Supplement to Location and Mereology

A Theory of Location

In this document we set out a fragment of the theory of location due to Casati and Varzi (1999). Their full system includes a topological component, and some purely mereological axioms, that we ignore. The fragment that will concern us here includes a pair of purely locational axioms and a pair of ‘mereo-locational’ axioms that govern the interaction parthood and exact location. (The present exposition of Casati and Varzi follows the discussion in Parsons 2007.) The four axioms are:

Functionalityxyz[(L(x, y) & L(x, z)) → y=z]
Nothing has more than one exact location.
Conditional Reflexivityxy[L(x, y) → L(y, y)]
Locations of entities are located at themselves.
Weak Expansivityxyzw[(P(x, y) & L(x, z) & L(y, w)) → P(z, w)]
Any exact location of any part of an entity is a part of any exact location of that entity.
Arbitrary Partitionxyz[(L(x, y) & P(z, y)) → ∃w(P(w, x) & L(w, z))]
If entity x is exactly located at y, then for any part z of y, there is some part w of x that is exactly located at z.
(The labels ‘Weak Expansivity’ and ‘Arbitrary Partition’ are due to Parsons 2007: 223.)

Functionality and Conditional Reflexivity are discussed in the main document.

Weak Expansivity says that if both the part and the whole are located, then the part ‘lies within’ the whole: the part's exact location is a part of the whole's exact location. This allows for a situation in which x is a part of y though one or both of these entities fails to be exactly located anywhere. (One might think, e.g., that a certain proposition has another proposition as a part though neither is exactly located anywhere, or that a person is a part of a proposition even though the person has an exact location and the proposition doesn't.) It also allows for situations in which an entity and one of its proper parts share the same exact location.

Casati and Varzi take care to ensure that their system does not entail that if x's exact location is a part of y's exact location, then x is a part of y. (Call this WEC; it is the approximate converse of Weak Expansivity.) One reason to be cautious about this runs as follows. Suppose that my body, a material object, is exactly located at the region rb, that my head is exactly located at the region rh, and that my head is a part of my body. Then given Weak Expansivity, rh is a part of rb, and given Conditional Reflexivity, rh is exactly located at rh, and rb is exactly located at rb. So, if Casati and Varzi were committed to WEC­, they would be forced to conclude that a certain region, rh, is a part of a material object, my body.

Now consider Arbitrary Partition. Informally, it says that a located thing has a part located at each subregion of the thing's location. (It is a somewhat stronger version of the ‘Doctrine of Arbitrary Undetached Parts’ attacked by van Inwagen (1981).) Together with Functionality, Arbitrary Partition entails that simple things do not have complex exact locations. Given the popular assumption that a region is complex if and only if it is extended (better: not-point-like), this amounts to the claim that simple things do not have extended exact locations—roughly, that there are no extended simples. Arguments for and against the possibility of extended simples are discussed in the main document.

It is worth noting, however, that one can reject extended simples without accepting Arbitrary Partition.

First, one might think that everything is composed of point-like simples but that composition is restricted, so that some pluralities of simples have no fusion. In that case it would be natural to deny Arbitrary Partition. For example, one might say that Obama is composed of some point-like simples, oo, and is exactly located at region r, but that there are proper parts of r (say, the left half of r) at which no part of Obama is exactly located. The material simples in the left half of r, one might say, do not have a fusion.

Here is the second reason. (What follows is rough. See Cartwright (1975) and Uzquiano (2006) for a more careful discussion.) One might think that (i) all material objects must always be topologically open and gunky, that (ii) any part of a material object must be a material object, and that (iii) space or spacetime is a continuum of simple points, each plurality of which composes a region. Now let o be a material object whose exact location, r, is a topologically open sphere. Then, given (iii), presumably there will be a part r* of r that is not topologically open and so (by (ii)) is not the exact location of any material object and so (by (iii)) is not the exact location of any part of o, contrary to Arbitrary Partition. For reasons like these, Uzquiano claims that Arbitrary Partition “seems far too strong to be classed as an axiom of any reasonable theory of location” (2011: 206).

Copyright © 2018 by
Cody Gilmore <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free