# Provability Logic

*First published Wed Apr 2, 2003; substantive revision Wed Apr 5, 2017*

Provability logic is a modal logic that is used to investigate what arithmetical theories can express in a restricted language about their provability predicates. The logic has been inspired by developments in meta-mathematics such as Gödel’s incompleteness theorems of 1931 and Löb’s theorem of 1953. As a modal logic, provability logic has been studied since the early seventies, and has had important applications in the foundations of mathematics.

From a philosophical point of view, provability logic is interesting because the concept of provability in a fixed theory of arithmetic has a unique and non-problematic meaning, other than concepts like necessity and knowledge studied in modal and epistemic logic. Furthermore, provability logic provides tools to study the notion of self-reference.

- 1. The history of provability logic
- 2. The axiom system of propositional provability logic
- 3. Possible worlds semantics and topological semantics
- 4. Provability logic and Peano Arithmetic
- 5. The scope of provability logic
- 6. Philosophical significance
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The history of provability logic

Two strands of research have led to the birth of provability logic. The first one stems from a paper by K. Gödel (1933), where he introduces translations from intuitionistic propositional logic into modal logic (more precisely, into the system nowadays called S4), and briefly mentions that provability can be viewed as a modal operator. Even earlier, C.I. Lewis started the modern study of modal logic by introducing strict implication as a kind of deducibility, where he may have meant deducibility in a formal system like Principia Mathematica, but this is not clear from his writings.

The other strand starts from research in meta-mathematics: what can mathematical theories say about themselves by encoding interesting properties? In 1952, L. Henkin posed a deceptively simple question inspired by Gödel’s incompleteness theorems. In order to formulate Henkin’s question, some more background is needed. As a reminder, Gödel’s first incompleteness theorem states that, for a sufficiently strong formal theory like Peano Arithmetic, any sentence asserting its own unprovability is in fact unprovable. On the other hand, from “outside” the formal theory, one can see that such a sentence is true in the standard model, pointing to an important distinction between truth and provability.

More formally, let \(\ulcorner A \urcorner\) denote the Gödel number of arithmetical formula \(A\), which is the result of assigning a numerical code to \(A\). Let \(\Prov\) be the formalized provability predicate for Peano Arithmetic, which is of the form \(\exists p \, \Proof(p,x)\). Here, \(\Proof\) is the formalized proof predicate of Peano Arithmetic, and \(\Proof(p,x)\) stands for “Gödel number \(p\) codes a correct proof from the axioms of Peano Arithmetic of the formula with Gödel number \(x\)”. (For a more precise formulation, see Smoryński (1985), Davis (1958).) Now, suppose that Peano Arithmetic proves \(A \leftrightarrow \neg\) \(\Prov (\ulcorner A \urcorner)\), then by Gödel’s result, \(A\) is not provable in Peano Arithmetic, and thus it is true, for in fact the self-referential sentence \(A\) states “I am not provable”.

Henkin on the other hand wanted to know whether anything could be said about sentences asserting their own provability: supposing that Peano Arithmetic proves \(B \leftrightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner B \urcorner)\), what does this imply about \(B\)? Three years later, M. Löb took up the challenge and answered Henkin’s question in a surprising way. Even though all sentences provable in Peano Arithmetic are indeed true about the natural numbers, Löb showed that the formalized version of this fact, \(\Prov(\ulcorner B \urcorner) \rightarrow B\), can be proved in Peano Arithmetic only in the trivial case that Peano Arithmetic already proves \(B\) itself. This result, now called Löb’s theorem, immediately answers Henkin’s question. (For a proof of Löb’s theorem, see Section 4.) Löb also showed a formalized version of his theorem, namely that Peano Arithmetic proves

\[ \Prov(\ulcorner \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \rightarrow B\urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner B \urcorner ). \]In the same paper, Löb formulated three conditions on the provability predicate of Peano Arithmetic, that form a useful modification of the complicated conditions that Hilbert and Bernays introduced in 1939 for their proof of Gödel’s second incompleteness theorem. In the following, derivability of \(A\) from Peano Arithmetic is denoted by \(\PA \vdash A\):

- If \(\PA \vdash A\), then \(\PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner A \urcorner )\);
- \(\PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner A\rightarrow B\urcorner) \rightarrow ( \Prov(\ulcorner A \urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner B \urcorner ));\)
- \(\PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner A \urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner \Prov(\ulcorner A \urcorner ) \urcorner ).\)

These Löb conditions, as they are called nowadays, seem to cry out for a modal logical investigation, where the modality \(\Box\) stands for provability in PA. Ironically, the first time that the formalized version of Löb’s theorem was stated as the modal principle

\[ \Box(\Box A \rightarrow A) \rightarrow \Box A \]was in a paper by Smiley in 1963 about the logical basis of ethics, which did not consider arithmetic at all. More relevant investigations, however, seriously started only almost twenty years after publication of Löb’s paper. The early 1970s saw the rapid development of propositional provability logic, where several researchers in different countries independently proved the most important results, discussed in Sections 2, 3, and 4. Propositional provability logic turned out to capture exactly what many formal theories of arithmetic can say by propositional means about their own provability predicate. More recently, researchers have investigated the boundaries of this approach and have proposed several interesting more expressive extensions of provability logic (see Section 5).

## 2. The axiom system of propositional provability logic

The logical language of propositional provability logic contains, in addition to propositional atoms and the usual truth-functional operators as well as the contradiction symbol \(\bot\), a modal operator \(\Box\) with intended meaning “is provable in \(T\),” where \(T\) is a sufficiently strong formal theory, let us say Peano Arithmetic (see Section 4). \(\Diamond A\) is an abbreviation for \(\neg\,\Box\neg\, A\). Thus, the language is the same as that of modal systems such as K and S4 presented in the entry modal logic.

### 2.1 Axioms and rules

Propositional provability logic is often called GL, after Gödel and Löb. (Alternative names found in the literature for equivalent systems are L, G, KW, K4W, and PrL). The logic GL results from adding the following axiom to the basic modal logic K:

\[\tag{GL} \Box(\Box A \rightarrow A) \rightarrow \Box A. \]As a reminder, because GL extends K, it contains all formulas having the form of a propositional tautology. For the same reason, GL contains the

\[\tag{Distribution Axiom} \Box(A \rightarrow B) \rightarrow (\Box A \rightarrow \Box B). \]Furthermore, it is closed under the Modus Ponens Rule, which allows to derive \(B\) from \(A \rightarrow B\) and \(A\), and the Generalization Rule, which says that if \(A\) is a theorem of GL, then so is \(\Box A\).

The notion \(\GL \vdash A\) denotes provability of a modal formula \(A\) in propositional provability logic. It is not difficult to see that the modal axiom \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box\Box A\) (known as Axiom 4 of modal logic) is indeed provable in GL. To prove this, one uses the substitution \(A \wedge \Box A\) for \(A\) in the axiom (GL). Then, seeing that the antecedent of the resulting implication follows from \(\Box A\), one applies the Distribution Axiom and the Generalization Rule as well as some propositional logic. Unless explicitly stated otherwise, in the sequel “provability logic” stands for the system GL of propositional provability logic.

As to the *proof theory* of provability logic, Valentini (1983)
proved that a standard sequent calculus formulation of GL obeys
*cut elimination*, which means, roughly formulated, that each
formula provable from GL in the sequent calculus also has a GL sequent
proof “without detours” (see the entry
the development of proof theory
for a precise explanation of cut elimination). In recent years, there
has been renewed interest in the proof theory of GL, see for example
Goré and Ramanayake (2008). Cut-elimination leads to the
desirable *subformula property* for GL, because all formulas
that appear in a cut-free proof are subformulas of the endsequent
formulas.

For recent proof-theoretic investigations of provability logic based
on different cut-free sequent calculi see (Negri 2005, 2014; Poggiolesi 2009). Negri
presents two equivalent labelled sequent calculi for GL and a
syntactic proof of cut elimination. Even if a full subformula property
does not hold for these calculi because of the labelling, the usual
consequences of the subformula property can be established: The
labelled formalism allows a direct completeness proof, which can be
used to establish decidability as well as the finite model property,
which means that any formula that is not provable has
a *finite* counter-model.

An intriguing new proof-theoretical development is Shamkanov’s
expansion of sequent-style proof systems by allowing *circular
proofs* (Shamkanov 2014). Consider a sequent system for K4, the
modal system resulting from GL by replacing the axiom GL by the weaker
axiom \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box\Box A\) (axiom 4). However, suppose
that open hypotheses are allowed, provided that the same sequent
occurs strictly below that hypothesis in the proof tree. Formulated
more technically, one can find a circular derivation from an ordinary
derivation tree by linking each of its non-axiomatic leaves with an
identical interior node. Shamkanov (2014) proved that the resulting
system is consistent and that moreover, in general, each sequent has a
GL-derivation if and only if it has a circular K4-derivation. Circular
proofs also provide a method to show proof-theoretically that Lyndon’s
interpolation theorem holds for GL. Standard interpolation for GL
had already been proved before by different methods (Boolos 1979;
Smoryński 1978; Rautenberg 1983). (For more information
about Lyndon’s interpolation theorem for first-order logic, see also the entry
first-order model theory ).

### 2.2 The fixed point theorem

The main “modal” result about provability logic is the fixed point theorem, which D. de Jongh and G. Sambin independently proved in 1975 (Sambin 1976). Even though it is formulated and proved by strictly modal methods, the fixed point theorem still has great arithmetical significance. It says essentially that self-reference is not really necessary, in the following sense. Suppose that all occurrences of the propositional variable \(p\) in a given formula \(A(p)\) are under the scope of the provability operator, for example \(A(p) = \neg\Box p\), or \(A(p) = \Box(p \rightarrow q)\). Then there is a formula \(B\) in which \(p\) does not appear, such that all propositional variables that occur in \(B\) already appear in \(A(p)\), and such that

\[ \GL \vdash B \leftrightarrow A(B). \]
This formula \(B\) is called a *fixed point* of \(A(p)\).
Moreover, the fixed point is unique, or more accurately, if there is
another formula \(C\) such that \( \GL \vdash C \leftrightarrow
A(C)\), then we must have \( \GL \vdash B \leftrightarrow C\). Most
proofs in the literature give an algorithm by which one can compute
the fixed point (see Smoryński 1985, Boolos 1993, Sambin and
Valentini 1982, Lindström 2006). A particularly short and clear proof, as well as a
very efficient algorithm to compute fixed points, can be found in
Reidhaar-Olson (1990).

For example, suppose that \(A(p) = \neg \, \Box p\). Then the fixed point produced by such an algorithm is \(\neg \, \Box\bot\), and indeed one can prove that

\[ \GL \vdash \neg\,\Box\bot \leftrightarrow \neg\,\Box(\neg\,\Box\bot). \]If this is read arithmetically, the direction from left to right is just the formalized version of Gödel’s second incompleteness theorem: if a sufficiently strong formal theory \(T\) like Peano Arithmetic does not prove a contradiction, then it is not provable in \(T\) that \(T\) does not prove a contradiction. Thus, sufficiently strong consistent arithmetical theories cannot prove their own consistency. We will turn to study the relation between provability logic and arithmetic more precisely in Section 4, but to that end another “modal” aspect of GL needs to be provided first: semantics.

## 3. Possible worlds semantics and topological semantics

Provability logic has suitable possible worlds semantics, just like many other modal logics. As a reminder, a possible worlds model (or Kripke model) is a triple \(M = \langle W,R,V \rangle\), where \(W\) is a non-empty set of possible worlds, \(R\) is a binary accessibility relation on \(W\), and \(V\) is a valuation that assigns a truth value to each propositional variable for each world in \(W\). The pair \(F = \langle W,R \rangle\) is called the frame of this model. The notion of truth of a formula \(A\) in a model \(M\) at a world \(W\), notation \(M,w \models A\), is defined inductively. Let us repeat only the most interesting clause, the one for the provability operator \(\Box\):

\[ M,w \models \Box A \text{ iff for every } w', \text{ if } wRw', \text{ then } M,w' \models A. \]See the entry modal logic for more information about possible worlds semantics in general.

### 3.1 Characterization and modal soundness

The modal logic K is valid in all Kripke models. Its extension GL however, is not: we need to restrict the class of possible worlds models to a more suitable one. Let us say that a formula \(A\) is valid in frame \(F\), notation \(F \models A\), iff \(A\) is true in all worlds in Kripke models \(M\) based on \(F\). It turns out that the new axiom (GL) of provability logic corresponds to a condition on frames, as follows:

For all frames \(F = \langle W,R \rangle, F \models \Box(\Box p \rightarrow p) \rightarrow \Box p\) iff \(R\) is transitive and conversely well-founded.

Here, *transitivity* is the well-known property that for all
worlds \(w_1\), \(w_2\), \(w_3\) in \(W\), if \(w_1 Rw_2\) and \(w_2
Rw_3\), then \(w_1 Rw_3\). A relation is *conversely
well-founded* iff there are no infinite ascending sequences, that
is sequences of the form \(w_1 Rw_2 Rw_3 R \ldots\). Note that
conversely well-founded frames are also irreflexive, for if \(wRw\),
this gives rise to an infinite ascending sequence
\(wRwRwR\ldots\).

The above correspondence result immediately shows that GL is modally
sound with respect to the class of possible worlds models on
transitive conversely well-founded frames, because all axioms and
rules of GL are valid on such models. The question is whether
completeness also holds: for example, the formula \(\Box A \rightarrow
\Box\Box A\), which is valid on all transitive frames, is indeed
provable in GL, as was mentioned in
Section 1.
But is *every* formula that is valid on all transitive
conversely well-founded frames also provable in GL?

### 3.2 Modal completeness

Unaware of the arithmetical significance of GL, K. Segerberg proved in 1971 that GL is indeed complete with respect to transitive conversely well-founded frames; D. de Jongh and S. Kripke independently proved this result as well. Segerberg showed that GL is complete even with respect to the more restricted class of finite transitive irreflexive trees, a fact which later turned out to be very useful for Solovay’s proof of the arithmetical completeness theorem (see Section 4).

The modal soundness and completeness theorems immediately give rise to
a decision procedure to check for any modal formula \(A\) whether
\(A\) follows from GL or not, by depth-first search through
irreflexive transitive trees of bounded depth. Looking at the
procedure a bit more precisely, it can be shown that GL is decidable
in the computational complexity class PSPACE, like the well-known
modal logics K, T and S4. This means that there is a Turing machine
that, given a formula \(A\) as input, answers whether \(A\) follows
from GL or not; the size of the memory that the Turing machine needs
for its computation is only polynomial in the length of \(A\). One can
show that the decision problem for GL (again, like the decision
problems for K, T and S4) is PSPACE-*complete*, in the sense
that all other problems in PSPACE are no harder than deciding whether
a given formula is a theorem of GL. (See Goré and Kelly (2007)
for the description of an automated theorem prover for GL.)

To give some more perspective on complexity, the class P of functions computable in an amount of time polynomial in the length of the input, is included in PSPACE, which in turn is included in the class EXPTIME of functions computable in exponential time (see the entry computability and complexity). It remains a famous open problem whether these two inclusions are strict, although many complexity theorists believe that they are. Some other well-known modal logics, like epistemic logic with common knowledge, are decidable in EXPTIME, thus they may be more complex than GL, depending on the open problems.

### 3.3 Failure of strong completeness

Many well-known modal logics \(S\) are not only complete with respect
to an appropriate class of frames, but even *strongly
complete*. In order to explain strong completeness, we need the
notion of *derivability from a set of assumptions*. A formula
\(A\) is derivable from the set of assumptions \(\Gamma\) in a modal
logic \(S\), written as \(\Gamma \vdash A\), if \(A\) is in \(\Gamma\)
or \(A\) follows from formulas in \(\Gamma\) and axioms of \(S\) by
applications of Modus Ponens and the Generalization Rule. Here, the
Generalization Rule can only be applied to derivations without
assumptions (see Hakli and Negri 2010).

Now a modal logic \(S\) is *strongly complete* if for all
(finite or infinite) sets \(\Gamma\) and all formulas \(A\):

If, on appropriate \(S\)-frames, \(A\) is true in all worlds in which all formulas of \(\Gamma\) are true, then \(\Gamma \vdash A\) in the logic \(S\).

This condition holds for systems like K, M, K4, S4, and S5. If restricted to finite sets \(\Gamma\), the above condition corresponds to completeness.

Strong completeness does not hold for provability logic, however,
because *semantic compactness* fails. Semantic compactness is
the property that for each infinite set \(\Gamma\) of formulas,

If every finite subset \(\Delta\) of \(\Gamma\) has a model on an appropriate \(S\)-frame, then \(\Gamma\) also has a model on an appropriate \(S\)-frame.

As a counterexample, take the infinite set of formulas

\[ \Gamma = \{\Diamond p_0, \Box(p_0 \rightarrow \Diamond p_1), \Box(p_1 \rightarrow \Diamond p_2), \Box(p_2 \rightarrow \Diamond p_3), \ldots, \Box(p_n \rightarrow \Diamond p_{n+1}), \ldots\} \]
Then for every finite subset \(\Delta\) of \(\Gamma\), one can
construct a model on a transitive, conversely well-founded frame and a
world in the model where all formulas of \(\Delta\) are true. So by
modal soundness, GL does not prove \(\bot\) from \(\Delta\) for any
finite \(\Delta \subseteq \Gamma\), and *a fortiori* GL does
not prove \(\bot\) from \(\Gamma\), as any GL-proof is finite. On the
other hand, it is easy to see that there is no model on a transitive,
conversely well-founded frame where in any world, all formulas of
\(\Gamma\) hold. Thus \(\bot\) follows semantically from \(\Gamma\),
but is not provable from it in GL, contradicting the condition of
strong completeness.

### 3.4 Topological semantics for provability logic

As an alternative to possible worlds semantics, many modal logics may be given topological semantics. Clearly, propositions can be interpreted as subsets of a topological space. It is also easy to see that the propositional connective \(\wedge\) corresponds to the set-theoretic operation \(\cap\), while \(\vee\) corresponds to \(\cup\), \(\neg\) corresponds to the set-theoretic complement, and \(\rightarrow\) corresponds to \(\subseteq\). Modal logics that contain the reflection axiom \(\Box A \rightarrow A\) enjoy a particularly natural interpretation of the modal operators as well. For these logics, \(\Diamond\) corresponds to the closure operator in a topological space, while \(\Box\) corresponds to the interior. To see why these interpretations are appropriate, notice that the reflection axiom corresponds to the fact that each set is included in its closure and each set includes its interior.

However, provability logic does *not* prove reflection, as the
instantiation \(\Box\bot \rightarrow \bot\) of reflection would lead
to a contradiction with the axiom (GL).

Provability logic therefore needs a different approach. Based on a
suggestion by J. McKinsey and A. Tarski (1944), L. Esakia (1981, 2003)
investigated the interpretation of \(\Diamond\) as the derived set
operator \(d\), which maps a set \(B\) to the set of its limit points
\(d(B)\). To explain the consequences of this interpretation of
\(\Diamond\), we need two more definitions, namely of the concepts
*dense-in-itself* and *scattered*. A subset \(B\) of a
topological space is called *dense-in-itself* if \(B \subseteq
d(B)\). A topological space is called *scattered* if it has no
non-empty subset that is dense-in-itself. The ordinals in their
interval topology form examples of scattered spaces. Esakia (1981)
proved an important correspondence: he showed that a topological space
*satisfies the axiom GL* if and only if the space is
*scattered*. This correspondence soon led to the result,
independently found by Abashidze (1985) and Blass (1990), that
provability logic is complete with respect to any ordinal \(\ge
\omega^\omega\).

In recent years, topological semantics for provability logic has seen
a veritable revival, especially in the study of Japaridze’s bimodal
provability logic GLB, an extension of GL (Japaridze 1986). The logic
GLB turns out to be *modally incomplete* with respect to its
possible worlds semantics, in the sense that it does not correspond to
any class of frames. This feature places bimodal GLB in sharp contrast
with unimodal GL, which corresponds to the class of finite transitive
irreflexive trees, as mentioned above. Beklemishev et al. (2009)
showed that GLB is, however, complete with respect to its
*topological* semantics (see also Beklemishev 2009, Icard
2011). Intriguing reverberations of Esakia’s correspondence between GL
and scattered topological spaces can even be found in recent
topological studies of spatial and epistemic logics (see Aiello et al.
2007). (See
Section 5.4
for further discussion about GLB).

## 4. Provability logic and Peano Arithmetic

From the time GL was formulated, researchers wondered whether it was
adequate for formal theories like Peano Arithmetic (PA): does GL prove
*everything* about the notion of provability that can be
expressed in a propositional modal language and can be proved in Peano
Arithmetic, or should more principles be added to GL? To make this
notion of adequacy more precise, we define a *realization*
(sometimes called translation or interpretation) to be a function
*f* that assigns to each propositional atom of modal logic a
sentence of arithmetic, where

- \(f(\bot)=\bot;\)
- \(f\) respects the logical connectives, for example, \(f(B \rightarrow C) = (f(B) \rightarrow f(C));\) and
- \(\Box\) is translated as the provability predicate \(\Prov\), so \(f(\Box B) = \Prov(\ulcorner f(B)\urcorner ).\)

### 4.1 Arithmetical soundness

It was already clear in the early 1970s that GL is *arithmetically
sound* with respect to PA, formally:

To give some taste of meta-mathematics, let us sketch the soundness proof.

**Proof sketch of arithmetical soundness**. PA indeed
proves realizations of propositional tautologies, and provability of
the Distribution Axiom of GL translates to

for all formulas *A* and *B*, which is just Löb’s
second derivability condition (see
Section 1).
Moreover, PA obeys Modus Ponens, as well as the translation of the
Generalization Rule:

which is just Löb’s first derivability condition. Finally, the translation of the main axiom (GL) is indeed provable in PA:

\[ \PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner \Prov(\ulcorner A\urcorner ) \rightarrow A\urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner A\urcorner ). \]This is exactly the formalized version of Löb’s theorem mentioned in Section 1.

Let us give a sketch of the proof of Löb’s theorem itself from his derivability conditions (the proof of the formalized version is similar). The proof is based on Gödel’s diagonalization lemma, which says that for any arithmetical formula \(C(x)\) there is an arithmetical formula \(B\) such that

\[ \PA \vdash B \leftrightarrow C(\ulcorner B\urcorner ). \]In words, the formula \(B\) says “I have property \(C\).”

**Proof of Löb’s theorem:**. Suppose that \(\PA
\vdash \Prov(\ulcorner A\urcorner ) \rightarrow A\); we need to show
that \(\PA \vdash A\). By the diagonalization lemma, there is a
formula \(B\) such that

From this it follows by Löb’s first and second derivability conditions plus some propositional reasoning that

\[ \PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \leftrightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \rightarrow A\urcorner ). \]Thus, again by Löb’s second condition,

\[ \PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \rightarrow (\Prov(\ulcorner \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner A\urcorner )). \]On the other hand Löb’s third condition gives

\[ \PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner )\urcorner ), \]thus

\[ \PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \rightarrow \Prov(\ulcorner A\urcorner ). \]Together with the assumption that \(PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner A\urcorner ) \rightarrow A\), this gives

\[ \PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner ) \rightarrow A. \]Finally, the equation produced by the diagonalization lemma implies that \(\PA \vdash B\), so \(\PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner B\urcorner )\), thus

\[ \PA \vdash A, \]as desired.

Note that substituting \(\bot\) for \(A\) in Löb’s theorem, we derive that \(\PA \vdash \neg\, \Prov(\ulcorner \bot\urcorner )\) implies \(\PA \vdash \bot\), which is just the contraposition of Gödel’s second incompleteness theorem.

### 4.2 Arithmetical completeness

The landmark result in provability logic is R. Solovay’s arithmetical completeness theorem of 1976, showing that GL is indeed adequate for Peano Arithmetic:

\[ \GL \vdash A \text{ if and only if for all realizations } f, \PA \vdash f(A). \]This theorem says essentially that the modal logic GL captures everything that Peano Arithmetic can truthfully say in modal terms about its own provability predicate. The direction from left to right, arithmetical soundness of GL, is discussed above. Solovay set out to prove the other, much more difficult, direction by contraposition. His proof is based on intricate self-referential techniques, and only a small glimpse can be given here.

The modal completeness theorem by Segerberg was an important first step in Solovay’s proof of arithmetical completeness of GL with respect to Peano Arithmetic. Suppose that GL does not prove the modal formula \(A\). Then, by modal completeness, there is a finite transitive irreflexive tree such that \(A\) is false at the root of that tree. Now Solovay devised an ingenious way to simulate such a finite tree in the language of Peano Arithmetic. Thus he found a realization \(f\) from modal formulas to sentences of arithmetic, such that Peano Arithmetic does not prove \(f(A)\).

Solovay’s completeness theorem provides an alternative way to construct many arithmetical sentences that are not provable in Peano Arithmetic. For example, it is easy to make a possible worlds model to show that GL does not prove \(\Box p \vee \Box\neg\, p\), so by Solovay’s theorem, there is an arithmetical sentence \(f(p)\) such that Peano Arithmetic does not prove \(\Prov(\ulcorner f(p)\urcorner ) \vee \Prov(\ulcorner \neg\, f(p)\urcorner )\). In particular, this implies that neither \(f(p)\) nor \(\neg\, f(p)\) is provable in Peano Arithmetic; for suppose on the contrary that \(\PA \vdash f(p)\), then by Löb’s first condition and propositional logic, \(\PA \vdash \Prov(\ulcorner f(p)\urcorner ) \vee \Prov(\ulcorner \neg\, f(p)\urcorner )\), leading to a contradiction, and similarly if one supposes that \(\PA \vdash \neg\, f(p)\).

Solovay’s theorem is so significant because it shows that an interesting fragment of an undecidable formal theory like Peano Arithmetic—namely that which arithmetic can express in propositional terms about its own provability predicate—can be studied by means of a decidable modal logic, GL, with a perspicuous possible worlds semantics.

## 5. The scope of provability logic

In this section, some recent trends in research on provability logic are discussed. One important strand concerns the limits on the scope of GL, where the main question is, for which formal theories, other than Peano Arithmetic, is GL the appropriate propositional provability logic? Next, we discuss some generalizations of propositional provability logic in more expressive modal languages.

### 5.1 Boundaries

In recent years, logicians have investigated many other systems of arithmetic that are weaker than Peano Arithmetic. Often these logicians took their inspiration from computability issues, for example the study of functions computable in polynomial time. They have given a partial answer to the question: “For which theories of arithmetic does Solovay’s arithmetical completeness theorem (with respect to the appropriate provability predicate) still hold?” To discuss this question, two concepts are needed. \(\Delta_0\)-formulas are arithmetical formulas in which all quantifiers are bounded by a term, for example

\[ \forall y \le \bs\bs 0 \: \forall z \le y \: \forall x \le y + z \: (x + y \le (y+(y+z))), \]where \(\bs\) is the successor operator (“\(+1\)”). The arithmetical theory \(I \Delta_0\) (where I stands for “induction”), is similar to Peano Arithmetic, except that it allows less induction: the induction scheme

\[ A(0) \wedge \forall x\, (A(x) \rightarrow A(\bs x)) \rightarrow \forall x \, A(x) \]is restricted to \(\Delta_0\)-formulas \(A\).

As De Jongh and others (1991) pointed out, arithmetical completeness certainly holds for theories \(T\) that satisfy the following two conditions:

- \(T\) proves induction for \(\Delta_0\)-formulas, and \(T\) proves EXP, the formula expressing that for all \(x\), its power \(2^x\) exists. In more standard notation: \(T\) extends \(I \Delta_0\)+EXP;
- \(T\) does not prove any false sentences of the form \(\exists x\, A(x)\), with \(A(x)\) a \(\Delta_0\)-formula.

For such theories, arithmetical soundness and completeness of GL hold, provided that \(\Box\) translates to \(\Prov_T\), a natural provability predicate with respect to a sufficiently simple axiomatization of \(T\). Thus for modal sentences \(A\):

\[ \GL \vdash A \text{ if and only if for all realizations } f,T \vdash f(A). \]It is not clear yet whether Condition 1 gives a lower bound on the scope of provability logic. For example, it is still an open question whether GL is the provability logic of \(I \Delta_0+\Omega_1\), a theory which is somewhat weaker than \(I \Delta_0\)+EXP in that \(\Omega_1\) is the axiom asserting that for all \(x\), its power \(x^{\log(x)}\) exists. Provability logic GL is arithmetically sound with respect to \(I \Delta_0+\Omega_1\), but except for some partial results by Berarducci and Verbrugge (1993), providing arithmetic realizations consistent with \(I \Delta_0+\Omega_1\) for a restricted class of sentences consistent with GL, the question remains open. Its answer may hinge on open problems in computational complexity theory.

The above result by De Jongh et al. shows a strong feature of provability logic: for many different arithmetical theories, GL captures exactly what those theories say about their own provability predicates. At the same time this is a weakness. For example, propositional provability logic does not point to any differences between those theories that are finitely axiomatizable and those that are not.

### 5.2 Interpretability logic

In order to be able to speak in a modal language about important distinctions between theories, researchers have extended provability logic in many different ways. Let us mention a few. One extension is to add a binary modality \(\interprets\), where for a given arithmetical theory \(T\), the modal sentence \(A \interprets B\) is meant to stand for “\(T+B\) is interpretable in \(T+A\)” (Švejdar, 1983). De Jongh and Veltman (1990) investigated modal semantics for several interpretability logics, while De Jongh and Visser (1991) proved the explicit fixed-point property for the most important ones. Visser characterized the interpretability logic of the most common finitely axiomatized theories, and Berarducci and Shavrukov independently characterized the one for PA, which is not finitely axiomatizable. It appears that indeed, the interpretability logic of finitely axiomatizable theories is different from the interpretability logic of Peano Arithmetic (see Montagna 1987; Visser 1990, 1998; Berarducci 1990, Shavrukov 1988; Joosten and Visser 2000).

### 5.3 Propositional quantifiers

Another way to extend the framework of propositional provability logic is to add propositional quantifiers, so that one can express principles like Goldfarb’s:

\[ \forall p \,\forall q \,\exists r \: \Box((\Box p \vee \Box q) \leftrightarrow \Box r), \]saying that for any two sentences there is a third sentence which is provable if and only if either of the first two sentences is provable. This principle is provable in Peano Arithmetic (see e.g. Artemov and Beklemishev 1993). The set of sentences of GL with propositional quantifiers that is arithmetically valid turns out to be undecidable (Shavrukov 1997).

### 5.4 Japaridze’s bimodal and polymodal provability logics

Japaridze’s (1988) bimodal logic GLB has two \(\Box\)-like
provability operators, denoted by \([0]\) and \([1]\), with their dual
\(\Diamond\)-like operators \(\langle 0\rangle\) and \(\langle
1\rangle\), respectively. In Japaridze’s interpretation, one can
think of \([0]\) as standing for the standard provability predicate in
Peano Arithmetic. On the other hand, \([1]\) corresponds to a stronger
provability predicate, namely \(\omega\)-*provabilty*.

Let us define the concepts that are needed to understand this intended
interpretation of GLB. An arithmetical theory \(T\) is defined to be
\(\omega\)-*consistent* if and only if for all formulas A with
free variable \(x\), \(T\vdash \neg\, A(I_n)\) for all \(n\) implies
that \(T \not\vdash \exists x \, A(x)\); here, \(I_n\) is the numeral of
\(n\), i.e., the term \(\bs\bs\ldots\bs 0\) with \(n\) occurrences of
the successor operator \(\bs\). Peano Arithmetic (PA) is the most
well-known example of an \(\omega\)-consistent theory (see also
Gödel’s incompleteness theorems).
Now let PA\(^+\) be the arithmetical theory whose axioms are those of
PA together with all sentences \(\forall x \, \neg \, A(x)\) such that for
every \(n\), PA\(\vdash \neg \, A(I_n)\). Now \(\omega\)-provability is
simply provability in PA\(^+\), so it is the dual of
\(\omega\)-consistency.

Japaridze’s bimodal provability logic GLB can be axiomatized by the axioms and rules of GL (see Section 2), formulated separately for [0] and [1]. In addition, GLB has two mixed axioms, namely: \[\tag{Monotonicity} [0] A \rightarrow [1] A \] \[\tag{\(\Pi^0_1\)-completeness} \langle 0\rangle A \rightarrow [1]\langle 0\rangle A \] Japaridze’s logic is decidable and has a reasonable Kripke semantics, and it is arithmetically sound and complete with respect to Peano Arithmetic (Japaridze 1988, Boolos 1993).

A polymodal analogue of Japaridze’s GLB, named GLP, has received a lot of attention in recent years. GLP has infinitely many \(\Box\)-like provability operators, denoted by boxes \([n]\) for every natural number \(n\), with their dual \(\Diamond\)-like operators \(\langle n\rangle\). Again, one can think of \([0]\) as standing for the standard provability predicate in Peano Arithmetic, \(\langle 1\rangle\) for \(\omega\)-provability, etcetera. GLP has been axiomatized by starting from the axioms and rules of GL (see Section 2), formulated separately for each \([n]\). In addition, GLP has three mixed axiom schemes, namely, as formulated by Beklemishev (2010): \[ [m] A \rightarrow [n] A, \mbox{ for } m \leq n \] \[ \langle k\rangle A \rightarrow [n]\langle k\rangle A, \mbox{ for } k \lt n \] \[ [m] A \rightarrow [n][m] A, \mbox{ for } m \leq n \]

GLP has recently been endowed with a Kripke semantics with respect to which it is complete, and has also been shown to be arithmetically complete with respect to Peano Arithmetic (see Beklemishev 2010a, 2011a). Just like for GL, the decision problem for GLP is PSPACE-complete (Shapirovsky 2008), while its closed fragment is polynomial time decidable (Pakhomov 2014).

In recent years a number of results have been proved about the polymodal logic GLP of strong provability predicates. Here follow some particularly fruitful topics:

- the closed fragment of GLP (see Ignatiev 1993; Beklemishev, Joosten and Vervoort 2005);
- GLP and proof-theoretic ordinals (Beklemishev 2004);
- Interpolation theorems for GLP (see Beklemishev 2010b, Shamkanov 2011);
- The relationship between topological semantics and set theory, among others particular large cardinal axioms and stationary reflection (see Beklemishev 2011b; Beklemishev and Gabelaia 2013, 2014; Fernández-Duque 2014).

### 5.5 Predicate provability logic

Finally, one can of course study predicate provability logic. The language is that of predicate logic without function symbols, together with the operator \(\Box\). Here, the situation becomes much more complex than in the case of propositional provability logic. To begin with, the straightforward quantified version of GL does not have the fixed-point property, is not complete with respect to any class of Kripke frames, and is not arithmetically complete with respect to Peano Arithmetic (Montagna, 1984). The question then arises: Is there any nicely axiomatized predicate provability logic that is adequate, proving exactly the valid principles of provability? The answer is unfortunately a resounding no: Vardanyan (1986) has proved on the basis of ideas by Artemov (1985a) that the set of sentences of predicate provability logic all of whose realizations are provable in PA is not even recursively enumerable but \(\Pi^0_2\)-complete, so it has no reasonable axiomatization. Visser and De Jonge (2006) showed that there is no escape from Vardanyan’s theorem by proving a generalization: For a wide range of arithmetical theories \(T\), the set of sentences of predicate provability logic all of whose realizations are provable in \(T\) turns out to be \(\Pi^0_2\)-complete as well.

### 5.6 Other generalizations

Left out in the above discussion are many other important strands of research in provability logic and its extensions. The interested reader is pointed to the following areas:

- the provability logic of intuitionistic arithmetic (see Troelstra 1973; Visser 1982, 1999; Iemhoff 2000, 2001, 2003; Visser 2002, 2008);
- classification of provability logics (see Visser 1980, Artemov 1985b, Beklemishev 1989, Beklemishev et al. 1999);
- Rosser orderings and proof speed-up (see Guaspari and Solovay 1979, Švejdar 1983, Montagna 1992);
- several kinds of bimodal provability logics with provability operators for different theories (see Carlson 1986; Smoryński 1985; Beklemishev 1994, 1996);
- provability logics for standard provability combined with unusual provability predicates externally enumerating PA, such as Feferman’s and Parikh’s provability predicates and slow provability predicates (see Montagna 1978; Visser 1989; Shavrukov 1994; Lindström 1994, 2006; Henk and Pakhomov 2016 (Other Internet Resources));
- the logic of explicit proofs (see Artemov 1994, 2001; Artemov and Montagna 1994; Artemov and Iemhoff 2007);
- applications of provability logic in proof theory (see Beklemishev 1999, 2004, 2005, 2006);
- positive provability logics and reflection calculus (see Beklemishev 2012, 2014; Dashkov 2012);
- generalizations of the polymodal provability logic GLP, namely provability logics with transfinitely many modalities (see Beklemishev et al. 2014; Fernández-Duque and Joosten 2013a, 2013b, 2013 (Other Internet Resources), 2014);
- relations between provability logic and the \(\mu\)-calculus (see van Benthem 2006, Visser 2005, Alberucci and Facchini 2009); and
- provability algebras, also called diagonalizable algebras or Magari algebras (see Magari 1975a, 1975b; Montagna 1979, 1980a, 1980b; Shavrukov 1993a, 1993b, 1997; Zambella 1994; for recent results on their elementary theories, see Pakhomov 2012, 2014 (Other Internet Resources), 2015 (Other Internet Resources)).

## 6. Philosophical significance

Even though propositional provability logic is a modal logic with a kind of “necessity” operator, it withstands Quine’s (1976) controversial critique of modal notions as unintelligible, already because of its clear and unambiguous arithmetic interpretation. For example, unlike for many other modal logics, formulas with nested modalities like \(\Box\Diamond p \rightarrow \Box\bot\) are not problematic, nor are there any disputes about which ones should be tautologies. In fact, provability logic embodies all the desiderata that Quine (1953) set out for syntactic treatments of modality.

Quine’s main arrows were pointed towards modal predicate logics,
especially the construction of sentences that contain modal operators
under the scope of quantifiers (“quantifying in”). In
predicate provability logic, however, where quantifiers range over
natural numbers, both *de dicto* and *de re* modalities
have straightforward interpretations, contrary to the case of other
modal logics (see the note on the
*de dicto* / *de re* distinction).
For example, formulas like

are not at all problematic. If the number \(n\) is assigned to \(x\), then \(\Box \,\exists y\,(y = x)\) is true with respect to this assignment iff the sentence \(\exists y\,(y=I_n)\) is provable in Peano Arithmetic; here, \(I_n\) is the numeral of \(n\), i.e., the term \(\bs\bs\ldots\bs 0\) with \(n\) occurrences of the successor operator \(\bs\). This sentence is true for all \(n\) in the standard model of the natural numbers, and \(\forall x \,\Box\, \exists y \,(y = x)\) is even provable in Peano Arithmetic.

By the way, the Barcan Formula

\[ \forall x \,\Box\, A(x) \rightarrow \Box\, \forall x\, A(x) \]is not true for the integers, let alone provable (for example, take for \(A(x)\) the formula “\(x\) does not code a proof of \(\bot\)”). Its converse

\[ \Box\, \forall x \, A(x) \rightarrow \forall x \, \Box\, A(x) \]on the other hand, is provable in Peano Arithmetic for any formula \(A\).

Provability logic has very different principles from other modal logics, even those with a seemingly similar purpose. For example, while provability logic captures provability in formal theories of arithmetic, epistemic logic endeavors to describe knowledge, which could be viewed as a kind of informal provability. In many versions of epistemic logic, one of the most important principles is the truth axiom (5):

\[ \mbox{S5} \vdash \Box A \rightarrow A, (\text{if one knows } A, \text{ then } A \text{ is true}). \]The analogous principle clearly does not hold for GL: after all,

\[ \text{if } \GL \vdash \Box A \rightarrow A, \text{ then } \GL \vdash A. \]Thus, it seems misguided to compare the strength of both notions or to combine them in one modal system. Perhaps formal provability is indeed in some sense a stronger notion than informal provability, but definitely this is not an arithmetic truth or validity, nor is the other direction. Discussions of the consequences of Gödel’s incompleteness theorems sometimes involve confusion around the notion of provability, giving rise to claims that humans could beat formal systems in “knowing” theorems (see Davis (1990, 1993) for good discussions of such claims).

All in all, formal provability is a precisely defined concept, much more so than truth and knowledge. Thus, self-reference within the scope of provability does not lead to semantic paradoxes like the Liar. Instead, it has led to some of the most important results about mathematics, such as Gödel’s incompleteness theorems.

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### Propositional quantifiers

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### Predicate provability logic

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### Other generalizations

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### Philosophical significance

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## Other Internet Resources

### Papers and Presentations

- Fernández-Duque, D. and J.J. Joosten, 2013, “The Omega-rule Interpretation of Transfinite Provability Logic,” online manuscript at arxiv.org.
- Henk, P., and Pakhomov, F., 2016, “Slow and Ordinary Provability for Peano Arithmetic,” manuscript at arxiv.org.
- Pakhomov, F., 2014, “On Elementary Theories of GLP-algebras,” manuscript at arxiv.org.
- Pakhomov, F., 2015, “On Elementary Theories of Ordinal Notation Systems based on Reflection Principles,” manuscript at arxiv.org.
- Visser, Albert, On formal provability versus human provability (in Dutch), online manuscript, University of Utrecht.
- Verbrugge, Rineke, Presentation slides on provability logic, slides, University of Groningen

### Other Sites

- Open problems in Provability Logic, maintained by Lev Beklemishev
- Mailing list Foundations of Mathematics, New York University

### Acknowledgments

I would like to express my immense gratitude to Lev Beklemishev, who was so kind as to write me a long letter including many literature references to recent developments in provability logic as seen from his perspective; it was a great pleasure to read about all these intriguing new developments. Thanks are also due to Albert Visser, Sara Uckelman, Rajeev Goré, Giovanni Sambin, Vítek Švejdar, and Sara Negri for their suggestions of improvements and additions.

This 2017 version of the article on provability logic is dedicated to the memory of three Nestors of provability logic and the meta-mathematics of first-order arithmetic: Franco Montagna (1948-2015), Sol Feferman (1928-2016), and Petr Hájek (1940-2016).