Location and Mereology
Substantivalists believe that there are regions of space or spacetime. Many substantivalists also believe that there are entities (people, tables, electrons, fields, holes, events, tropes, universals, …) that are located at regions. For these philosophers, questions arise about the relationship between located entities and the regions at which they are located. Are located entities identical to their locations, as supersubstantivalists maintain? Are they entirely separate from their locations, in the sense that they share no parts with them?
Without yet taking a stance on these metaphysical questions, some philosophers have tried to formulate a minimal core of ‘conceptual’ truths governing the location relation and its interaction with parthood and other mereological relations. Two overarching questions arise. In what ways (if any) must the mereological structure of a located entity mirror the mereological structure of its location? And in what ways (if any) must the mereological relationships between some things mirror the mereological relationships between the locations of those things?
Recent philosophical literature in this area focuses largely on three questions, each corresponding to a different way in which the relevant mirroring might fail:
- Is interpenetration possible? That is, can entities that do not share parts be exactly located in regions that do share parts?
- Are extended simples possible?
- Is multilocation possible? That is, is it possible for an entity to be exactly located in more than one spacetime region, or in more than one region of space at the same time?
The present article takes on these questions and addresses a number of other issues along the way.
- 1. Preliminaries
- 2. Which location relation is fundamental?
- 3. Mereological Harmony
- 4. Interpenetration
- 5. Extended Simples
- 5.1 For Extended Simples #1: from Conceivability
- 5.2 For Extended Simples #2: from Universals or Tropes
- 5.3 For Extended Simples #3: from String Theory
- 5.4 For Extended Simples #4: from Recombination
- 5.5 Against Extended Simples #1: Supersubstantivalism
- 5.6 Against Extended Simples #2: from Qualitative Variation
- 6. Multilocation
- 7. Further Issues
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In keeping with the recent literature, this article will focus on ‘entity-to-region’ location relations—i.e., location relations that paradigmatically hold between entities and regions. We will ignore location relations that hold between entities and what seem to be nonregions. (Consider ‘the transmitter is located at the top of the ridge’. Prima facie, neither the transmitter nor the top of the ridge is a region.)
Since our focus is on entity-to-region location relations, we will work under the following controversial but popular assumption:
- Substantivalism There are such entities as regions.
Unless otherwise noted, we will assume that the regions in question are spacetime regions, where these are thought of in accordance with the traditional ‘Block Universe’ picture, as captured by the following:
- Eternalism The past, present, and future are all equally real.
- The B-theory of Time No time is present in any absolute, not-merely-indexical sense.
- The Spacetime View There is just one fundamental spatiotemporal arena: spacetime. Instants and intervals of time, if there are such things, are just spacetime regions of certain sorts. Likewise for points and regions of space.
Relatively little depends upon (2)–(4), however. If one dislikes talk of spacetime, one should be able reinterpret most of what we say here in terms of regions of space without loss of plausibility. Further, we assume that
- Subregions as Parts If x and y are both regions, then x is a subregion of y if and only if x is a part of y.
(5) contrasts with another fairly common view according to which regions are sets of points and have their subregions as subsets.
We make the following assumptions about parthood, where ‘x is a part of y’ is symbolized ‘P(x,y)’:
- Reflexivity of Parthood
Each thing is a part of itself.
- Transitivity of Parthood
If x is a part of y and y is a part of z, then x is a part of z.
We will also find it convenient to have predicates for overlapping, disjointness, proper parthood, simplicity, complexity, gunkiness, and mereological coincidence. We define them as follows:
=df ∃z[P(z, x)
& P(z, y)]
‘overlaps’ means ‘shares a part with’
=df ¬O(x, y)
‘x is disjoint from y’ means ‘x does not overlap y’
- Proper Parthood
=df P(x, y)
‘x is a proper part of y’ means ‘x is a part of but not identical to y’
=df ¬∃yPP(y, x)
‘x is simple’ (or ‘x is a simple’) means ‘x doesn't have any proper parts’
‘x is complex’ means ‘x is not simple’
=df ∀y[P(y, x)
‘x is gunky’ means ‘each part of x (itself included) is complex’
=df ∀z[O(x, z)
‘x mereologically coincides with y’ means ‘x overlaps exactly the same things as y’
Finally, we will treat the expressions ‘x is composed of the ys’, ‘x is a sum of the ys’, and, ‘x is a fusion of the ys’ as meaning ‘each of the ys is a part of x and each part of x overlaps at least one of the ys.’
As the above remarks suggest, we will operate under the assumptions
- that there is just one fundamental parthood relation, and
- that this relation holds both among regions (one region can be a part of another region) and among entities that are located at regions (one material object, e.g., can be a part of another material object), and
- that it is a two-place relation that does not ‘hold relative to’ times, regions or sortals.
All these assumptions are controversial. Some philosophers have explored the view that the fundamental parthood relation is three-place (Thomson 1983; Hudson 2001; Balashov 2008; Donnelly 2010) or four-place (Gilmore 2009; Kleinschmidt 2011) (for more on the latter, see Section 3.2 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments). Others have defended the view that one fundamental parthood relation holds between regions, another between material objects (McDaniel 2004, 2009).
This entry addresses questions framed in terms of modal notions. Are extended simples possible? Is it necessary that nothing is multilocated? All talk of possibility and necessity in what follows should be understood as talk of metaphysical possibility and metaphysical necessity, respectively. In keeping with current orthodoxy, we assume that being metaphysically necessary (a property of propositions or sentences) is not to be identified with being a logical truth, being an analytic truth, being a conceptual truth, or being an a priori truth. Although metaphysical necessity is not identified with conceptual truth—and, correlatively, metaphysical possibility is not identified with conceivability—one might still think that conceivability (or something in that vicinity) provides prima facie evidence for metaphysical possibility. I leave open the question of whether the laws of nature are metaphysically necessary, but I take it that the standard answer is ‘No’.
One final preliminary. For better or worse, the recent literature on location and mereology tends to set aside complications arising from vagueness and indeterminacy. We will do the same.
Debates about location have been framed in terms of two main locational predicates: ‘is exactly located at’ and ‘is weakly located at’. Philosophers tend to agree about how these predicates apply in particular cases, and they tend to agree that one of these predicates should be taken as primitive and used to define the other. But there is disagreement about which to define and which to take as primitive.
Here is a typical intuitive gloss for ‘is exactly located at’: a entity x is exactly located at a region y if and only if x has (or has-at-y) exactly the same shape and size as y and stands (or stands-at-y) in all the same spatial or spatiotemporal relations to other entities as does y. Thus, small cubes are exactly located only at small cubical regions, large spheres are exactly located only at large spherical regions, and so on (see Casati and Varzi 1999: 119–120; Bittner, Donnelly, and Smith 2004; Gilmore 2006: 200–202; Sattig 2006: 48).
Here is a typical intuitive gloss for ‘is weakly located at’: an entity x is weakly located at a region y if and only if y is ‘not completely free of’ x (Parsons 2007: 203). Thus I am weakly located at a certain region, r, whose shape, size, and position perfectly match my own, I am weakly located at the bottom half of that region, I am weakly located at a certain much larger region, r+, that has r as a proper part, and I am weakly located at a certain scattered region, r*, that's made up of the bottom half of r together with a small region somewhere in Siberia. In short, if r is the one and only region at which I am exactly located, then I am weakly located at just those regions that overlap r.
Figure 1 illustrates exact location and weak location. The dotted lines indicate regions (r1–r5). The shaded circle indicates a disc-shaped object, d, that is located at regions. In the diagram, d is exactly located at r4 but not at r1, r2, r3, or r5, and d is weakly located at r2, r3, r4, and r5 but not at r1.
Assuming that we now grasp the intended relations, we are in a position to consider proposals about how the associated predicates might be defined. Suppose that we take ‘x is exactly located at y’ as primitive and symbolize it as ‘L(x, y)’ (Casati and Varzi 1999). Then, as Parsons (2007: 204) notes, the following definition of ‘is weakly located at’ (‘WKL’) is natural:
- Weak Location
=df ∃z[L(x, z)
& O(z, y)]
‘x is weakly located at y’ means ‘x has an exact location that overlaps y’
One immediate consequence of (D2) is that it makes the following principle
∀x∀y[WKL(x, y) → ∃zL(x, z)]
If a thing is weakly located somewhere, then it's exactly located somewhere.
an analytic truth (Parsons 2007). This might be seen as a drawback, for the following reason among others (Gilmore 2006: 203; Parsons 2007: 207–9). One might think that the following situation is possible:
- all regions are extended and gunky and decompose into smaller (but still extended and still gunky) regions,
- some located entities are point-like and unextended, and
- entities are located only at regions.
A point-like entity will be too small to be exactly located in any extended region, but presumably it should still be weakly located at many regions—viz., each in a series of nested regions that ‘converge’ on the point-like entity. Thus, if it's possible that (i)–(iii) are all true, then it's possible that, contrary to Exactness, a thing is weakly located somewhere without being exactly located anywhere.
On the other hand, suppose that we take ‘WKL’ as primitive. How might we use this predicate to define ‘L’? This is less obvious, but the definition that Parsons (2007: 205) proposes is
- Exact Location
=df ∀z[WKL(x, z)
↔ O(y, z)]
‘x is exactly located at y’ means ‘x is weakly located at all and only those entities that overlap y’
To see how this definition works, return to the object d in Figure 1. We want it to turn out that d is exactly located at r4 and nowhere else. Given the natural assumptions about which regions are parts of which, (D9) delivers the desired verdicts.
For example, (D9) tells us that d is not exactly located at r3, for the reason that r3 overlaps certain regions (e.g., r1) at which d is not weakly located. In other words, r3 ‘overlaps regions it shouldn't’. The situation with r5 is reversed. (D9) tells us that d is not exactly located at r5, for the reason that there are regions at which d is weakly located (e.g., r2) that r5 does not overlap. In other words, r5 ‘fails to overlap regions it should’. Region r2 has both vices: it overlaps certain regions it shouldn't (e.g., its southeast corner), and it fails to overlap certain regions it should (e.g., r5). Region r4 has neither vice. Hence d counts as being exactly located at it, according to (D9).
One potential problem with (D9), however, is that it makes the following principle
& L(x, z))
→ CO(y, z)]
Nothing has two different exact locations, unless those locations mereologically coincide with each other.
an analytic truth. As we will see in section 7, there are many who would deny Quasi-functionality, and there are others who deny that it is necessary, analytic, or in any sense ‘conceptual’.
In the spirit of van Inwagen (1981), one might take the fundamental location relation to be lying-within, where this holds only between a mereologically simple spacetime point, on the one hand, and a located entity, on the other. One might then define exact location in terms of it, as follows: ‘x is exactly located at y’ means ‘for any z, if z is simple, then: z lies within x if and only if z is a part of y’. This has consequences similar to those of (D3). It has the additional disadvantage that, in the context of gunky spacetime, it yields the result that everything is exactly located everywhere.
Philosophers have put forward of variety of axiom systems that are meant to capture the interaction between parthood and location. One especially bold idea is that the mereological properties of, and relations between, located entities perfectly match those of their locations. This has been dubbed Mereological Harmony (Schaffer 2009).
For a collection of axioms that makes no attempt enforce Mereological Harmony, see the supplementary document on An Interpenetration-Friendly Theory of Location.
Mereological Harmony has been captured formally in different ways by Varzi (2007) and Uzquiano (2011). Raul Saucedo offers the following collection of semi-formal principles (2011: 227–228):
- x is mereologically simple iff x's location is mereologically simple.
- x is mereologically complex iff x's location is mereologically complex.
- x has exactly n parts iff x's location has exactly n parts.
- x is gunky iff x's location is gunky. …
- x is a part of y iff x's location is a subregion of y's location.
- x is a proper part of y iff x's location is a proper part of y's location.
- x and y overlap iff x's location and y's location overlap.
- The xs compose y iff the locations of the xs compose y's location.
Some philosophers apparently take Mereological Harmony to be a necessary truth (Schaffer 2009: 138). The remainder of this entry considers three separate threats to the view that Mereological Harmony is necessary: interpenetration (§4), extended simples (§5), and multilocation (§6).
(There are other threats to Mereological Harmony that we will not discuss. We will not discuss threats to H7 and H8 that arise from ‘moderate views about receptacles’, according to which only topologically open or topologically closed regions can be exact locations (see Cartwright 1975; Hudson 2005: 47–56; and especially Uzquiano 2006). Nor will we discuss the threats to H4 discussed in Uzquiano (2011).)
A case of interpenetration occurs when non-overlapping entities have overlapping exact locations—e.g., when a ghost passes through a wall. In such a case, the right-to-left direction of H7 fails. An extended simple is a simple entity with a complex exact location: it violates the left-to-right direction of H1, the right-to-left direction of the (equivalent) H2, and the left-to-right direction of the instance of H3 that results letting n = 1. A case of multilocation occurs when a given entity has more than one exact location. This violates
& L(x, z)] → y
Nothing has more than one exact location.
which is left implicit in Saucedo's statement of Mereological Harmony.
The three questions that we will consider—Is interpenetration possible? Are extended simples possible? Is multilocation possible?—are logically independent of one another. Thus there is room for eight specific packages of views. See Figure 2.
We conjecture that all but Package 5 have proponents, but we leave it as an exercise to the reader to supply the relevant citations.
It is important to note that even if interpenetration, extended simples, and multilocation are all possible, a number of substantive and interesting principles linking parthood and location may still survive. For example, the possibility of interpenetration and extended simples poses no threat to (11) or (12):
& L(x, z) & L(y, w)]
→ P(z, w)]
Necessarily, if x is a part of y, and if x is exactly located at z and y is exactly located at w, then z is a part of w: ‘the part's location is a part of the whole's location’.
& L(x, y) & P(z, y)]
→ ∃w∃u[PP(w, x)
& O(u, y)
& L(w, u)]]
Necessarily, if x is complex and is exactly located at y, then for any part z of y, some proper part w of x is weakly located at z, where ‘weakly located’ is defined via (D2).
Expansivity rules out cases like the following (Figure 3), in which the object a is a part of the object o, but a's exact location, ra, is not a part of o's exact location, r.
Ruled out by Expansitivity
The idea behind Delegation is that if x is complex, then if you stick a pin into x's exact location, you will have stuck that pin into the exact location of one of x's proper parts as well. In slightly different terms, a complex entity can't be weakly located at a certain region unless one of its proper parts—a ‘delegate’—is weakly located at that region as well.
Delegation rules out cases like the following (Figure 4), in which o* is a complex object that is exactly located at region r*, but r* has a part ra that does not overlap an exact location of any of o*'s proper parts:
Ruled out by Delegation
Neither interpenetration nor extended simples would threaten (11) or (12). Would multilocation threaten them? Gilmore (2009) argues if some entities are multilocated, then, in order to allow things to have different parts at different locations, the fundamental parthood relation will need to be a four-place relation expressed by ‘x at y is a part of z at w’. Similar ideas are independently developed in Kleinschmidt (2011). Given the four-place view, it is unclear how to understand the two-place mereological predicates that (11) and (12) employ. However, Gilmore formulates close analogues of (11) and (12) in terms of a four-place parthood predicate. The four-place analogues would appear to be unthreatened by interpenetration, extended simples, or multilocation. See Section 3.2 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments for more on the four-place view.
In this section we consider arguments for and against the following principle:
- No Interpenetration
& L(y, w) & O(z, w))
→ O(x, y)]
Necessarily, if x and y have exact locations that overlap, then x and y themselves overlap.
According to No Interpenetration, it is metaphysically impossible for entities of any type to ‘pass through one another’ without sharing parts—in the manner of a ghost passing through a solid brick wall. In other words, it is impossible for entities to ‘interpenetrate’.
There is a closely related principle that deserves some comment. Roughly put, the related principle says that, necessarily, if x's exact location is a part of y's exact location, then x is a part of y. In symbols:
- □∀x∀y∀z∀w[(L(x, z) & L(y, w) & P(z, w)) → P(x, y)]
This principle may seem to say basically the same thing as (13) but to say it more simply—using the primitive predicate ‘P’ instead of the defined predicate ‘O’. Why then focus on (13) instead of (14)?
The reason for this is that some of the opposition to (14) will stem from opposition to a purely mereological principle: Strong Supplementation. It says that if every part of x overlaps y, then x is a part of y. Those who deny this will be very likely to deny (14), but they might still be attracted to (13). Let Lump1 be a lump of clay, and let Goliath be the statue that is ‘made out of’ Lump1. One might think that every part of Goliath overlaps Lump1 (and vice versa), and that Goliath's exact location is a part of (indeed, identical to) Lump1's exact location, but that Goliath is not a part of Lump1 (Lowe 2003). In that case one will reject (14). But one might still go on to say that ‘ghostly-interpenetration-without-part-sharing’ is impossible, and hence that (13) is true. After all, Goliath and Lump1 share parts, as do Goliath's top two-thirds and Lump1's bottom two-thirds, and so on.
In general, our task here is to set aside the purely mereological controversies (see the entry on mereology) and to focus instead on the issues that are exclusively concerned with location and its interaction with parthood. Too much of the controversy over (14) arises from controversy over ‘pure mereology’. By contrast, if (13) is controversial, this is only because of what it says about the connections between parthood and location.
Immanent realists say that a universal is in some sense ‘wholly present’ in each thing that instantiates it (Bigelow 1988; O'Leary-Hawthorne and Cover 1998; Paul 2002; Newman 2002). This makes it natural to hold that disjoint universals frequently interpenetrate.
To see why, let e be an electron, and suppose that it instantiates two different universals: a certain maximally determinate mass universal, um, and a certain maximally determinate charge universal, uc. Further, suppose that e is exactly located at region r. Then it will be natural for the immanent realist to say that
- um is exactly located r as well, or at least at some region rm that has r as a part, and
- uc is exactly located at r or some region rc that has r as a part.
(If these universals are also instantiated elsewhere, then it will be debatable as to whether they are exactly located at r. Perhaps um has only one exact location—the sum of the exactly locations of its instances. Likewise for uc.) Either way, the immanent realist will say that um and uc have exact locations that overlap. But presumably um and uc do not themselves overlap. Universals such as these—perfectly natural, maximally determinate, non-structural, non-conjunctive, etc.—are typically taken to be simple, in which case they overlap only if they're identical, which they are not. A similar point can be made in terms of tropes—particular, spatiotemporally located ‘cases’ of properties or relations (Schaffer 2001). Mass tropes and charges tropes frequently interpenetrate.
Three responses to this argument are worth considering.
The first response says: so much the worse for tropes and immanent universals. This response uses a mereo-locational principle, No Interpenetration, as a premise in an argument against certain metaphysical views, namely those that posit tropes or immanent universals. Is there some reason why mereo-locational principles should not be used in this way? The principles of pure mereology are often so used. For example, David Lewis (1999: 108–110) rejects states of affairs and structural universals on the grounds that they would violate the Uniqueness of Composition, the principle that no xs have more than one mereological sum. Why not give the same status to certain mereo-locational principles? Why not, for example, say that No Interpenetration is better justified than is the view that universals or tropes are spatiotemporally located? True, it is hard to say much by way of argument for No Interpenetration. But the same can be said of various purely mereological principles, such as the Transitivity of Parthood, and this is often treated as a non-negotiable constraint that any tenable metaphysical position must obey.
The second response says that while immanent universals and/or tropes are spatiotemporal entities that are ‘in their instances’, they are not exactly located anywhere. David Armstrong writes that
Talk of the location of universals, while better than placing them in another realm, is also not quite appropriate… To talk of locating universals in space-time then emerges as a crude way of speaking. Space-time is not a box into which universals are put. Universals are constituents of states of affairs. Space-time is a conjunction of states of affairs. In that sense, universals are “in” spacetime. But they are in it as helping to constitute it. (1989: 99)
Simplified somewhat, the response holds that (i) universals are parts or constituents of entities that have exact locations, and in that sense they are ‘in their instances’, but (ii) universals do no themselves have exact locations and hence do not have overlapping exact locations. Given (ii), the universals or tropes in question no longer count as examples of interpenetration. Call this the Burying Strategy, since it ‘buries’ universals and/or tropes in located entities, rather than treating them as being located.
Here is an especially vivid instance of the Burying Strategy:
All tropes are instantaneous, spatially point-sized, and mereologically simple. All spacetime points are instantaneous, spatially point-sized, and mereologically complex. In particular, each spacetime point is a fusion of some tropes (each of which is at zero distance from each of the rest), and each trope is a part of exactly one spacetime point. Something counts as a spacetime region if and only if it is either a spacetime point or a fusion of some spacetime points. Each spacetime region is exactly located at itself and nothing else has an exact location.
On this view, tropes are parts of spacetime points and regions but they do not themselves have exact locations at all. Hence, even if two tropes are both parts of the same spacetime point, they do not interpenetrate, in our sense.
The third response to the argument from universals and tropes is to say, ‘True, universals and/or tropes can interpenetrate, but material objects can't’. This grants the argument and rejects No Interpenetration in favor of a weaker, restricted principle. If we introduce a one-place predicate, ‘M’, for ‘is a material object’, then we can state the restricted principle as
& M(y) & L(x, z)
& L(y, w)
& O(z, w))
→ O(x, y)]
Necessarily, if material objects x and y have exact locations that overlap, then x and y themselves overlap.
This response also handles potential counterexamples to (13) arising from regions, sets, events, portions of stuff, holes, spirits, and other ‘immaterial entities’ (see Sanford 1970: 76; Markosian 1998, 2004a; Hudson 2005: 4; Donnelly, Bittner, and Rosse 2006).
The next two pro-interpenetration arguments count equally against (13) and (13*), but we will continue to focus on (13) for simplicity.
Some think that it is possible for two disjoint material objects to have overlapping exact locations. Perhaps there are no actual cases of the relevant sort. Indeed, perhaps such cases are physically impossible—ruled out by the laws of nature (though see the next section). But one might still think that these cases are metaphysically possible.
After all, what is it that keeps material objects from interpenetrating in the actual world? Repulsive forces, presumably. But a standard view is that the laws governing such forces are not metaphysically necessary. And on that assumption it is natural to conclude that there are metaphysically possible worlds in which any repulsive forces that exist can be overridden in such a way as to allow material objects to interpenetrate (for more this, see Zimmerman 1996a and Sider 2000).
A similar line of thought is sometimes framed as a conceivability argument. One might take cases of interpenetration to be ‘conceivable’ or ‘intuitively possible’, and one might take this to be some prima facie evidence for their possibility. In New Essays the Human Understanding (II.xxvii.1), Leibniz writes that
we find that two shadows or two rays of light interpenetrate, and we could devise an imaginary world where bodies did the same. (1704 )
David Sanford describes such a scenario in more detail:
What imaginable circumstances would tempt us to say that two [disjoint] things were in the same place at the same time? Imagine two rectangular blocks of the same size and shape each moving along a straight path perpendicular to the other. The blocks approach the intersection of the paths at the same time, and apparently neither slows down nor changes its direction. They seem to pass right through one another, and they do this without changing with respect to colour, texture, density, etc. We want to say that we have the same two blocks with which we started. And we do not want to say that either block passed out of existence and was shortly thereafter re-created. Thus we want to say that each block moved along its path without any spatio-temporal discontinuity. And we can say this only if we admit that parts of one block simultaneously occupied the same space as parts of the other block. (1967: 37)
An objection suggests itself. Why think that, in this scenario, the blocks really are disjoint while they are passing through one another? Why not say instead that they overlap?
In response, one might just stipulate that what is under consideration are two always-disjoint blocks, and then insist that the case remains conceivable, so described.
Alternatively, one might further specify the case in such a way as to be able to argue for the blocks' disjointness. Consider a certain region, r, that is said by Sanford to the exact location of two disjoint material objects: p1 (a part of Block 1) and p2 (a part of Block 2). One might add that two incompatible properties are instantiated at r—say, having mass of 2 kg, and having mass of 3 kg—where each of these properties is such that if it is instantiated by an entity x, then it is instantiated by anything that mereologically coincides with x. Presumably this is no less conceivable (or ‘intuitively possible’ or whatever) than Sanford's original case. But in this new version of the case, it is not open to Sanford's opponent to claim that the co-located objects are identical or mereologically coincident with each other. For the region contains a 2 kg object and a 3 kg object, and no one object is identical to (or mereologically coincident with) both a 2 kg object and a 3 kg object.
One question that has been raised in the recent philosophical literature is whether contemporary physics provides us with examples of disjoint fundamental particles that have the same, or overlapping, exact locations. John Hawthorne and Gabriel Uzquiano apparently claim that the answer is ‘Yes’. They write that
particles having integral spin—otherwise known as bosons—in modern particle physics … are generally thought to be point-sized. Moreover, according to the spin statistics theorem, while fermions—point-particles with half integer spin—cannot be colocated, bosons are perfectly well able to cohabit a single spacetime point. (2011: 3–4)
Jonathan Schaffer suggests otherwise:
[a] more sophisticated treatment of these cases involves field theory. Instead of there being two bosons co-located at region r, there is a bosonic field with doubled intensity at r. (2009: 140)
Whereas Hawthorne and Uzquiano apparently take bosons to provide actual examples of interpenetration, Kris McDaniel suggests that they at least reinforce the conceivability—and prima facie possibility—of such counterexamples:
what this example shows is that [disjoint] co-located material objects are not merely conceivable, but that a tremendously detailed conception of them has been formed: [disjoint] co-located objects play a role in the interpretation of certain physical theories. It might be that at the end of the day speculative physics will postulate co-located material objects. It seems to me that we should not disregard this possibility a priori. (2007a: 240)
If one's goal, in constructing a theory of location, is to articulate the necessary and a priori truths governing location and its interaction with parthood, then even McDaniel's modest point still counts against including No Interpenetration in one's theory. For if McDaniel is right, then that principle is at best an a posteriori truth. (See Simons (1994, 2004) for further discussion of bosons and for related considerations in support of interpenetration.)
Theodore Sider (2000: 585–6), Kris McDaniel (2007a), and Raul Saucedo (2011) have all objected to No Interpenetration on the grounds that it conflicts with plausible ‘principles of recombination’. McDaniel's formulation of the objection, which is similar to Sider's, runs as follows:
The state of affairs in which [a simple] object x occupies a particular region of space R (at t) is distinct from the state of affairs in which [some other simple] object y occupies the same region (at the same time). From the fact that the first state of affairs obtains, we can infer nothing about the location of y. Both states of affairs obtain contingently. If any recombination of distinct, contingent states of affairs yields a genuine possibility, as I am inclined to hold, then there are possible worlds at which both x and y occupy R (at t). (2007a: 241)
Let o1 and o2 be two different objects, let r be a region, and consider the following states of affairs:
- o1's being simple and exactly located at r
- o2's being simple and exactly located at r
Then we can reconstruct McDaniel's argument as follows:
- Premise 1
- s1 is a contingent state of affairs.
- Premise 2
- s2 is a contingent state of affairs.
- Premise 3
- s1 is distinct from s2.
- Premise 4
- For any x and any y, if x and y are each contingent states of affairs, and if they are distinct from each other, then possibly, both x and y obtain.
- Possibly, both s1 and s2 obtain.
If it's possible for both s1 and s2 to obtain, then it's possible for a given region to be the exact location of two different simples. And since no two simples can overlap, this would mean that it's possible for disjoint things (the simples) to have identical (hence overlapping) exact locations.
Is the argument successful? As Sider and McDaniel are well aware, the term ‘distinct from’ needs to mean something other than ‘not identical to’, if the recombination principle, Premise 4, is to get off the ground. After all, the state of affairs of os being 2 kg in mass and the state of affairs of os being 3 kg in mass are both contingent, and they are not identical to each other, but presumably it is not possible that they both obtain. (Presumably it's not possible that something is both 2 kg and 3 kg in mass!)
But it is no easy matter to give ‘distinct from’ a meaning that makes Premises 3 and 4 simultaneously plausible. If it means ‘shares no parts or constituents with’, then Premise 4 avoids the counterexample given above, but Premise 3 ceases to be plausible, since s1 and s2 do plausibly share a constituent, namely r. If ‘s is distinct from s*’ is defined as ‘(i) possibly, s obtains and s* does not, (ii) possibly, s does not obtain and s does, (iii) possibly, neither s nor s* obtains, and (iv) possibly, both s and s* obtain’, then Premise 4 is trivially true, but Premise 3 begs the question.
For additional arguments in favor of interpenetration, including a more detailed recombination argument, see Section 1 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments.
Supersubstantivalism is often glossed as the view that each material object is identical to some spacetime region at which the object is exactly located. If supersubstantivalism is not just true but necessary, then it is impossible for disjoint material objects to be exactly located at overlapping regions. After all, if material object x is exactly located at region r1 and material object y is exactly located at r2, and r1 and r2 overlap, then, given supersubstantivalism, x=r1 and y=r2, and hence x and y overlap as well.
This gives us an argument for (13*), the version of No Interpenetration restricted to material objects. But it does not give us an argument for (13), the full-strength version of No Interpenetration. For it wouldn't follow that it is impossible for there to be disjoint entities of any kind to have overlapping exact locations. Supersubstantivalism, as stated above, leaves open the possibility that there are universals or tropes, e.g., that are exactly located at regions but not identical to them. Hence it leaves open the possibility that disjoint entities that are not material objects might have overlapping exact locations.
To construct an argument for No Interpenetration, we would need to appeal to a stronger supersubstantivalist doctrine, for example:
□∀x∀y[L(x, y) → x=y]
Necessarily, each entity is identical to anything at which it is exactly located.
Supersubstantivalism+ entails No Interpenetration. Take any objects x and y in any possible world, and suppose that they have exact locations, r1 and r2 respectively, that overlap. Then, given Supersubstantivalism+, x=r1 and y=r2, hence x and y overlap.
For a second, related argument against interpenetration, see Section 1.2 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments.
A simple is an entity that has no proper parts. Are there any simples? Within the realm of spatiotemporal entities, some natural candidates are: spacetime points, fundamental particles such as electrons (or instantaneous temporal parts of them), and perhaps certain universals, certain tropes, and/or certain sets. On the other hand, it would seem to be an empirically open possibility that all spatiotemporal entities are gunky.
Say that an entity is extended just in case it is a spatiotemporal entity and does not have the shape and size of a point. In this sense of ‘extended’, a solid cube would count as extended, but so would the mereological sum of two point-particles that are one foot apart. Although such a sum would have zero length, it would be a scattered object and so would not have the shape of a point.
Are there any extended simples? Could there be? Those who answer ‘No’ to both questions will be inclined to accept
- No Extended Simples (NXS)
Necessarily, if x is exactly located at y and y is complex, then x is complex.
Strictly speaking, NXS does not say that extended simples are impossible; rather, it says that simples with complex exact locations are impossible. It leaves open the possibility that there are extended simple regions and extended simple entities that are exactly located at them (for more on this topic, see Tognazzini 2006, Braddon-Mitchell and Miller 2006, Spencer 2010, and Dainton 2010: 294–301). And it rules out the possibility that there is a point-sized material simple that is exactly located at a point-sized but mereologically complex region (e.g., a region that is the fusion of several point-sized tropes each of which is at zero distance from each of the others).
For the most part, however, it will do no harm to treat the debate over extended simples as a debate over NXS. We can do so if we assume that, necessarily, a region is extended if and only if it is complex. So, in what follows, we will operate under that assumption unless we explicitly note otherwise.
An initial argument appeals to the claim that extended simples are conceivable and takes that to be some prima facie evidence in favor of their possibility. To conceive of an extended simple, think of an extended—say, cubical—object that has no proper parts. The idea is not, or not merely, that the cube cannot be physically split or cut up. Whether or not it can be split is a separate question. The idea is that there are no proper parts of the cube. Although the object is cubical, it has no top half or bottom half, no left half or right half. All there is, in the relevant vicinity, is the cube itself—together with the region at which it is exactly located and the parts of that region.
Since this argument does not appear to raise any concerns that are specific to extended simples, we will move on without further comment.
Debates about extended simples typically focus on the question of whether a material object could be an extended simple. But one option is to say that, whether or not material objects can be extended simples, there are entities in some other ontological category (universals, tropes, sets) that can be. Here is an argument from immanent universals:
- My body instantiates the universal being 70 kg in mass.
- The universal being 70 kg in mass is simple.
- My body is exactly located at a complex, spatially extended spacetime region.
- For any x, any y, and any z, if x instantiates y and x is exactly located at z, then y is exactly located at z or at some region of which z is a part.
- For any z and any z*, if z* is a region that has a complex, spatially extended spacetime region as a part, then z* is itself complex and spatially extended.
- There is a simple entity (being 70 kg in mass) that is exactly located at a complex, spatially extended spacetime region—either my body's exact location, or some larger region that has that location as a part.
If one thinks that universals have exact locations, one will say that a universal is exactly located either:
- at each region at which one of its instances is exactly located, or
- at the region that is the sum of the exact locations of its instances.
Those who opt for (i) will say that being 70 kg in mass has the same exact location as my body. Those who opt for (ii) will say that being 70 kg in mass has a vastly larger exact location—namely, the sum of the exact locations of all of the 70-kg entities in the universe. Either way, if the given universal is a simple, it will count as an extended simple. (A parallel argument from tropes is also available.)
If one is convinced that extended simples are impossible but insists on treating universals as both simple and located in spacetime, one could say that universals are multilocated rather than extended. In particular, one could reject options (i) and (ii) above in favor of the view that a universal u is exactly located at r if and only if r is a simple spacetime point that is a part of some exact location of some instance of u. Of course, not everyone finds multilocation any more palatable than extended simples, but some do (see Hudson 2001, 2005).
Finally, one might think that universals, tropes, or sets can be extended simples, but that material objects cannot. In that case one will reject NXS in favor of a weaker principle that is restricted to material objects:
& L(x, y) & C(y)]
Necessarily, if a material object has a complex exact location, then the material object itself is complex.
Universals and tropes pose no threat to (16*), since they are not material objects.
The next two arguments for extended simples count equally against (16) and (16*), but we will continue to focus on (16).
As McDaniel (2007a: 235–6) notes, some physicists interpret string theory as positing extended simples. McDaniel quotes a passage from Brian Greene:
What are strings made of? There are two possible answers to this question. First, strings are truly fundamental—they are “atoms,” uncuttable constituents. … As the absolute smallest constituents of anything and everything, they represent the end of the line … in the numerous layers of substructure in the microscopic world. From this perspective, even though strings have spatial extent, the question of their composition is without any content. Were strings to be made of something smaller they would not be fundamental. Instead, whatever strings were composed of would immediately displace them and lay claim to being an even more basic constituent of the universe … [A] string is simply a string—as there is nothing more fundamental, it can't be described as being composed of any other substance. (1999: 141–2)
Can strings be treated as being identical to the spacetime regions at which they are exactly located? Greene does not explicitly address this question. If the answer is ‘Yes’, however, and if strings are exactly located only at complex regions, then string theory would not be committed to extended simples after all.
As we noted in section 4.4, Sider, McDaniel, and Saucedo have argued for the possibility of interpenetration by appeal to principles of recombination. They have also marshaled these principles in support of the possibility of extended simples (Sider 2007; McDaniel 2007b; Saucedo 2011). Here is the core of McDaniel's argument:
(NNC): Let F and G be accidental, intrinsic properties; let R be a fundamental relation; let x and y be contingently existing non-overlapping entities. Then it is not the case that, necessarily, Rxy only if (Fx if and only if Gy)…if we accept the Humean premise that there are no necessary connections between the accidental, intrinsic properties of regions of space and the accidental, intrinsic properties of material objects, then we should hold that there are no necessary connections between the mereological structure of a material object and the mereological structure of the region it occupies. Specifically, it is not true that, necessarily, a material object is a simple if and only if it occupies a simple (read: pointsized) region of spacetime. It follows that extended material simples are possible. (2007b: 135–137)
If we let o and r be contingently existing, non-overlapping entities, then McDaniel's argument can be reconstructed as follows:
- Exact location is a fundamental relation.
- being simple is an accidental, intrinsic property.
- being a simple region is an accidental intrinsic property.
- Object o and region r are contingently existing, non-overlapping entities.
- For any accidental, intrinsic properties F and G, any fundamental relation R, and any contingently existing non-overlapping entities x and y, it is not the case that, necessarily if Rxy then (if Fx then Gy).
- It is not the case that necessarily, if o is exactly located at r, then: if o is simple then r is a simple region.
Supersubstantivalists will deny that exact location is a fundamental relation. Others might take aim at McDaniel's recombination principle. Let F be the property being round and let G be the property not being square. Prima facie, these would seem to be accidental and intrinsic. But if they are, and if exact location is fundamental, then McDaniel's principle tells us that it is possible for a round object to be exactly located at a square region, which some might take as a reductio of (27).
For further arguments in favor of extended simples, including a more detailed recombination argument, see Section 2.1 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments.
According to supersubstantivalism, each material object is identical to the spacetime region at which it is exactly located. Those who take supersubstantivalism to be a necessary truth are likely to be hostile to the possibility of extended simples—or at least to the possibility of extended simple material objects. For they are likely to endorse the following argument:
- Necessarily, all material objects are regions.
- Necessarily, all extended regions are complex.
- Necessarily, all extended material objects are complex. In other words, it is impossible for a material object to be an extended simple.
Most defenders of extended simples will resist this argument by denying (29). They tend to think of material objects as being non-identical to, and indeed mereologically disjoint from, the regions at which they are exactly located (Markosian 1998; McDaniel 2007b, 2009; Parsons 2007; Saucedo 2011). A different option, however, is to reject (30) in favor of the view that there are, or at least could be, extended simple spacetime regions (Braddon-Mitchell and Miller 2006; Tognazzini 2006; for arguments to the contrary, see Spencer 2010).
The above argument yields only a weak, restricted version of NXS, the ban on extended simples. It leaves open the possibility of extended simples that are not material objects.
NXS does follow, however, from Supersubstantivalism+, according to which it's a necessary truth that each entity is identical to anything at which it is exactly located. For suppose that x is exactly located at y and that y is complex. Then, given Supersubstantivalism+, x=y, hence x is complex too.
A second argument against extended simples arises from problems about simples whose intrinsic properties vary across space or spacetime:
- If it is possible for there to be an extended simple, then it is possible for there to be an extended simple that exhibits intrinsic qualitative variation across spacetime—e.g. an extended simple that is white in one region and grey in another. (Colors are just placeholders; presumably more realistic examples are available.)
- Necessarily, for any x, if x varies across spacetime with respect to its intrinsic properties, then there are incompatible intrinsic properties F and G and parts x1 and x2 of x such that x1 instantiates F and x2 instantiates G.
- Necessarily, for any x, if there are incompatible intrinsic properties F and G and parts x1 and x2 of x such that x1 instantiates F and x2 instantiates G, then x is not simple.
- It is not possible for there to be an extended simple.
The argument is valid and (34) is clearly true. If x has a part that instantiates F and a part that instantiates G, then, provided that these properties are incompatible, the parts in question are not identical. So x has at least two parts. So at least one of them must be a proper part of x, in which case x is not simple.
One might resist the argument by denying (32), that is, by saying that a simple can be extended but only if it is qualitatively homogeneous across spacetime. Most friends of extended simples, however, have apparently granted (32) and rejected (33) instead. This can be done in at least four ways.
5.6.1 The relativizing approach
The relativizing approach says that if a simple, o, is white in one region and grey in another, then o bears the being white at relation to the first region and the being grey at relation to the second; it need not have a part that instantiates the property whiteness or a part that instantiates the property greyness. Alternatively, one might treat instantiation as a three-place relation, and say that o instantiates the property whiteness at one region and instantiates the property greyness at another.
Both versions of this approach are based on theories of persistence and change that attempt to reconcile eternalism and the B-theory of time with endurantism, the view that objects are wholly present at multiple times and do not have temporal parts (for more on endurantism, see section 6.3). Accordingly, the standard criticisms of the relevant theories of persistence and change (on which see Haslanger 2003) would seem to apply equally to the relativizing approach to the problem of qualitative variation for extended simples. The main criticism is that, by appealing to relations to regions, the relativizing approach makes an object's color distribution (or whatever) a dyadic relation or an extrinsic property, when it is in fact (says the critic) an intrinsic property, involving only the object, its parts, and the intrinsic properties of these things.
5.6.2 The stuff-theoretic approach
Ned Markosian (1998, 2004a) responds to the problem of qualitative variation by appeal to the distinction between things (e.g., material objects) and stuff (e.g., matter). Stuff, according to Markosian, comes in portions, but no portion of stuff is a thing. Both things and portions of stuff can have parts, but any part of a thing is itself a thing, and any part of a portion of stuff is itself a portion of stuff. Nevertheless, things and portions of stuff do stand in an important relation: each thing is constituted by a portion of stuff. With this framework in place, Markosian offers the following account. There can be extended simple things, but there cannot be extended simple portions of stuff. When an extended simple, o, is white in region rw and grey in region rg, this isn't because o itself has a part that is exactly located at rw and instantiates whiteness and another part that is exactly located at rg and instantiates greyness; rather, it's because the portion of stuff that constitutes o has such parts. This preserves the simplicity of the extended thing in question. It may also avoid the complaint, facing the relativizing approach, that it makes the color distribution of an extended simple an extrinsic matter. The relation between a thing and the portion of stuff that constitutes it is apparently more intimate than the relation between a thing and the region at which it is exactly located. Moreover, the stuff-theoretic approach, unlike the relativizing approach, holds that when an extended object is white in one region and grey in another, the monadic, intrinsic properties whiteness and greyness (not merely the dyadic relations being white at and being grey at) are both instantiated. However, some may doubt the coherence of a notion of constitution that allows a complex entity to constitute a simple one.
5.6.3 Distributional properties
Josh Parsons (2000) proposes that if a simple is white in one region and grey in another, then it has a fundamental, intrinsic, distributional property. Some distributional properties, such as being jet black all over, are uniform. Others, such as being polka-dotted or being striped, are non-uniform. When a simple has a non-uniform distributional property, this is not grounded in its having parts, configured in a certain way, that each have simpler, uniform properties. Nor is it grounded in the simple's standing in incompatible relations (being white at and being grey at) to different spacetime regions. Rather, it is a basic, ungrounded fact about the simple in question. This apparently avoids the worries about extrinsicness that face the relativizing approach, and it makes no appeal to Markosian's unorthodox notion of constitution.
As McDaniel (2009) notes, however, Parsons is apparently forced to treat facts of the form x is F at r as unanalyzed and ungrounded, which one might take to be a drawback. In Figure 5, the objects o1 and o2 presumably have the same maximally determinate distributional color property: roughly, being grey in one half and white in the other.
Call this property P. Further, object o1 is grey at region r1g. What grounds this fact? Not the fact that o1 has P. After all, o2 also has P, but it is not grey at r1g. Not the fact that o1 has P and is exactly located at r1. For it is possible that there be a thing that has P and is exactly located at r1g but is not grey at r1g: this is the case, e.g., in the possible world that results from deleting o1 and putting o2 in its place (without rotating it clockwise or counterclockwise). Thus, in addition to his basic distributional properties, Parsons appears forced to treat relations to regions (e.g., being grey at) as being basic as well.
The relativizing approach has no such problem: it treats relations to regions as basic and analyzes distributional properties in terms of them. The stuff-theoretic approach avoids the problem too. It analyzes facts of the form x is F at y as: either x or the portion of stuff that constitutes x has a part that is exactly located at y and is F.
McDaniel (2009) attempts to avoid all the above problems by appeal to a theory of tropes developed by Ehring (1997a,b). The idea is that a simple can be grey in one region and white in another region by instantiating a greyness trope that is exactly located at the first region and instantiating a whiteness trope that is exactly located at the second region. This permits an analysis of facts of the form x is F at y as x instantiates an F-ness trope that is exactly located at y; it makes no appeal to stuff or portions of stuff; and, since it invokes monadic color tropes, it (arguably) refrains from treating the facts about a simple's color distribution as being fundamentally relational and extrinsic.
(For further elaboration and defense of the argument from qualitative variation, see Spencer (2010).)
For further arguments against extended simples, see Section 2.2 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments.
To say that an object is multilocated is to say that it has more than one exact location: ‘x is multilocated’ means ‘∃y1∃y2[L(x, y1) & L(x, y2) & y1≠y2]’. We consider a series of putative examples of multi-location in section 6.3.
The debate over multilocation concerns
& L(x, y2)]
Necessarily, nothing has more than one exact location.
Opponents of multilocation accept Functionality+. Friends of multilocation typically want to affirm something stronger than the negation of Functionality+. They typically accept the possibility of an entity that is exactly located at each of two regions that do not even overlap.
Earlier we glossed ‘x is exactly located at y’ as ‘x has (or has-at-y) the same size and shape as y, and stands (or stands-at-y) in all the same spatiotemporal relations to things as does y’. Thus spheres are exactly located only at spherical regions, cubes only at cubical regions, and so on. When an entity is said to be multilocated, then, it is said to stand in this relation to each of several regions: informally put, it has the same size, shape, and position as region r1; it has the same size, shape, and position as region r2; and so on. No claim is made to the effect that the object is exactly located at the sum of r1, r2, …, or at any proper parts of any of these regions.
To clarify the idea of multilocation in an informal way, it may be useful to consider Figure 6, inspired by Hudson (2005: 105).
A scattered, singly located
A non-scattered, multilocated
The object o1 is scattered: its shape is that of the sum of two non-overlapping circles. It is not multilocated. Rather, it has just one exact location: the scattered region r3. It is not exactly located at any proper part of that region, such as r1 or r2.
The object o2 is multilocated. It has two (and only two) exact locations. It is exactly located at the circular region r3; and it is exactly located at the circular region r4, which does not overlap r3. It is not exactly located at their sum, and it is not located at any of their proper parts. Since o2 is exactly located at r3, which is circular, o2 is circular, at least at r3. For parallel reasons, o2 is circular at r4. By contrast, o1 is not circular simpliciter, nor is it circular at any region.
It is natural to think that if these two objects were visible, they would be visually indistinguishable. Indeed, it is tempting to think that there would be no empirically significant difference between o1 and o2. For those with verificationist leanings, this may lead to the belief that there is no qualitative difference at all between o1 and o2 and hence that there must be something defective about the initial set-up of the case. This line of thought seems to lie behind much of the hostility toward multilocation, though it has rarely if ever been developed in any detail.
As with interpenetration and extended simples, one might offer a conceivability argument for the possibility of multilocation. One could claim that multilocation is conceivable (alternatively: intuitively possible) and take this to be some prima facie evidence that multilocation is possible. Since this argument does not appear to raise any issues that are specific to multilocation, we will move on.
It is natural to think that the extant recombination arguments for interpenetration and extended simples can be adapted to yield an argument for multilocation. If one slightly alters the passage (quoted in section 4.4) in which McDaniel presents his recombination argument for interpenetration (2007a: 241), one gets the following, parallel argument for multilocation:
The actual state of affairs in which an object x is exactly located at a particular region r is distinct from the merely possible state of affairs in which object x is exactly located at some other, disjoint region r*. From the fact that x is exactly located at r, we can infer nothing about what, if anything, is exactly located at r*. Both states of affairs are contingent: they possibly obtain and possibly fail to obtain. If any recombination of contingent states of affairs yields a genuine possibility, then there are possible worlds at which x is exactly located both at r and at r* and hence is multilocated.
This argument would seem to have the same virtues and vices as McDaniel's original argument for interpenetration.
(Surprisingly, however, some recombination arguments for interpenetration and extended simples cannot be adapted to yield an argument for multilocation. See Section 3.1 of the supplemetary document Additional Arguments.)
A third kind of argument for the possibility of multilocation simply points to examples. Entities that have been taken to be multilocated include: immanent universals, enduring material objects, enduring tropes, four-dimensional perduring objects, backward time travelers, fission products, transworld individuals, works of music, and an omnipresent God.
6.3.1 Immanent universals
As we have noted, immanent realists say that universals are spatiotemporal entities that are in some sense ‘wholly present’ in the things that instantiate them. This seems to be the view under discussion in the following passage from Plato's Parmenides, 131a–131b (in Hamilton and Cairns 1961: 925):
- Do you hold, then that the form as a whole, a single thing, is in each of the many, or how?
- Why should it not be in each, Parmenides?
- If so, a form which is one and the same will be at the same time, as a whole, in a number of things which are separate, and consequently will be separate from itself.
One natural way to translate immanent realism into the terminology of exact location is via the following principle:
- Necessarily, for any x, any y, and any z, if x is exactly located at y and x instantiates z, then z is exactly located at y.
To see how this leads to multilocation, suppose that some monadic universal u is instantiated by an entity e1 that is exactly located at region r1 and by a different entity, e2, that is exactly located at region r2, disjoint from r1. Then, given (37), u itself is exactly located both at r1 and at r2.
(37) is not inevitable, even for immanent realists. Some of them might prefer to say that a monadic universal is exactly located only at the sum of the exact locations of its instances (Bigelow, 1988: 18–27, can in places be read as embracing this). On this view, a simple monadic universal might be scattered but would not be multilocated. Others (Armstrong 1989: 99) prefer to say that universals do not have exact locations at all, though they are parts or constituents of things that have exact locations or of spacetime itself. This was dubbed the ‘Burying Strategy’ in section 4.1.
6.3.2 Enduring material objects
The debate over persistence through time centers around two rival views, endurantism and perdurantism. Endurantists often say that a persisting material object is temporally unextended and in some sense ‘wholly present’ at each instant of its career. Perdurantists often say that a persisting material object is a temporally extended entity that has a different temporal part at each different instant of its career and hence is at most partially present at any one instant.
(Informally, an instantaneous temporal part of me is an object that is a part of me, is made of the exactly same matter as I am whenever it exists, and has exactly the same spatial location as I do whenever it exists, but exists at only a single instant.)
Recently, a number of philosophers have suggested that the traditional endurantism versus perdurantism dispute runs together a pair of independent disputes about persistence: a mereological dispute concerning the existence of temporal parts, and a locational dispute concerning exact locations (Gilmore 2006, 2008; Hawthorne 2006; Sattig 2006; Eddon 2010; Donnelly 2010, 2011b; Rychter 2011). Stated somewhat loosely, the mereological dispute is between the following views:
- Mereological perdurance: there are persisting material objects, and each such object has a different temporal part at each different instant at which the object exists.
- Mereological endurance: there are persisting material objects, but none of them has a different temporal part at each different instant of its career. (Perhaps none of them have any instantaneous temporal parts—or any temporal parts aside from themselves—at all!)
To frame the locational dispute, it will be useful to have one further piece of terminology. Say that y is the path of x if and only if y is the mereological sum of the exact locations of x (Gilmore 2006: 204). (Strictly, we should say ‘a path’ and ‘a sum’, unless we want to presuppose Uniqueness: any xs have at most one sum.) Informally, an object's path is the region that exactly contains the object's complete career or life-history; it is the region that the object exactly ‘sweeps out’ over the course of its career.
We can then state the locational dispute as follows:
- Locational perdurance: there are persisting material objects, and each of them has one and only one exact location—its path.
- Locational endurance: there are persisting material objects, and each of them has many different exact locations, each such location being instantaneous or ‘spacelike’. Typically, each of these exact locations will count as an instantaneous temporal part of the object's path.
Philosophers on both sides of this dispute can agree about which spacetime region is the path of a given material object. They will disagree about which spacetime regions are the exact locations of the object. The locational perdurantist will say that the object's only exact location is its path. The locational endurantist will say that the object is exactly located at many regions, each of them a slice of its path. The interaction between the two disputes about persistence is summarized in Figure 7 (from Gilmore 2008: 1230).
Locational endurance entails multilocation: it has it that some material objects are exactly located at many different regions. Importantly, however, mereological endurance, which merely rejects temporal parts, does not entail multilocation. Thus one might reject temporal parts while retaining Functionality. This is the position of Parsons (2000, 2007). It corresponds to the lower left-hand box in Figure 7.
6.3.3 Enduring tropes
Whether or not one takes material objects to be multilocated in the manner of locational endurantism, one might hold such a view about tropes. Douglas Ehring (1997b, 2011) offers a detailed defense of the view that tropes endure, though he does not say whether he takes them to be multilocated in our sense. Consider some mereologically simple, spatially unextended trope e, and suppose, with Ehring, that it persists. Let the temporally extended, one-dimensional spacetime region r be e's path. Then there are at least two natural things one could say regarding e's locations. One could say that (i) e has just one exact location, r itself, in which case e is a temporally extended simple but not multilocated. Alternatively, one could say (ii) e is exactly located at each point in r (but nowhere else), in which case e is multilocated but not extended.
6.3.4 Multilocated 4D worms
Hud Hudson (2001) defends a version of mereological perdurantism according to which each ordinary material object is exactly located at a great many (mostly overlapping) four-dimensional spacetime regions. Hudson offers his view as a solution to ‘the problem of the many,’ among other things.
(Hudson also argues that, given his view, the fundamental parthood relation should be taken to be a three-place relation holding between two objects and a region. This aspect of Hudson's theory is discussed in detail by Gilmore (2009) and especially Donnelly (2010).)
6.3.5 Backward Time Travelers
Suppose that Suzy is born at time t0 and dies 90 years later, at time t90. At time t40, the forty-year-old Suzy steps into a time machine and disappears, reappearing (with her time machine) out of thin air many years earlier. Suzy then enters the nursery in the house where she was raised and, at t1, sees a one-year-old baby, whom she knows to be herself. (The character Suzy originates in Vihvelin 1996.)
If one is an endurantist, one will find it natural to describe this situation as involving multi-location in space or spacetime: Suzy is exactly located at rA, a region with the size and shape of an adult; Baby Suzy is exactly located at rB, a disjoint but simultaneous region with the size and shape of a baby; and Suzy=Baby Suzy. Hence there is a single thing (namely, Suzy/Baby Suzy) that is exactly located at two different, simultaneous regions, rA and rB (Keller and Nelson 2001; Gilmore 2003, 2006, 2007; Miller 2006; Carroll 2011; Kleinschmidt 2011). Moreover, all of this holds even if one rejects talk of regions of spacetime in favor of talk of regions of space.
To be sure, even endurantists can deny that the situation involves multilocation. Those who accept mereological endurantism and locational perdurantism will say that Suzy does not have temporal parts but is still four-dimensional in at least the following sense: she is exactly located at only one region: her four-dimensional path (Parsons 2000, 2007, 2008). If one is a presentist—one who says that only the present time and its contents exist—one might say that, at t1, Suzy is exactly located only at the sum of rA and rB, rather than at either of those regions themselves (Markosian 2004c).
However, if Suzy is exactly located only at the sum of rA and rB at t1 then she is not shaped like a human being at t1; rather, she is a scattered object shaped like the sum of two human beings. It might seem doubtful that Suzy can exist at a time without being even approximately human-shaped at that time. This would speak in favor of the view that Suzy is multilocated, rather than scattered, at t1.
Barry Dainton (2008: 364–408) argues that if a person were to undergo fission (in roughly the manner of an amoeba), the person would continue to exist after the fission in bilocated form: she would be wholly present in two different places at once (this view is also discussed by Johnston 1989). Dainton's view is naturally understood as involving multilocation, either in spacetime or in space at a time: after the fission, the person is exactly located at two different regions (see Gilmore, 2008: 1246, for an objection to Dainton's view).
6.3.7 Modal Realism with Overlap
McDaniel (2004) develops a version of concrete modal realism that posits multilocation; he dubs the view Modal Realism with Overlap (MRO). Like Lewis's (1986) modal realism, MRO treats possible worlds as concrete, spatiotemporal entities and holds that spacetime regions are ‘worldbound’: no spacetime region that is part of one world overlaps any spacetime region that is part of another world. Unlike Lewis's view, however, MRO claims that material objects are wholly present in more than one world. Specifically, MRO entails multilocation. It says that if Lewis is a philosopher in world w1 and a plumber but not a philosopher in world w2, then he is exactly located at two or more regions (one of which is a part of w1 and another of which is a part of w2).
6.3.8 Works of Music
Chris Tillman (2011) develops a view about the ontology of musical works according to which Beethoven's 9th Symphony (the symphony itself, as opposed to any particular performance of it) is multilocated. The view has it that a work of music is exactly located at a spacetime region r if and only if some performance of that work is exactly located at r. When combined with facts about the relevant performances, this principle yields the result that Beethoven's 9th is exactly located at spacetime regions confined to the 19th century Vienna and also at other regions confined to 20th century New York; it is multilocated. Tillman argues that this view is preferable to other forms of ‘musical materialism’. He does not say whether it is preferable to the view that works of music are abstract objects with no spatiotemporal location at all.
Hudson (2009) notes that one might interpret the doctrine of divine omnipresence as entailing that God is exactly located at each region of spacetime. (For a discussion of other religious views to which multilocation is relevant see Hudson (2010) and Effingham (forthcoming.)
As we noted in section 2, if one defines ‘x is exactly located at y’ as ‘x is weakly located at all and only those entities that overlap y’—as Parsons (2007) claims that we are free to do—then one can argue as follows:
- Necessarily, for any x and any y, x is exactly located at y if and only if for any y*, x is weakly located at y* if and only y overlaps y* (by the definition of ‘is exactly located at’).
- So, necessarily, for any x, any y1, and any y2, if x is exactly located at y1 and x is exactly located at y2, then y1 mereologically coincides with y2 (from (38)).
- Necessarily, for any y1 and any y2, if something is exactly located at y1 and something is exactly located at y2 and y1 mereologically coincides with y2, then y1=y2. (Uniqueness for Locations)
- Necessarily, for any x, and y1 and any y2, if x is exactly located at y1 and x is exactly located at y2, then y1=y2 (from (39) and (40).)
To see that the inference from (38) to (39) is valid, suppose that object o is exactly located at regions ra and rb. Since o is exactly located at ra, o is (by (38)) weakly located at all and only the entities that overlap ra. Likewise, since o is exactly located at rb, o is weakly located at all and only the entities that overlap rb. So ra overlaps a given entity if and only if o is weakly located at that entity; and rb overlaps a given entity if and only if o is weakly located at that entity. Hence ra and rb overlap exactly the same entities: in other words, they mereologically coincide. The rest of the argument is self-explanatory.
The argument may persuade some. However, those who are initially inclined to take the possibility of multilocation seriously may see this argument as a reason to doubt the first premise and the associated definition (Gilmore 2006: 203). (A parallel argument runs through an alternative definition: ‘x is exactly located at y’ means ‘for any z, if z is simple, then z lies within x if and only if z is a part of y’. As we noted in section 1, this definition has the additional vice that in the context of gunky spacetime, it yields the result that everything is exactly located at every region.)
When taken to be a necessary truth, supersubstantivalism yields arguments against the possibility of interpenetrating material objects and extended simple material objects. Given the symmetry and transitivity of identity, it also yields an argument against the possibility of multilocated material objects:
- Necessarily, if x is a material object and is exactly located at y, then x=y.
- Necessarily, if x is a material object and is exactly located at y1 and at y2, then y1=y2.
Informally, the idea is this: since, necessarily, material objects are identical to their exact locations, and since nothing can be identical with two different entities, no material objects can have two different exact locations.
This leaves open the possibility of multilocation for entities (e.g., universals) that are not material objects. This possibility is ruled out by Supersubstantivalism+, according to which it is necessary that any entity is identical to anything at which it is exactly located. Neither material objects nor universals can be identical to more than one thing.
Extended simples face a problem arising from qualitative variation. Multilocated entities face a similar problem. One might think that if multilocation is possible, then there should be a possible situation involving a thing o1 exactly located at a region r1 and a thing o2 exactly located at a disjoint region r2, such that o1 is white, o2 is grey, and o1=o2. (Again, change in color is just a placeholder; any apparently intrinsic qualitative change would suffice for the purpose of this argument.) Since it's impossible for a single thing to be both white and grey, one might continue, no such situation is possible. This might lead one to conclude that multilocation itself is impossible. In numbered form, we have:
- If it is possible for there to be a multilocated entity, then it is possible for there to be objects x1 and x2 and disjoint regions y1 and y2 such that: x1 is exactly located at y1, x2 is exactly located at y2, x1 is white, x2 is grey, and x1=x2.
- Necessarily, nothing is both white and grey.
- It is not possible for there to be a multilocated entity.
Friends of multilocation reject the first premise, though not always for the same reason. Some say that (i) multilocation is possible but only for universals or tropes, and that (ii) these entities do not vary between locations with respect to anything in the vicinity of their ‘intrinsic properties’, such as shape, size, mass, or color.
Others say that multilocation is possible even for entities that do undergo such variation, such as material objects. In that case, one can adopt a relativizing approach to the so-called ‘intrinsic properties’ with respect to which the given things can vary: one can say that object x1 (i.e., x2) stands in the being white at relation to region y1 and the being grey at relation to region y2 (van Inwagen 1990a). Thus, in the situation described above, x1 is neither white nor grey. It is white at region y1 and grey at region y2. The relations in question are incompatible, in the sense that no one thing can bear both of them to the same entity, but it is possible for a thing to bear one of them to one region and the other to a different region.
It is an interesting question to what extent the friend of multilocation can invoke other responses to the problem of change. Can she appeal to stuff, distributional properties, or short-lived tropes, as did the friend of extended simples, in response to the problem of qualitative variation?
For further arguments against multilocation, see Section 3.2 of the supplementary document Additional Arguments.
There are some important questions concerning parthood and location about which we have so far said little or nothing. These include the following:
- What topological constraints are there (if any) on the sorts of
regions that can be the exact locations of material objects? For
example, is it a necessary truth that material objects are exactly
located only at
- three-dimensional regions?
- topologically closed regions, regions with an ‘outermost skin’ of points?
- topologically open regions, regions without such a skin?
- Can gunky objects inhabit spacetimes that are composed of simple points? Can simple and/or point-like objects inhabit gunky spacetimes? (Kant 1992; Hudson 2001: 84–90; Simons 2004; Parsons 2007; Arntzenius 2008; J. Russell 2008; Fowler 2008; Uzquiano 2011; Giberman 2012.)
- How are debates about parthood and location affected by the transition from a pre-relativistic to a relativistic setting? (See Gilmore 2008 for a survey and Balashov 2010 for a book-length treatment.)
- How do parthood and location interact with the notion of metaphysical dependence (Brzozowski 2008)?
- How do parthood and location interact with metaphysical indeterminacy? (McKinnon 2003; Hawley 2004; N. Smith 2005; Donnelly 2009; Barnes and Williams 2011; Carmichael 2011.)
- How do parthood and location interact with topological notions such as contact, connectedness, and boundary? (Zimmerman 1996a, 1996b; Casati and Varzi 1999; Donnelly 2004; Hudson 2005: 47–86; Varzi 2007; D. Smith 2008; Wilson 2008.)
- Are we extended simples? (Lowe 1996, 2000, 2001; Olson 1998)
- Do things have non-spatiotemporal exact locations, such as positions in relations or propositions? (Gilmore forthcoming)
- Is there more than one fundamental location relation? (Simons 2004; Fine 2006)
- Are there considerations about location or its interaction with parthood that have any special significance for issues in meta-metaphysics, or vice versa (Sider 2011)?
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The author would like to thank Scott Dixon, Matt Leonard, Kris McDaniel, Ted Shear, the SEP editors, and a referee for the SEP for comments on drafts of this entry.