphael, 2018, Philosophy of Finitude: Heidegger, Levinas, and Nietzsche, New York: Bloomsbury.
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- Wolosky, Shira, 2017, “Two Types of Negative Theology; Or, What Does Negative Theology Negate” in Negative Theology as Jewish Modernity, Michael Fagenblat (ed.), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 161–179.
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- Wyschogrod, Edith, 1974 , Emmanuel Levinas: The Problem of Ethical Metaphysics, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers. Second edition, New York: Fordham University Press, 2000.
- Zielinski, Agata, 2002, Lecture de Merleau-Ponty et Levinas: le corps, le monde, l’autre, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
- Zimmermann, Nigel, 2103, Levinas and Theology, New York: Bloomsbury.
Video and Sound Documents
- Absent God: Emmanuel Levinas and the Humanism of the Other, Yoram Ron (director), Israel: Noprocess films and Arnavaz Productions, 2015. (68 minutes, Hebrew & French with English and Hebrew subtitles)
- Emmanuel Levinas: Journée d’études, Alain Finkielkraut, Benny Lévy, Catherine Chalier et al., Paris: Bibliothèque nationale de France, 2003 (four CDs).
- Interview Levinas, Deodaat Visser (director), Netherlands: IKON/Levinas Studiekring, 1986 (Dutch and French). [Interview Levinas available online]
- Levinas, David Hansel and Isy Morgensztern, Paris: Éditions Montparnasse, 2013 (2 DVDs) (In French).
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
Works on Levinas
- Morris, Anita, 2013, The Role of Religion in the Philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas, Amazon Digital Services (Kindle).
Centers and Sites
- Cohen, Richard A., (The Levinas Center)
- Nakayama, Gen, (Levinas Page)
- Robbins, Brent Dean, (Mythos and Logos—Levinas)
- Schaefer, Gérard, (Espacethique: l’aventure éthique de la responsabilité)