Notes to Liar Paradox

1. Thus, a paradox nearly occurs in the New Testament. For a delightful discussion, see Anderson (1970). For a more thorough discussion of the history of the Liar, see Sorensen (2003). There has been some important recent work on medieval theories of the Liar, and their relevance to current approaches. See the papers in Rahman, Tulenheimo, and Genot (2008), and, for instance, Read (2002, 2006); Restall (2008); and Simmons (1993).

2. Terminology here is not uniform. Van Fraassen (1968) introduced the term ‘strengthened Liar’ to name what we are calling the simple-untruth Liar. Van Fraassen’s term, however, has been more often used for a ‘revenge-like’ paradox in the manner of C. Parsons (1974), as we discuss in §4.1.3.

3. A note on terminology: when talking about a language, we mean an interpreted language, including a syntax, an interpretation or model (containing a domain of objects and interpretations for non-logical vocabulary), and a valuation scheme which determines truth in the model for complex formulas. Simplifying for exposition, we shall often speak loosely and blur the distinction between a logic and a language (thinking, in a not strictly accurate fashion, of the valuation scheme as the relevant bit of ‘logical consequence’ for the language). Moreover, at some points, it is a theory rather than a language that is at issue. We note when such distinctions become important. Given the wide range of ideas in logic that we survey in rather brief form in this essay, we leave many such subtleties to more leisurely presentations.

4. Hence, our terminology of ‘rule forms’ may not be ideal. For our limited purposes here, were use it merely to mark the difference between a valid argument, recorded as a ‘rule form’, and the provability of a conditional, reported as a ‘conditional form’. Though this is not the only logical distinction to be drawn, it is the one which will be of most importance as our discussion progresses.

5. The situation with formal languages is actually somewhat subtler than our brief discussion indicates. In most cases, corner quotes really indicate formal terms for Gödel numbers of sentences, and are not genuine quotation marks in the usual sense (e.g., denoting the expression ‘inside’ them). Hence, the sense in which such languages have reference to sentences is delicate. Yet with very minimal resources, syntax can be represented and diagonal sentences constructed. Hence, there is a sense, albeit subtle, in which such languages can express self-reference. See the entries on provability logic and Gödel (the section on the incompleteness theorems), as well as Heck (2007).

6.. It is this principle or rule that we repeated above by saying that by the lights of many logical theories an arbitrary contradiction implies absurdity or triviality, in the sense of implying all sentences. The principle is often labeled by its classical title ‘ex falso quodlibet’, and hence its customary abbreviation is ‘EFQ’ in spite of the name ‘explosion’.

7. This is often called ‘\(\vee\)-Out’ or ‘\(\vee\)-Elim’ or, more suggestively, ‘reasoning by cases’.

8. Again for the classical case, Friedman and Sheard (1987) provide an exhaustive list of inconsistent theories relative to a fairly weak base theory. They show that either of the classical conditional forms of capture or release are inconsistent by themselves, over the base theory supplemented by the right choice of principles providing for completeness \((\Tr(\left\ulcorner A\right\urcorner) \vee \Tr (\left\ulcorner\neg A\right\urcorner))\) or consistency \((\neg(\Tr (\left\ulcorner A\right\urcorner) \wedge \Tr (\left\ulcorner\neg A\right\urcorner)))\) of truth.

9. Beall and Glanzberg (2008) have argued for a close connection between general views on the nature of truth and available avenues for resolving the paradox.

10. The logic was first advanced by Asenjo (1966), though has come to be popularized by Priest’s work. The name ‘LP’ is due to Priest, while the term ‘dialetheism’ was coined by Priest and Routley.

11. A technical note: Kripke defined being grounded as appearing in the minimal fixed point. We have not discussed other fixed points here, but there are many, and a sentence can appear in them without appearing in the minimal one.

Copyright © 2016 by
Jc Beall <>
Michael Glanzberg <>
David Ripley <>

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