Supplement to Philosophy of Linguistics
Emergentists tend to follow Edward Sapir in taking an interest in interlinguistic and intralinguistic variation. Linguistic anthropologists have explicitly taken up the task of defending a famous claim associated with Sapir that connects linguistic variation to differences in thinking and cognition more generally. The claim is very often referred to as the Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis (though this is a largely infelicitous label, as we shall see).
This topic is closely related to various forms of relativism—epistemological, ontological, conceptual, and moral—and its general outlines are discussed elsewhere in this encyclopedia; see the section on language in the Summer 2015 archived version of the entry on relativism (§3.1). Cultural versions of moral relativism suggest that, given how much cultures differ, what is moral for you might depend on the culture you were brought up in. A somewhat analogous view would suggest that, given how much language structures differ, what is thinkable for you might depend on the language you use. (This is actually a kind of conceptual relativism, but it is generally called linguistic relativism, and we will continue that practice.)
Even a brief skim of the vast literature on the topic is not remotely plausible in this article; and the primary literature is in any case more often polemical than enlightening. It certainly holds no general answer to what science has discovered about the influences of language on thought. Here we offer just a limited discussion of the alleged hypothesis and the rhetoric used in discussing it, the vapid and not so vapid forms it takes, and the prospects for actually devising testable scientific hypotheses about the influence of language on thought.
Whorf himself did not offer a hypothesis. He presented his “new principle of linguistic relativity” (Whorf 1956: 214) as a fact discovered by linguistic analysis:
When linguists became able to examine critically and scientifically a large number of languages of widely different patterns, their base of reference was expanded; they experienced an interruption of phenomena hitherto held universal, and a whole new order of significances came into their ken. It was found that the background linguistic system (in other words, the grammar) of each language is not merely a reproducing instrument for voicing ideas but rather is itself the shaper of ideas, the program and guide for the individual’s mental activity, for his analysis of impressions, for his synthesis of his mental stock in trade. Formulation of ideas is not an independent process, strictly rational in the old sense, but is part of a particular grammar, and differs, from slightly to greatly, between different grammars. We dissect nature along lines laid down by our native languages. The categories and types that we isolate from the world of phenomena we do not find there because they stare every observer in the face; on the contrary, the world is presented in a kaleidoscopic flux of impressions which has to be organized by our minds—and this means largely by the linguistic systems in our minds. We cut nature up, organize it into concepts, and ascribe significances as we do, largely because we are parties to an agreement to organize it in this way—an agreement that holds throughout our speech community and is codified in the patterns of our language. The agreement is, of course, an implicit and unstated one, but its terms are absolutely obligatory; we cannot talk at all except by subscribing to the organization and classification of data which the agreement decrees. (Whorf 1956: 212–214; emphasis in original)
Later, Whorf’s speculations about the “sensuously and operationally different” character of different snow types for “an Eskimo” (Whorf 1956: 216) developed into a familiar journalistic meme about the Inuit having dozens or scores or hundreds of words for snow; but few who repeat that urban legend recall Whorf’s emphasis on its being grammar, rather than lexicon, that cuts up and organizes nature for us.
In an article written in 1937, posthumously published in an academic journal (Whorf 1956: 87–101), Whorf clarifies what is most important about the effects of language on thought and world-view. He distinguishes ‘phenotypes’, which are overt grammatical categories typically indicated by morphemic markers, from what he called ‘cryptotypes’, which are covert grammatical categories, marked only implicitly by distributional patterns in a language that are not immediately apparent. In English, the past tense would be an example of a phenotype (it is marked by the -ed suffix in all regular verbs). Gender in personal names and common nouns would be an example of a cryptotype, not systematically marked by anything. In a cryptotype, “class membership of the word is not apparent until there is a question of using it or referring to it in one of these special types of sentence, and then we find that this word belongs to a class requiring some sort of distinctive treatment, which may even be the negative treatment of excluding that type of sentence” (p. 89).
Whorf’s point is the familiar one that linguistic structure is comprised, in part, of distributional patterns in language use that are not explicitly marked. What follows from this, according to Whorf, is not that the existing lexemes in a language (like its words for snow) comprise covert linguistic structure, but that patterns shared by word classes constitute linguistic structure. In ‘Language, mind, and reality’ (1942; published posthumously in Theosophist, a magazine published in India for the followers of the 19th-century spiritualist Helena Blavatsky) he wrote:
Because of the systematic, configurative nature of higher mind, the “patternment” aspect of language always overrides and controls the “lexation”…or name-giving aspect. Hence the meanings of specific words are less important than we fondly fancy. Sentences, not words, are the essence of speech, just as equations and functions, and not bare numbers, are the real meat of mathematics. We are all mistaken in our common belief that any word has an “exact meaning.” We have seen that the higher mind deals in symbols that have no fixed reference to anything, but are like blank checks, to be filled in as required, that stand for “any value” of a given variable, like …the x, y, z of algebra. (Whorf 1942: 258)
Whorf apparently thought that only personal and proper names have an exact meaning or reference (Whorf 1956: 259).
For Whorf, it was an unquestionable fact that language influences thought to some degree:
Actually, thinking is most mysterious, and by far the greatest light upon it that we have is thrown by the study of language. This study shows that the forms of a person’s thoughts are controlled by inexorable laws of pattern of which he is unconscious. These patterns are the unperceived intricate systematizations of his own language—shown readily enough by a candid comparison and contrast with other languages, especially those of a different linguistic family. His thinking itself is in a language—in English, in Sanskrit, in Chinese. [footnote omitted] And every language is a vast pattern-system, different from others, in which are culturally ordained the forms and categories by which the personality not only communicates, but analyzes nature, notices or neglects types of relationship and phenomena, channels his reasoning, and builds the house of his consciousness. (Whorf 1956: 252)
He seems to regard it as necessarily true that language affects thought, given
- the fact that language must be used in order to think, and
- the facts about language structure that linguistic analysis discovers.
He also seems to presume that the only structure and logic that thought has is grammatical structure. These views are not the ones that after Whorf’s death came to be known as ‘the Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis’ (a sobriquet due to Hoijer 1954). Nor are they what was called the ‘Whorf thesis’ by Brown and Lenneberg (1954) which was concerned with the relation of obligatory lexical distinctions and thought. Brown and Lenneberg (1954) investigated this question by looking at the relation of color terminology in a language and the classificatory abilities of the speakers of that language. The issue of the relation between obligatory lexical distinctions and thought is at the heart of what is now called ‘the Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis’ or ‘the Whorf Hypothesis’ or ‘Whorfianism’.
No one is going to be impressed with a claim that some aspect of your language may affect how you think in some way or other; that is neither a philosophical thesis nor a psychological hypothesis. So it is appropriate to set aside entirely the kind of so-called hypotheses that Steven Pinker presents in The Stuff of Thought (2007: 126–128) as “five banal versions of the Whorfian hypothesis”:
- “Language affects thought because we get much of our knowledge through reading and conversation.”
- “A sentence can frame an event, affecting the way people construe it.”
- “The stock of words in a language reflects the kinds of things its speakers deal with in their lives and hence think about.”
- “[I]f one uses the word language in a loose way to refer to meanings,… then language is thought.”
- “When people think about an entity, among the many attributes they can think about is its name.”
These are just truisms, unrelated to any serious issue about linguistic relativism.
We should also set aside some methodological versions of linguistic relativism discussed in anthropology. It may be excellent advice to a budding anthropologist to be aware of linguistic diversity, and to be on the lookout for ways in which your language may affect your judgment of other cultures; but such advice does not constitute a hypothesis.
The term “Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis” was coined by Harry Hoijer in his contribution (Hoijer 1954) to a conference on the work of Benjamin Lee Whorf in 1953. But anyone looking in Hoijer’s paper for a clear statement of the hypothesis will look in vain. Curiously, despite his stated intent “to review and clarify the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis” (1954: 93), Hoijer did not even attempt to state it. The closest he came was this:
The central idea of the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis is that language functions, not simply as a device for reporting experience, but also, and more significantly, as a way of defining experience for its speakers.
The claim that “language functions…as a way of defining experience” appears to be offered as a kind of vague metaphysical insight rather than either a statement of linguistic relativism or a testable hypothesis.
And if Hoijer seriously meant that what qualitative experiences a speaker can have are constituted by that speaker’s language, then surely the claim is false. There is no reason to doubt that non-linguistic sentient creatures like cats can experience (for example) pain or heat or hunger, so having a language is not a necessary condition for having experiences. And it is surely not sufficient either: a robot with a sophisticated natural language processing capacity could be designed without the capacity for conscious experience.
In short, it is a mystery what Hoijer meant by his “central idea”.
Vague remarks of the same loosely metaphysical sort have continued to be a feature of the literature down to the present. The statements made in some recent papers, even in respected refereed journals, contain non-sequiturs echoing some of the remarks of Sapir, Whorf, and Hoijer. And they come from both sides of the debate.
Lila Gleitman is an Essentialist on the other side of the contemporary debate: she is against linguistic relativism, and against the broadly Whorfian work of Stephen Levinson’s group at the Max Planck Institute for Psycholinguistics. In the context of criticizing a particular research design, Li and Gleitman (2002) quote Whorf’s claim that “language is the factor that limits free plasticity and rigidifies channels of development”. But in the claim cited, Whorf seems to be talking about the psychological topic that holds universally of human conceptual development, not claiming that linguistic relativism is true.
Li and Gleitman then claim (p. 266) that such (Whorfian) views “have diminished considerably in academic favor” in part because of “the universalist position of Chomskian linguistics, with its potential for explaining the striking similarity of language learning in children all over the world.” But there is no clear conflict or even a conceptual connection between Whorf’s views about language placing limits on developmental plasticity, and Chomsky’s thesis of an innate universal architecture for syntax. In short, there is no reason why Chomsky’s I-languages could not be innately constrained, but (once acquired) cognitively and developmentally constraining.
For example, the supposedly deep linguistic universal of ‘recursion’ (Hauser et al. 2002) is surely quite independent of whether the inventory of colour-name lexemes in your language influences the speed with which you can discriminate between color chips. And conversely, universal tendencies in color naming across languages (Kay and Regier 2006) do not show that color-naming differences among languages are without effect on categorical perception (Thierry et al. 2009).
One of the first linguists to defend a general form of universalism against linguistic relativism, thus presupposing that they conflict, was Julia Penn (1972). She was also an early popularizer of the distinction between ‘strong’ and ‘weak’ formulations of the Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis (and an opponent of the ‘strong’ version).
‘Weak’ versions of Whorfianism state that language influences or defeasibly shapes thought. ‘Strong’ versions state that language determines thought, or fixes it in some way. The weak versions are commonly dismissed as banal (because of course there must be some influence), and the stronger versions as implausible.
The weak versions are considered banal because they are not adequately formulated as testable hypotheses that could conflict with relevant evidence about language and thought.
Why would the strong versions be thought implausible? For a language to make us think in a particular way, it might seem that it must at least temporarily prevent us from thinking in other ways, and thus make some thoughts not only inexpressible but unthinkable. If this were true, then strong Whorfianism would conflict with the Katzian effability claim. There would be thoughts that a person couldn’t think because of the language(s) they speak.
Some are fascinated by the idea that there are inaccessible thoughts; and the notion that learning a new language gives access to entirely new thoughts and concepts seems to be a staple of popular writing about the virtues of learning languages. But many scientists and philosophers intuitively rebel against violations of effability: thinking about concepts that no one has yet named is part of their job description.
The resolution lies in seeing that the language could affect certain aspects of our cognitive functioning without making certain thoughts unthinkable for us.
For example, Greek has separate terms for what we call light blue and dark blue, and no word meaning what ‘blue’ means in English: Greek forces a choice on this distinction. Experiments have shown (Thierry et al. 2009) that native speakers of Greek react faster when categorizing light blue and dark blue color chips—apparently a genuine effect of language on thought. But that does not make English speakers blind to the distinction, or imply that Greek speakers cannot grasp the idea of a hue falling somewhere between green and violet in the spectrum.
There is no general or global ineffability problem. There is, though, a peculiar aspect of strong Whorfian claims, giving them a local analog of ineffability: the content of such a claim cannot be expressed in any language it is true of. This does not make the claims self-undermining (as with the standard objections to relativism); it doesn’t even mean that they are untestable. They are somewhat anomalous, but nothing follows concerning the speakers of the language in question (except that they cannot state the hypothesis using the basic vocabulary and grammar that they ordinarily use).
If there were a true hypothesis about the limits that basic English vocabulary and constructions puts on what English speakers can think, the hypothesis would turn out to be inexpressible in English, using basic vocabulary and the usual repertoire of constructions. That might mean it would be hard for us to discuss it in an article in English unless we used terminological innovations or syntactic workarounds. But that doesn’t imply anything about English speakers’ ability to grasp concepts, or to develop new ways of expressing them by coining new words or elaborated syntax.
A number of considerations are relevant to formulating, testing, and evaluating Whorfian hypotheses.
Genuine hypotheses about the effects of language on thought will always have a duality: there will be a linguistic part and a non-linguistic one. The linguistic part will involve a claim that some feature is present in one language but absent in another.
Whorf himself saw that it was only obligatory features of languages that established “mental patterns” or “habitual thought” (Whorf 1956: 139), since if it were optional then the speaker could optionally do it one way or do it the other way. And so this would not be a case of “constraining the conceptual structure”. So we will likewise restrict our attention to obligatory features here.
Examples of relevant obligatory features would include lexical distinctions like the light vs. dark blue forced choice in Greek, or the forced choice between “in (fitting tightly)” vs. “in (fitting loosely)” in Korean. They also include grammatical distinctions like the forced choice in Spanish 2nd-person pronouns between informal/intimate and formal/distant (informal tú vs. formal usted in the singular; informal vosotros vs. formal ustedes in the plural), or the forced choice in Tamil 1st-person plural pronouns between inclusive (“we = me and you and perhaps others”) and exclusive (“we = me and others not including you”).
The non-linguistic part of a Whorfian hypothesis will contrast the psychological effects that habitually using the two languages has on their speakers. For example, one might conjecture that the habitual use of Spanish induces its speakers to be sensitive to the formal and informal character of the speaker’s relationship with their interlocutor while habitually using English does not.
So testing Whorfian hypotheses requires testing two independent hypotheses with the appropriate kinds of data. In consequence, evaluating them requires the expertise of both linguistics and psychology, and is a multidisciplinary enterprise. Clearly, the linguistic hypothesis may hold up where the psychological hypothesis does not, or conversely.
In addition, if linguists discovered that some linguistic feature was optional in two different languages, then even if psychological experiments showed differences between the two populations of speakers, this would not show linguistic determination or influence. The cognitive differences might depend on (say) cultural differences.
A further important consideration concerns the strength of the inducement relationship that a Whorfian hypothesis posits between a speaker’s language and their non-linguistic capacities. The claim that your language shapes or influences your cognition is quite different from the claim that your language makes certain kinds of cognition impossible (or obligatory) for you. The strength of any Whorfian hypothesis will vary depending on the kind of relationship being claimed, and the ease of revisability of that relation.
A testable Whorfian hypothesis will have a schematic form something like this:
- Linguistic part: Feature F is obligatory in L1 but optional in L2.
- Psychological part: Speaking a language with obligatory feature F bears relation R to the cognitive effect C.
The relation R might in principle be causation or determination, but it is important to see that it might merely be correlation, or slight favoring; and the non-linguistic cognitive effect C might be readily suppressible or revisable.
Dan Slobin (1996) presents a view that competes with Whorfian hypotheses as standardly understood. He hypothesizes that when the speakers are using their cognitive abilities in the service of a linguistic ability (speaking, writing, translating, etc.), the language they are planning to use to express their thought will have a temporary online effect on how they express their thought. The claim is that as long as language users are thinking in order to frame their speech or writing or translation in some language, the mandatory features of that language will influence the way they think.
On Slobin’s view, these effects quickly attenuate as soon as the activity of thinking for speaking ends. For example, if a speaker is thinking for writing in Spanish, then Slobin’s hypothesis would predict that given the obligatory formal/informal 2nd-person pronoun distinction they would pay greater attention to the formal/informal character of their social relationships with their audience than if they were writing in English. But this effect is not permanent. As soon as they stop thinking for speaking, the effect of Spanish on their thought ends.
Slobin’s non-Whorfian linguistic relativist hypothesis raises the importance of psychological research on bilinguals or people who currently use two or more languages with a native or near-native facility. This is because one clear way to test Slobin-like hypotheses relative to Whorfian hypotheses would be to find out whether language correlated non-linguistic cognitive differences between speakers hold for bilinguals only when are thinking for speaking in one language, but not when they are thinking for speaking in some other language. If the relevant cognitive differences appeared and disappeared depending on which language speakers were planning to express themselves in, it would go some way to vindicate Slobin-like hypotheses over more traditional Whorfian Hypotheses. Of course, one could alternately accept a broadening of Whorfian hypotheses to include Slobin-like evanescent effects. Either way, attention must be paid to the persistence and revisability of the linguistic effects.
Kousta et al. (2008) shows that “for bilinguals there is intraspeaker relativity in semantic representations and, therefore, [grammatical] gender does not have a conceptual, non-linguistic effect” (843). Grammatical gender is obligatory in the languages in which it occurs and has been claimed by Whorfians to have persistent and enduring non-linguistic effects on representations of objects (Boroditsky et al. 2003). However, Kousta et al. supports the claim that bilinguals’ semantic representations vary depending on which language they are using, and thus have transient effects. This suggests that although some semantic representations of objects may vary from language to language, their non-linguistic cognitive effects are transitory.
Some advocates of Whorfianism have held that if Whorfian hypotheses were true, then meaning would be globally and radically indeterminate. Thus, the truth of Whorfian hypotheses is equated with global linguistic relativism—a well known self-undermining form of relativism. But as we have seen, not all Whorfian hypotheses are global hypotheses: they are about what is induced by particular linguistic features. And the associated non-linguistic perceptual and cognitive differences can be quite small, perhaps insignificant. For example, Thierry et al. (2009) provides evidence that an obligatory lexical distinction between light and dark blue affects Greek speakers’ color perception in the left hemisphere only. And the question of the degree to which this affects sensuous experience is not addressed.
The fact that Whorfian hypotheses need not be global linguistic relativist hypotheses means that they do not conflict with the claim that there are language universals. Structuralists of the first half of the 20th century tended to disfavor the idea of universals: Martin Joos’s characterization of structuralist linguistics as claiming that “languages can differ without limit as to either extent or direction” (Joos 1966, 228) has been much quoted in this connection. If the claim that languages can vary without limit were conjoined with the claim that languages have significant and permanent effects on the concepts and worldview of their speakers, a truly profound global linguistic relativism would result. But neither conjunct should be accepted. Joos’s remark is regarded by nearly all linguists today as overstated (and merely a caricature of the structuralists), and Whorfian hypotheses do not have to take a global or deterministic form.
John Lucy, a conscientious and conservative researcher of Whorfian hypotheses, has remarked:
We still know little about the connections between particular language patterns and mental life—let alone how they operate or how significant they are…a mere handful of empirical studies address the linguistic relativity proposal directly and nearly all are conceptually flawed. (Lucy 1996, 37)
Although further empirical studies on Whorfian hypotheses have been completed since Lucy published his 1996 review article, it is hard to find any that have satisfied the criteria of:
- adequately utilizing both the relevant linguistic and psychological research,
- focusing on obligatory rather than optional linguistic features,
- stating hypotheses in a clear testable way, and
- ruling out relevant competing Slobin-like hypotheses.
There is much important work yet to be done on testing the range of Whorfian hypotheses and other forms of linguistic conceptual relativism, and on understanding the significance of any Whorfian hypotheses that turn out to be well supported.